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George Boole

First published Wed Apr 21, 2010

George Boole (1815–1864) was an English mathematician and a founder of the algebraic tradition in logic. He worked as a schoolmaster in England and from 1849 until his death as professor of mathematics at Queen's University, Cork, Ireland. He revolutionized logic by applying methods from the then-emerging field of symbolic algebra to logic. Where traditional (Aristotelian) logic relied on cataloging the valid syllogisms of various simple forms, Boole's method provided general algorithms in an algebraic language which applied to an infinite variety of arguments of arbitrary complexity. These methods were outlined in two major works, The Mathematical Analysis of Logic (1847) and The Laws of Thought (1854).

1. Life and Work

George Boole was born November 2, 1815 in Lincoln, Lincolnshire, England, into a family of modest means, with a father who was evidently more of a good companion than a good breadwinner. His father was a shoemaker whose real passion was being a devoted dilettante in the realm of science and technology, one who enjoyed participating in the Lincoln Mechanics' Institution; this was essentially a community social club promoting reading, discussions, and lectures regarding science. It was founded in 1833, and in 1834 Boole's father became the curator of its library. This love of learning was clearly inherited by Boole. Without the benefit of an elite schooling, but with a supportive family and access to excellent books, in particular from Sir Edward Bromhead, FRS, who lived only a few miles from Lincoln, Boole was able to essentially teach himself foreign languages and advanced mathematics.

Starting at the age of 16 it was necessary for Boole to find gainful employment, since his father was no longer capable of providing for the family. After 3 years working as a teacher in private schools, Boole decided, at the age of 19, to open his own small school in Lincoln. He would be a schoolmaster for the next 15 years, until 1849 when he became a professor at the newly opened Queen's University in Cork, Ireland. With heavy responsibilities for his parents and siblings, it is remarkable that he nonetheless found time during the years as a schoolmaster to continue his own education and to start a program of research, primarily on differential equations and the calculus of variations connected with the works of Laplace and Lagrange (which he studied in the original French).

There is a widespread belief that Boole was primarily a logician—in reality he became a recognized mathematician well before he had penned a single word about logic, all the while running his private school to care for his parents and siblings. Boole's ability to read French, German and Italian put him in a good position to start serious mathematical studies when, at the age of 16, he read Lacroix's Calcul Différentiel, a gift from his friend Reverend G.S. Dickson of Lincoln. Seven years later, in 1838, he would write his first mathematical paper (although not the first to be published), “On certain theorems in the calculus of variations,” focusing on improving results he had read in Lagrange's Méchanique Analytique.

In early 1839 Boole travelled to Cambridge to meet with the young mathematician Duncan F. Gregory (1813–1844) who was the editor of the Cambridge Mathematical Journal (CMJ)—Gregory had founded this journal in 1837 and edited it until his health failed in 1843 (he died in early 1844, at the age of 30). Gregory, though only 2 years beyond his degree in 1839, became an important mentor to Boole. With Gregory's support, which included coaching Boole on how to write a mathematical paper, Boole entered the public arena of mathematical publication in 1841.

Boole's mathematical publications span the 24 years from 1841 to 1864, the year he died from pneumonia. If we break these 24 years into three segments, the first 6 years (1841–1846), the second 8 years (1847–1854), and the last 10 years (1855–1864), we find that his work on logic was entirely in the middle 8 years.

In his first 6 career years, Boole published 15 mathematical papers, all but two in the CMJ and its 1846 successor, The Cambridge and Dublin Mathematical Journal. He wrote on standard mathematical topics, mainly differential equations, integration and the calculus of variations. Boole enjoyed early success in using the new symbolical method in analysis, a method which took a differential equation, say:

d2y/dx2dy/dx − 2y = cos(x),

and wrote it in the form Operator(y) = cos(x). This was (formally) achieved by letting:

D = d/dx, D2 = d2/dx2, etc.

leading to an expression of the differential equation as:

(D2D − 2) y = cos(x).

