# Luitzen Egbertus Jan Brouwer

*First published Wed Mar 26, 2003; substantive revision Sun Sep 25, 2005*

Dutch mathematician and philosopher who lived from 1881 to 1966. He is traditionally referred to as ‘L.E.J. Brouwer’, with full initials, but was called ‘Bertus’ by his friends.

In classical mathematics, he founded modern topology by establishing, for example, the topological invariance of dimension and the fixpoint theorem. He also gave the first correct definition of dimension.

In philosophy, his brainchild is intuitionism, a revisionist foundation of mathematics. Intuitionism views mathematics as a free activity of the mind, independent of any language or Platonic realm of objects, and therefore bases mathematics on a philosophy of mind. The implications are twofold. First, it leads to a form of constructive mathematics, in which large parts of classical mathematics are rejected. Second, the reliance on a philosophy of mind introduces features that are absent from classical mathematics as well as from other forms of constructive mathematics: unlike those, intuitionistic mathematics is not a proper part of classical mathematics.

- 1. The Person
- 2. Chronology
- 3. Brief Characterization of Brouwer's Intuitionism
- 4. Brouwer's Development of Intuitionism
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Person

Brouwer studied at the (municipal) University of Amsterdam where his most important teachers were Diederik Korteweg (of the Korteweg-de Vries equation) and, especially philosophically, Gerrit Mannoury. Brouwer's principal students were Maurits Belinfante and Arend Heyting; the latter, in turn, was the teacher of Anne Troelstra and Dirk van Dalen. Brouwer's classes were also attended by Max Euwe, the later world chess champion, who published a game-theoretical paper on chess from the intuitionistic point of view (Euwe, 1929), and who would much later deliver Brouwer's funeral speech. Among Brouwer's assistants were Heyting, Hans Freudenthal, Karl Menger, and Witold Hurewicz, the latter two of whom were not intuitionistically inclined. The most influential supporter of Brouwer's intuitionism outside the Netherlands at the time was, for a number of years, Hermann Weyl.

Brouwer seems to have been an independent and brilliant man of high moral standards, but with an exaggerated sense of justice, making him at times pugnacious. As a consequence, in his life he energetically fought many battles.

From 1914 to 1928, Brouwer was member of the editiorial board of the
*Mathematische Annalen*, and he was the founding editor of
*Compositio Mathematica*, which first appeared in 1934.

He was a member of, among others, the Royal Dutch Academy of Sciences, the Royal Society in London, the Preußische Akademie der Wissenschaften in Berlin, and the Akademie der Wissenschaften in Göttingen.

Brouwer received honorary doctorates from the universities of Oslo (1929) and Cambridge (1954), and was made Knight in the Order of the Dutch Lion in 1932.

Brouwer's archive is kept at the Department of Philosophy, Utrecht University, the Netherlands. An edition of correspondence and manuscripts is in preparation.

## 2. Chronology

**1881** February 27, born in Overschie (since 1941
part of Rotterdam), The Netherlands.

**1897** Enters the University of Amsterdam to study
mathematics and physics.

**1904** Obtains *doctorandus* title (MA degree)
in mathematics; first publication (on rotations in four dimensional
space); marries Lize de Holl (born 1870). They would have no children,
but Lize had a daughter from an earlier marriage. They move to
Blaricum, near Amsterdam, where they would live for the rest of their
lives, although they also had houses in other places.

**1907** Obtains *doctor* title with
dissertation *Over de Grondslagen der Wiskunde* (*On the
Foundations of Mathematics*), under supervision of Korteweg at the
University of Amsterdam. It marks the beginning of his intuitionistic
reconstruction of mathematics. Later that year, Brouwer's wife graduates and
becomes a pharmacist. All his life, Brouwer did the bookkeeping for her
and filled out the tax forms, and sometimes he assisted behind the
counter.

**1908** First participation in an international
conference, the Fourth International Conference of Mathematicians in
Rome.

**1909-1913** In a very productive four years, Brouwer
founds modern topology, as a chapter of classical mathematics.
Highlights: invariance of dimension, fixed point theorem, mapping
degree, definition of dimension. A pause in his intuitionistic
program.

**1909** Becomes *privaat-docent* (unpaid
lecturer) at the University of Amsterdam. Inaugural lecture ‘Het
Wezen der Meetkunde’ (‘The Nature of Geometry’).