Now symbolical algebra came into play by simply treating the operator D2D − 2 as though it were an ordinary polynomial in algebra. Boole's 1841 paper “On the Integration of Linear Differential Equations with Constant Coefficients” gave a nice improvement to Gregory's method for solving such differential equations, an improvement based on a standard tool in algebra, the use of partial fractions.

In 1841 Boole also published his first paper on invariants, a paper that would strongly influence Eisenstein, Cayley, and Sylvester to develop the subject. Arthur Cayley (1821–1895), the future Sadlerian Professor in Cambridge and one of the most prolific mathematicians in history, wrote his first letter to Boole in 1844, complimenting him on his excellent work on invariants. He became a close personal friend, one who would go to Lincoln to visit and stay with Boole in the years before Boole moved to Cork, Ireland. In 1842 Boole started a correspondence with Augustus De Morgan (1806–1871) that initiated another lifetime friendship.

In 1843 the schoolmaster Boole finished a lengthy paper on differential equations, combining an exponential substitution and variation of parameters with the separation of symbols method. The paper was too long for the CMJ—Gregory, and later De Morgan, encouraged him to submit it to the Royal Society. The first referee rejected Boole's paper, but the second recommended it for the Gold Medal for the best mathematical paper written in the years 1841–1844, and this recommendation was accepted. In 1844 the Royal Society published Boole's paper and awarded him the Gold Medal—the first Gold Medal awarded by the Society to a mathematician. The next year Boole read a paper at the annual meeting of the British Association for the Advancement of Science at Cambridge in June 1845. This led to new contacts and friends, in particular William Thomson (1824–1907), the future Lord Kelvin.

Not long after starting to publish papers, Boole was eager to find a way to become affiliated with an institution of higher learning. He considered attending Cambridge University to obtain a degree, but was counselled that fulfilling the various requirements would likely seriously interfere with his research program, not to mention the problems of obtaining financing. Finally, in 1849, he obtained a professorship in a new university opening in Cork, Ireland. In the years he was a professor in Cork (1849–1864) he would occasionally inquire about the possibility of a position back in England.

The 8 year stretch from 1847 to 1854 starts and ends with Boole's two books on mathematical logic. In addition Boole published 24 more papers on traditional mathematics during this period, while only one paper was written on logic, that being in 1848. He was awarded an honorary LL.D. degree by the University of Dublin in 1851, and this was the title that he used beside his name in his 1854 book on logic. Boole's 1847 book, Mathematical Analysis of Logic, will be referred to as MAL; the 1854 book, Laws of Thought, as LT.

During the last 10 years of his career, from 1855 to 1864, Boole published 17 papers on mathematics and two mathematics books, one on differential equations and one on difference equations. Both books were considered state of the art and used for instruction at Cambridge. Also during this time significant honors came in:

1857 Fellowship of the Royal Society
1858 Honorary Member of the Cambridge Philosophical Society
1859 Degree of DCL, honoris causa from Oxford

Unfortunately his keen sense of duty led to his walking through a rainstorm in late 1864, and then lecturing in wet clothes. Not long afterwards, on December 8, 1864 in Ballintemple, County Cork, Ireland, he died of pneumonia, at the age of 49. Another paper on mathematics and a revised book on differential equations, giving considerable attention to singular solutions, were published post mortem.

The reader interested in an excellent and thorough account of Boole's personal life is referred to Desmond MacHale's George Boole, His Life and Work, 1985, a source to which this article is indebted.

2. The Context and Background of Boole's Work In Logic

To understand how Boole developed, in such a short time, his impressive algebra of logic, it is useful to understand the broad outlines of the work on the foundations of algebra that had been undertaken by mathematicians affiliated with Cambridge University in the 1800s prior to the beginning of Boole's mathematical publishing career. An excellent reference for further reading connected to this section is the annotated sourcebook From Kant to Hilbert by Ewald (1996).

The 19th century opened in England with mathematics in the doldrums. The English mathematicians had feuded with the continental mathematicians over the issues of priority in the development of the calculus, resulting in the English following Newton's notation, and those on the continent following that of Leibniz. One of the obstacles to overcome in updating English mathematics was the fact that the great developments of algebra and analysis had been built on dubious foundations, and there were English mathematicians who were quite vocal about these shortcomings. In ordinary algebra, it was the use of negative numbers and imaginary numbers that caused concern. The first major attempt among the English to clear up the foundation problems of algebra was George Peacock's Treatise on Algebra, 1830 (a second edition appeared as two volumes, 1842/1845). He divided the subject into two parts, the first part being arithmetical algebra, the algebra of the positive numbers (which did not permit operations like subtraction in cases where the answer would not be a positive number). The second part was symbolical algebra, which was governed not by a specific interpretation, as was the case for arithmetical algebra, but by laws. In symbolical algebra there were no restrictions on using subtraction, etc.

The terminology of algebra was somewhat different in the 19th century from what is used today. In particular they did not use the word “variable”; the letter x in an expression like 2x + 5 was called a symbol, hence the name “symbolical algebra”. In this article a prefix will sometimes be added, as in number symbol or class symbol, to emphasize the intended interpretation of a symbol.

Peacock believed that in order for symbolical algebra to be a useful subject its laws had to be closely related to those of arithmetical algebra. For this purpose he introduced his principle of the permanence of equivalent forms, a principle connecting results in arithmetical algebra to those in symbolical algebra. This principle has two parts:

(1) General results in arithmetical algebra belong to the laws of symbolical algebra.

(2) Whenever an interpretation of a result of symbolical algebra made sense in the setting of arithmetical algebra, the result would give a correct result in arithmetic.

A fascinating use of algebra was introduced in 1814 by François-Joseph Servois (1776–1847) when he tackled differential equations by separating the differential operator part from the subject function part, as described in an example given above. This application of algebra captured the interest of Duncan Gregory who published a number of papers on the method of the separation of symbols, that is, the separation into operators and objects, in the CMJ. He also wrote on the foundation of algebra, and it was Gregory's foundation that Boole embraced, almost verbatim. Gregory had abandoned Peacock's principle of the permanence of equivalent forms in favor of two simple laws. Unfortunately these laws fell far short of what is required to justify even some of the most elementary results in algebra. In “On the foundation of algebra,” 1839, the first of four papers on this topic by De Morgan that appeared in the Transactions of the Cambridge Philosophical Society, one finds a tribute to the separation of symbols in algebra, and the claim that modern algebraists usually regard the symbols as denoting operators (e.g., the derivative operation) instead of objects like numbers. The footnote:

Professor Peacock is the first, I believe, who distinctly set forth the difference between what I have called the technical and the logical branches of algebra.
credits Peacock with being the first to separate (what are now called) the syntactic and the semantic aspects of algebra. In the second foundations paper (in 1841) De Morgan proposed what he considered to be a complete set of eight rules for working with symbolical algebra.

3. The Mathematical Analysis of Logic (1847)

Boole's path to logic fame started in a curious way. In early 1847 he was stimulated to launch his investigations into logic by a trivial but very public dispute between De Morgan and the Scottish philosopher Sir William Hamilton (not to be confused with the Irish mathematician Sir William Rowan Hamilton). This dispute revolved around who deserved credit for the idea of quantifying the predicate (e.g., “All A is all B,” “All A is some B,” etc.). Within a few months Boole had written his 82 page monograph, Mathematical Analysis of Logic, giving an algebraic approach to Aristotelian logic. (Some say that this monograph and De Morgan's book Formal Logic appeared on the same day in November 1847. )

The Introduction chapter starts with Boole reviewing the symbolical method. The second chapter, First Principles, lets the symbol 1 represent the universe which “comprehends every conceivable class of objects, whether existing or not.” Capital letters X, Y, Z, … denoted classes. Then, no doubt heavily influenced by his very successful work using algebraic techniques on differential operators, and consistent with De Morgan's 1839 assertion that algebraists preferred interpreting symbols as operators, Boole introduced the elective symbol x corresponding to the class X, the elective symbol y corresponding to Y, etc. The elective symbols denoted election operators—for example the election operator red when applied to a class would elect (select) the red items in the class. (One can simply replace the elective symbols by their corresponding class symbols and have the interpretation used in LT in 1854.)