**1909** Meets Hilbert in the Dutch seaside resort of
Scheveningen. Brouwer much admires Hilbert and describes their meeting
in a letter to a friend as ‘a beautiful new ray of light through
my life’ (Brouwer & Adama van Scheltema, 1984, p.100). Twenty
years later, Brouwer's relation with Hilbert would turn sour.

**1911** First appearance of the names
‘formalism’ and ‘intuitionism’ in Brouwer's
writings, in a review of Gerrit Mannoury's book *Methodologisches
und Philosophisches zur Elementar-Mathematik* (*Methodological
and philosophical remarks on elementary mathematics*) from
1909.

**1912** Elected member of the Royal Academy of
Sciences (during World War II ‘Dutch Academy of Sciences’,
then ‘Royal Dutch Academy of Sciences’).

**1912** Appointed full professor
*extraordinarius* in the field of ‘set theory, function
theory, and axiomatics’. His philosophical inaugural lecture
‘Intuitionisme en Formalisme’ is translated into English as
‘Intuitionism and Formalism’ and thus becomes, in 1913, the
first publication on intuitionism in that language.

**1913** Appointed full professor *ordinarius*,
succeeding Korteweg, who had generously offered to vacate his chair for
the purpose.

**1914** Invited to join the editorial board of the
*Mathematische Annalen*; accepts the honour.

**1918** Brouwer begins the systematic intuitionistic
reconstruction of mathematics with his paper ‘Begründung der
Mengenlehre unabhängig vom logischen Satz vom ausgeschlossenen
Dritten. Erster Teil, Allgemeine Mengenlehre.’ (‘Founding
Set Theory Independently of the Principle of the Excluded Middle. Part
One, General Set Theory.’)

**1919** Receives offers for professorships in
Göttingen and in Berlin; declines both.

**1920** Start of the ‘Grundlagenstreit’
(Foundational Debate) with Brouwer's lecture at the
‘Naturforscherversammlung’ in Bad Nauheim, published in
1921 as ‘Besitzt jede reelle Zahl eine
Dezimalbruch-Entwickelung?’ (‘Does Every Real Number Have a
Decimal Expansion?’); amplified by Weyl's defence of intuitionism
in 1921, ‘Über die neue Grundlagenkrise der
Mathematik’ (‘On the New Foundational Crisis of
Mathematics’); answered by Hilbert in 1922,
‘Neubegründung der Mathematik’ (‘The New
Grounding of Mathematics’).

**1920** ‘Intuitionistische Mengenlehre’
(‘Intuitionistic Set Theory’) is the first piece of
intuitionistic mathematics in a widely read international journal, the
*Jahresbericht der Deutschen Mathematiker Vereinigung*.

**1922** Co-founds, with Gerrit Mannoury, the author
Frederik van Eeden, and others, the ‘Signifische Kring’
(‘Signific Circle’), a society aiming at spiritual and
political progress through language reform, starting from the ideas
laid down by Victoria Lady Welby in her paper ‘Sense, Meaning and
Interpretation’ (Welby, 1896). The Circle ends its meetings in
1926, but Mannoury continues its work.

**1926** Lecture in Göttingen; as a result of a group dinner at Emmy Noether's house, Hilbert and Brouwer
are (for a brief period) on good terms again.

**1927** Lecture series in Berlin; his later assistant
Freudenthal is in the audience. The newspaper *Berliner
Tageblatt* proposes a public debate between Brouwer and Hilbert, to
be held in its pages, but for some reason this is not realized. Neither
does Brouwer complete the book he is invited to write by the German
publisher Walter de Gruyter. The lectures and an incomplete book
are published posthumously
(Brouwer, 1992).

**1928** March 10 and 14: two lectures in Vienna.
Gödel is in the audience, as is Wittgenstein. It is said that the
first lecture made Wittgenstein return to philosophy. Brouwer spends a
day with Wittgenstein.

**1928** April: conversations with Husserl, who is in
Amsterdam to lecture.

**1928** Conflict over the Bologna conference. The German
mathematicians are, for the first time since the ending of World War
I, admitted to an international conference again, but not quite as
equals. Brouwer insists that this is not fair, and that unless the
Germans are to be treated better, the conference should be boycotted.
Hilbert, who does not share this view, is much chagrined by Brouwer's
action and attends the conference as the leader of the German
delegation, the largest present.

**1928-1929** ‘Mathematische Annalenstreit’,
the conflict in the editorial board of *Mathematische
Annalen*. Hilbert, thinking he is about to die, feels a need to
make sure that after his death Brouwer will not become too
influential, and expels him from the board in an unlawful way.
[Hilbert's motivation as described here is documented in letters from
people close to him: Carathéodory to Einstein, October 20,
1928; Blumenthal to the publisher and editors of the Mathematische
Annalen, November 16, 1928; Born to Einstein, November 20,
1928. Copies of these letters are in the Brouwer Archive at Utrecht
University. Relevant quotations from these can be found in van Dalen,
2005, p. 604 and p. 613]. Einstein, also member of the board,
refuses to support Hilbert's action and does not want to have anything
to do with the whole affair; most other board members do not want to
irritate Hilbert by opposing him. Brouwer vehemently protests. In the
end, the whole board is dissolved and immediately reassembled without
Brouwer, in a strongly reduced size (in particular, Einstein and
Carathéodory decline). The conflict leaves Brouwer mentally
broken and isolated, and makes an end to a very creative decade in his
work. Now that the two main contestants are no longer able to carry it
on, the ‘Grundlagenstreit’ is over.

**1928-1930** Conflict with Karl Menger over the
priority for the first correct definition of the notion of
dimension.

**1929** August: theft of Brouwer's briefcase on the
tram in Brussels, and with it of his mathematical notebook. When
neither the police nor a private detective hired for the purpose is
able to find it again, he despairs of ever being able to reconstruct
its contents. Brouwer later said that this loss was instrumental in the
shift of his main interest from mathematics to philosophy.

**1929** Begins preparations for the foundation of a
new mathematical journal.

**1934** Appearance of the first issue of Brouwer's own
international journal, entitled *Compositio Mathematica*.

**1934** Lecture series in Geneva.

**1935-1941** Member of the municipal council of
Blaricum for the local Neutral Party (in 1939 he wins the elections by
receiving 310 of the 1601 votes).

**1940-1945** During the German Occupation of the
Netherlands in World War II, Brouwer assists the resistance and tries
to help his Jewish friends and his students. In 1943, he advises the
students to sign the declaration of loyalty demanded by the Germans.
Part of his explanation, after the war, is that signing would provide
the students with the relative peace needed to build up and carry out
resistance activities. He is met with skepticism. Because of this and
some similar perhaps unfortunate attempts at shrewdness during the
occupation, after the liberation he is suspended for a few months.
Deeply offended, Brouwer considers emigration to South Africa or the
USA.

**1942** Publishes three short notes again on
intuitionistic foundations, the first since 1933.

**1945-1950** Conflict over the journal *Compositio
Mathematica*. The journal had not appeared during the war, and an
effort is made to bring it back to life. Difficulties in assembling a
new board of editors arise because of Brouwer's damaged reputation. In
the end, Brouwer's name remains on the title page but in effect he is
removed from the board of the journal he had founded.

**1947-1951** Annual lecture series in Cambridge,
England. Brouwer plans to turn them into a book, but this does not
happen. He completes, however, five of the planned six chapters, and
these are published poshumously (Brouwer, 1981).

**1948** Resumes his foundational program with a paper
that exploits the notion of the creating subject. Beginning of another
creative period.

**1949** Opposes a plan to have his collected papers
published, on the ground that he has no time to write annotations that
reflect his original as well as his present views on them, which he
considers would be the scientifically responsible thing to do.

**1951** Retires from the University of
Amsterdam. Cooling off of his relationship with Arend Heyting, his
successor at the post of director of the Mathematical Institute, as a
result of disagreement over the exact role the retired Brouwer could
still play there.

**1952** Lectures in London and in Cape Town.

**1953** Lectures in Helsinki, where he stays with Von
Wright. Lecture tour through the USA (among others MIT, Princeton,
University of Wisconsin-Madison, Berkeley, Chicago) and Canada
(Canadian Mathematical Congress in Kingston, Ontario). In Princeton,
he visits Gödel.