Then Boole introduced the first operation, the multiplication xy of elective symbols. The standard notation xy for multiplication also had a standard meaning for operators (for example, differential operators), namely one applied y to an object and then x is applied to the result. (In modern terminology, this is the composition of the two operators.) Thus, as pointed out by Hailperin (1986), it seems likely that this established notation convention handed Boole his definition of multiplication of elective symbols as composition of operators. When one switches to using classes instead of elective operators, as in LT, the corresponding multiplication of two classes results in their intersection.

The first law in MAL was the distributive law x(u+v) = xu + xv, where Boole said that u+v corresponded to dividing a class into two parts. This was the first mention of addition. On p. 17 Boole added the commutative law xy = yx and the idempotent law x2 = x (which Boole called the index law). Once these two laws of Gregory were secured, Boole believed he was entitled to fully employ the ordinary algebra of his time, and indeed one sees Taylor series and Lagrange multipliers in MAL. The law of idempotent class symbols, x2 = x, was different from the two fundamental laws of symbolical algebra—it only applied to the individual elective symbols, not in general to compound terms that one could build from these symbols. For example, one does not in general have (x+y)2 = x+y in Boole's system since, by ordinary algebra with idempotent class symbols, this would imply 2xy = 0, and then xy = 0, which would force x and y to represent disjoint classes. But it is not the case that every pair of classes is disjoint.

Boole focused on Aristotelian logic in MAL, with its 4 types of categorical propositions and an open-ended collection of hypothetical propositions. In the chapter Of Expression and Interpretation, Boole said that necessarily the class not-X is expressed by 1−x. This is the first appearance of subtraction. Then he gave equations to express the categorical propositions (see in Section 6.2 below). The first to be expressed was All X is Y, for which he used xy = x, which he then converted into x(1−y) = 0. This was the first appearance of 0 in MAL—it was not introduced as the symbol for the empty class. Indeed the empty class did not appear in MAL. Evidently an equation E = 0 performed the role of a predicate in MAL, asserting that the class denoted by E simply did not exist. (In LT, the empty class would be denoted by 0.) Boole went beyond the foundations of symbolical algebra that Gregory had used in 1844—he added De Morgan's 1841 single rule of inference, that equivalent operations performed upon equivalent subjects produce equivalent results.

In the chapter on conversions, such as Conversion by Limitation—All X is Y, therefore Some Y is X—Boole found the Aristotelian classification defective in that it did not treat complements, such as not-X, on the same footing as the named classes X, Y, Z, etc. With his extended version of Aristotelian logic in mind (giving not-X equal billing), he gave (p. 30) a set of three transformation rules which allowed one to construct all valid two-line categorical arguments (providing you accepted the unwritten convention that simple names like X and not-X denoted non-empty classes).

Regarding syllogisms, Boole did not care for the Aristotelian classification into Figures and Moods as they seemed rather arbitrary and not particularly suited to the algebraic setting. His first observation was that syllogistic reasoning was just an exercise in elimination, namely the middle term was eliminated to give the conclusion. Elimination was well known in the ordinary algebraic theory of equations, so Boole simply borrowed a standard result to use in his algebra of logic. If the premises of a syllogism involved the classes X, Y, and Z, and one wanted to eliminate y, then Boole put the equations for the two premises in the form:

ay + b = 0

ay + b′ = 0.