**1955** Publishes his last new paper (based on his
lecture at the Boole conference in Dublin the year before).

**1959** Death of Mrs Brouwer, 89 years old. Brouwer
declines an offer for a 1-year position at the University of British
Columbia in Vancouver.

**1962** Brouwer is offered a position in Montana.

**1966** December 2: dies in Blaricum, The Netherlands,
85 years old, when he is hit by a car in front of his house.

## 3. Brief Characterization of Brouwer's Intuitionism

Based on his philosophy of mind, on which Kant and Schopenhauer were the main influences, Brouwer characterized mathematics primarily as the free activity of exact thinking, an activity which is founded on the pure intuition of (inner) time. No independent realm of objects and no language play a fundamental role. He thus strived to avoid the Scylla of platonism (with its epistemological problems) and the Charybdis of formalism (with its poverty of content). As, on Brouwer's view, there is no determinant of mathematical truth outside the activity of thinking, a proposition only becomes true when the subject has experienced its truth (by having carried out an appropriate mental construction); similarly, a proposition only becomes false when the subject has experienced its falsehood (by realizing that an appropriate mental construction is not possible). Hence Brouwer can claim that ‘there are no non-experienced truths’ (Brouwer, 1975, p.488).

Brouwer was prepared to follow his philosophy of mind to its ultimate conclusions; whether the reconstructed mathematics was compatible or incompatible with classical mathematics was a secondary question, and never decisive. In thus granting philosophy priority over traditional mathematics, he showed himself a revisionist. And indeed, whereas intuitionistic arithmetic is a subsystem of classical arithmetic, in analysis the situation is different: not all of classical analysis is intuitionistically acceptable, but neither is all of intuitionistic analysis classically acceptable. Brouwer accepted this consequence wholeheartedly.

## 4. Brouwer's Development of Intuitionism

Brouwer's little book *Life, Art and Mysticism* of 1905, while
not developing his foundations of mathematics as such, is a key to
those foundations as developed in his dissertation on which he was
working at the same time and which was finished two years later. Among
a variety of other things, such as notorious views on society and women
in particular, the book contains his basic ideas on mind, language,
ontology and epistemology.

These ideas are applied to mathematics in his dissertation *Over de
Grondslagen der Wiskunde* (*On the Foundations of
Mathematics*), defended in 1907; it is the general philosophy and
not the paradoxes that initiates the development of intuitionism (once
this had begun, solutions to the paradoxes emerged). As did Kant,
Brouwer founds mathematics on a pure intuition of time (while he
rejects pure intuition of space).

Brouwer holds that mathematics is an essentially languageless activity, and that language can only give descriptions of mathematical activity after the fact. This leads him to deny axiomatic approaches any foundational role in mathematics. Also, he construes logic as the study of patterns in linguistic renditions of mathematical activity, and therefore logic is dependent on mathematics (as the study of patterns) and not vice versa. It is these considerations that motivate him to introduce the distinction between mathematics and metamathematics (for which he used the term ‘second order mathematics’), which he would explain to Hilbert in conversations in 1909.

With this view in place, Brouwer sets out to reconstruct Cantorian
set theory. When an attempt (in a draft of the dissertation) at making
constructive sense out of Cantor's second number class (the class of
all denumerably infinite ordinals) and higher classes of even greater
ordinals fails, he realises that this cannot be done and rejects the
higher number classes, leaving only all finite ordinals and an
unfinished or open-ended collection of denumerably infinite ordinals.
Thus, as a consequence of his philosophical views, he consciously puts
aside part of generally accepted mathematics. Soon he would do the same
with a principle of logic, the principle of the excluded middle (PEM),
but in the dissertation he still thinks of it as all right but useless,
interpreting *p*
∨
¬*p* as ¬*p* →
¬*p*.

In ‘De Onbetrouwbaarheid der Logische Principes’
(‘The Unreliability of the Logical Principles’) of 1908,
Brouwer formulates, in general terms, his criticism of PEM: although in
the simple form of *p*
∨
¬*p*, the principle will never lead to a contradiction,
there are instances of it for which one has, constructively speaking,
no positive reason to hold them true. Brouwer names some. Because they
do not in the strict sense refute PEM, they are known as ‘weak
counterexamples’. For further discussion of this topic, see the
supplementary document:

Weak Counterexamples

The innovation that gives intuitionism a much wider range than other varieties of constructive mathematics (including the one in Brouwer's dissertation) are the choice sequences. These are potentially infinite sequences of numbers (or other mathematical objects) chosen one after the other by the individual mathematician. Choice sequences made their first appearance as intuitionistically acceptable objects in a book review from 1914; the principle that makes them mathematically tractable, the continuity principle, was formulated in Brouwer's lectures notes of 1916. The main use of choice sequences is the reconstruction of analysis; points on the continuum (real numbers) are identified with choice sequences satisfying certain conditions. Choice sequences are collected together using a device called a ‘spread’, which performs a function similar to that of the Cantorian set in classical analysis, and initially, Brouwer even uses the word ‘Menge’ (‘set’) for spreads. Brouwer develops a theory of spreads, and a theory of point sets based on it, in the two-part paper from 1918/1919 ‘Begründung der Mengenlehre unabhängig vom Satz vom ausgeschlossenen Dritten’ (‘Founding Set Theory Independently of the Principle of the Excluded Middle’).

The answer to the question in the title of Brouwer's paper ‘Does Every Real Number Have a Decimal Expansion?’ (1921) turns out to be no. Brouwer demonstrates that one can construct choice sequences satisfying the Cauchy condition that in their exact development depend on an as yet open problem. No decimal expansion can be constructed until the open problem is solved; on Brouwer's strict constructivist view, this means that no decimal expansion exists until the open problem is solved. In this sense, one can construct real numbers (i.e., converging choice sequences) that do not have a decimal expansion.

In 1923, again using choice sequences and open problems, Brouwer devises a general technique, now known as ‘Brouwerian counterexamples’, to generate weak counterexamples to classical principles (‘Über die Bedeutung des Satzes vom ausgeschlossenen Dritten in der Mathematik’, ‘On the Significance of the Principle of the Excluded Middle in Mathematics’).

The basic theorems of intuitionistic analysis — the bar theorem, fan theorem, and continuity theorem — are in ‘Über Definitionsbereiche von Funktionen’ (‘On the Domains of Definition of Functions’) of 1927. The first two are structural theorems on spreads; the third (not to be confused with the continuity principle for choice sequences) states that every total function [0,1] → ℜ is continuous and even uniformly continuous. The fan theorem is, in fact, a corollary of the bar theorem; combined with the continuity principle, which is not classically valid, it yields the continuity theorem. In classical analysis both parts of that theorem would be false. The bar and fan theorems on the other hand are classically valid, although the classical and intuitionistic proofs for them are not exchangeable. The classical proofs are intuitionistically not acceptable because of the way they depend on the principle excluded middle; the intuitionistic proofs are classically not acceptable because they depend on reflection on the structure of mental proofs. In this reflection, Brouwer introduced the notion of the ‘fully analysed’ or ‘canonical’ form of a proof, which would be adopted much later by Martin-Löf and by Dummett. In a footnote, Brouwer mentions that such proofs, which he identifies with mental objects in the subject's mind, are often infinite.

‘Intuitionistische Betrachtungen über den Formalismus’ (‘Intuitionist Reflections on Formalism’) of 1928 identifies and discusses four key differences between formalism and intuitionism, all having to do either with the role of PEM or with the relation between mathematics and language. (It is here that Brouwer, in a footnote, refers to the conversations with Hilbert of 1909 mentioned above.) Brouwer emphasizes, as he had done in his dissertation, that formalism presupposes contentual mathematics at the metalevel. He also here presents his first strong counterexample, a refutation of one form of PEM, by showing that it is false that every real number is either rational or irrational. For further discussion of this topic, see the supplementary document:

Strong Counterexamples

Of the two lectures held in Vienna in 1928 — ‘Mathematik, Wissenschaft und Sprache’ (‘Mathematics, Science and Language’) and ‘Die Struktur des Kontinuums’ (‘The Structure of the Continuum’) — the first is of a philosophical nature while the second is more mathematical. In ‘Mathematics, Science and Language’, Brouwer states his general views on the relations between the three subjects mentioned in the title, following a genetic approach, and stressing the role of the will. A longer version of this lecture was presented in Dutch in 1932 as ‘Willen, Weten, Spreken’ (‘Volition, Knowledge, Language’); it contains the first explicit remarks about a notion that had been present from the start, now known as that of the ‘idealized mathematician’ or ‘creating subject’.

The lecture ‘Consciousness, Philosophy and Mathematics’
from 1948 once again goes through Brouwer's philosophy of mind and some
of its consequences for mathematics. Comparison with *Life, Art and
Mysticism*, the first Vienna lecture, and ‘Willen, Weten,
Spreken’ reveals that Brouwer's general philosophy over the years
developed considerably, but only in depth.

In 1949, Brouwer (1949a) publishes the first example of a new class of strong counterexamples, a class that differs from Brouwer's earlier strong counterexample (1928, see above) in that the type of argument, which now goes by the name of ‘creating subject argument’, involves essential reference to the temporal structure of the creating subject's mathematical activity (Heyting, 1956, chs. III and VIII; van Atten, 2003, chs.4 and 5).

Brouwer's example shows that there is a case where the double
negation principle in the form of
∀*x*∈ℜ(¬¬*P*(*x*)
→ *P*(*x*)), leads to a contradiction (‘De
Non-aequivalentie van de Constructieve en de Negatieve Orderelatie in
het Continuum’, ‘The Non-equivalence of the Constructive
and the Negative Order Relation on the Continuum’). The first
publication of this new class of strong counterexamples (and of strong
counterexamples in general) in English had to wait till 1954, in
‘An Example of Contradictority in Classical Theory of
Functions’. This polemical title should be understood as
follows: if one keeps to the letter of the classical theory but in its
interpretation substitutes intuitionistic notions for their classical
counterparts, one arrives at a contradiction. So it is not a
counterexample in the strict sense of the word, but rather a
non-interpretability result. As intuitionistic logic is, formally
speaking, part of classical logic, and intuitionistic arithmetic is
part of classical arithmetic, the existence of strong counterexamples
must depend on an essentially non-classical ingredient, and this is of
course the choice sequences.

The creating subject argument is, after the earlier introduction of choice sequences and the proof of the bar theorem, a new step in the exploitation of the subjective aspects of intuitionism. There is no principled reason why it should be the last.

## Bibliography

### Texts by Brouwer

Almost all of Brouwer's papers can be found in

- Brouwer, L.E.J., 1975,
*Collected Works 1. Philosophy and Foundations of Mathematics*, A. Heyting (ed.), Amsterdam: North-Holland. - Brouwer, L.E.J., 1976,
*Collected Works 2. Geometry, Analysis, Topology and Mechanics*, H. Freudenthal (ed.), Amsterdam: North-Holland.

In the *Collected Works*, papers in Dutch have been translated
into English, but papers in French or German have not. English
translations of several of them can be found in

- van Heijenoort, J., ed., 1967,
*From Frege to Gödel*. A Sourcebook in Mathematical Logic, 1879-1931, Cambridge (MA): Harvard University Press. - Mancosu, P., ed., 1998,
*From Hilbert to Brouwer. The Debate on the Foundations of Mathematics in the 1920s*, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

An English translation of Brouwer's little book *Leven, Kunst en
Mystiek* of 1905, of which the *Collected Works* contain
only excerpts, is

- Brouwer, L.E.J., 1996, ‘Life, Art and Mysticism’,
*Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic*, 37(3):389-429. Translated by Walter van Stigt, who provides an introduction on pp.381-387.

The Berlin lectures of 1927 have been published in

- Brouwer, L.E.J., 1992,
*Intuitionismus*, D. van Dalen (ed.), Mannheim: BI-Wissenschaftsverlag.

The Cambridge lectures of 1946-1951, which are recommended as Brouwer's own introduction to intuitionism, have been published as

- Brouwer, L.E.J., 1981,
*Brouwer's Cambridge Lectures on Intuitionism*, D. van Dalen (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Of particular biographical interest, yet untranslated, is the correspondence between Brouwer and his friend, the socialist poet C.S. Adama van Scheltema, which covers the years 1898-1924:

- Brouwer, L.E.J., & Adama van Scheltema, C.S., 1984,
*Droeve Snaar, Vriend van Mij. Brieven*, D. van Dalen (ed.), Amsterdam: De Arbeiderspers.

### Cited primary texts by others

- Euwe, M., 1929, ‘Mengentheoretische Betrachtungen über
das Schachspiel’,
*Ned. Akad. Wetensch. Proc.*, 32:633-644. - Hilbert, D., 1922, ‘Neubegründung der Mathematik. Erste
Mitteilung’,
*Hamburger Math. Seminarabhandlungen*, 1:157-177. English translation ‘The New Grounding of Mathematics: first report’ in (Mancosu 1998). - Mannoury, G., 1909,
*Methodologisches und Philosophisches zur Elementar-Mathematik*, Haarlem: Visser. - Welby, V., 1896, ‘Sense, Meaning and Interpretation’,
*Mind*, N.S., 5(17):24-37; (18):186-202. - Weyl, H., 1921, ‘Über die neue Grundlagenkrise der
Mathematik’,
*Mathematische Zeitschrift*, 10:39-79. English translation ‘On the New Foundational Crisis of Mathematics’ in (Mancosu 1998).

### Secondary Literature

- van Atten, M., 2004,
*On Brouwer*, Belmont (CA): Wadsworth.- A philosophical introduction to intuitionism as conceived by Brouwer, with extensive treatments of the proof of the bar theorem, the creating subject, and intersubjectivity.

- van Dalen, D., 1990, ‘The War of the Frogs and the Mice, or
the Crisis of the Mathematische Annalen’,
*Mathematical Intelligencer*, 12(4): 17-31. - van Dalen, D., 1999/2005,
*Mystic, Geometer, and Intuitionist*, 2 volumes, Oxford: Clarendon Press.- The standard biography of Brouwer. Volume 1,
*The Dawning Revolution*, covers the years 1881-1928, volume 2,*Hope and Disillusion*, covers 1929-1966.

- The standard biography of Brouwer. Volume 1,
- van Dalen, D., 2001,
*L.E.J. Brouwer 1881-1966. Een Biografie. Het Heldere Licht van de Wiskunde*, Amsterdam: Bert Bakker.- A popular biography in 1 volume, in Dutch.

- Dummett, M., 1977,
*Elements of Intuitionism*, Oxford: Oxford University Press. 2nd, revised edition, 2000, Oxford: Clarendon Press.- An overview of intuitionism. Philosophically, it seems closer to Wittgenstein than to Brouwer.

- Hesseling, D.E., 2003,
*Gnomes in the Fog. The Reception of Brouwer's Intuitionism in the 1920s*, Basel: Birkhauser.- . A detailed historical discussion of the reactions to Brouwer's mature intuitionism during the foundational debate.

- Heyting, A., 1956,
*Intuitionism. An introduction*, Amsterdam: North-Holland. 2nd, revised edition, 1966. 3rd, revised edition, 1971.- Probably the most influential book on the subject ever written. In a style that is more down-to-earth and oecumenical than Brouwer's, Heyting presents the intuitionistic versions of various basic subjects in everyday mathematics. Brouwer and Heyting have some philosophical disagreements that make a difference in their appreciation of some aspects of intuitionistic mathematics. No comments of Brouwer on this book are known.

- Largeault, J., 1993,
*Intuition et Intuitionisme*, Paris: Vrin.- An overview of intuitionism, staying close to Brouwer, and showing a good sense of the historical background of Brouwer's notion of intuition.

- Placek, T., 1999,
*Mathematical Intuitionism and Intersubjectivity*, Dordrecht: Kluwer.- A comparison of the arguments for intuitionism advanced by, respectively, Brouwer, Heyting, and Dummett, in particular with respect to the possibility of intersubjective validity of intuitionistic mathematics.

- van Stigt, W., 1990,
*Brouwer's Intuitionism*, Amsterdam: North-Holland.- Contains interesting philosophical discussions and gives English translations of material from the Brouwer archive. The biographical sketch has now been superseded by (van Dalen, 1999/2005) and (van Dalen, 2001).

## Other Internet Resources

- Review of Hesseling's
*Gnomes in the Fog*in the*Bulletin of Symbolic Logic*(Postscript) - Dirk van Dalen's Brouwer bibliography (Postscript)

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## Related Entries

Cantor, Georg | Hilbert, David | logic, history of: intuitionistic logic | logic: classical | logic: intuitionistic | mathematics, philosophy of: formalism | mathematics: constructive | Platonism: in metaphysics

### Acknowledgments

I thank Dirk van Dalen and the editors for their comments on earlier versions.