The result of eliminating y in ordinary algebra gave the equation

ab′ − ab   =  0,

and this is what Boole used in his algebra of logic to derive the conclusion equation. Although the conclusion is indeed correct, unfortunately this elimination result would be too weak for his algebra of logic if he only used his primary translations into equations. In the cases where both premises were translated as equations of the form ay = 0, the elimination conclusion turned out to be 0 = 0, even though Aristotelian logic might demand a non-trivial conclusion. This was the reason Boole introduced the alternative equational translations of categorical propositions, to be able to derive all of the valid Aristotelian syllogisms (see p. 32). With this convention, of using secondary translations when needed, it turned out that the only cases that led to 0 = 0 were those for which the premises did not belong to a valid syllogism.

Boole emphasized that when a premise about X and Y is translated into an equation involving x, y and v, the understanding was that v was to be used to express “some”, but only in the context in which it appeared in the premiss. For example, “Some X is Y” has the primary translation v = xy, which implied the secondary translation vx = vy. This could also be read as “Some X is Y”. Another consequence of v = xy is v(1−x) = v(1−y). However it was not permitted to read this as “Some not-X is not-Y” since v did not appear with 1−x in the premiss. Boole's use of v in the translation of propositions into equations, as well as its use in solving equations, has been a long-standing bone of contention.

Boole analyzed the seven forms of hypothetical syllogisms that were in Aristotelian logic, from the Disjunctive Syllogism to the Complex Destructive Dilemma, and pointed out that it would be easy to create many more such forms. In the Postscript to MAL, Boole recognized that propositional logic used a two-valued system, but he did not offer a propositional logic to deal with this.

Beginning with the chapter Properties of Elective Functions, Boole developed general theorems for working with equations in his algebra of logic—the Expansion Theorem and the properties of constituents are discussed in this chapter. Up to this point his sole focus was to show that Aristotelian logic could be handled by simple algebraic methods, mainly through the use of an elimination theorem borrowed from ordinary algebra.

It was natural for Boole to want to solve equations in his algebra of logic since this had been a main goal of ordinary algebra, and had led to many difficult questions (e.g., how to solve a 5th degree equation). Fortunately for Boole, the situation in his algebra of logic was much simpler—he could always solve an equation, and finding the solution was important to applications of his system, to derive conclusions in logic. An equation was solved in part by using expansion after performing division. This method of solution was the result of which he was the most proud—it described how to solve an elective equation for one of its symbols in terms of the others, and it is this that Boole claimed (in the Introduction chapter of MAL) would offer “the means of a perfect analysis of any conceivable set of propositions, …”. In LT Boole would continue to regard this tool as the highlight of his work.

Boole's final example (p. 78) in MAL used a well known technique for handling constraint conditions in analysis called Lagrange Multipliers—this method, like his use of Taylor series, was evidently considered overkill, if not somewhat dubious, and did not appear in LT (Taylor series did appear in a footnote in LT—Boole had not completely given up on them).

4. The Laws of Thought (1854)

Boole's second logic book, An Investigation of The Laws of Thought on which are founded the Mathematical Theories of Logic and Probabilities, published in 1854, was an effort to correct and perfect his 1847 book on logic. The second half of this 424 page book presented probability theory as an excellent topic to illustrate the power of his algebra of logic. Boole discussed the theoretical possibility of using probability theory (enhanced by his algebra of logic) to uncover fundamental laws governing society by analyzing large quantities of social data.

Boole said that he would use simple letters like x to represent classes, although later he would also use capital letters like V. The universe was a class; and there was a class described as having “no beings” which we call the empty class. The operation of multiplication was defined to be intersection, and this led to his first law, xy = yx. Next (some pages later) he gave the idempotent law x2 = x. Addition was introduced as aggregation when the classes were disjoint. He stated the commutative law for addition, x + y = y + x, and the distributive law z(x + y) = zx + zy. Then followed xy = − y + x and z(xy) = zxzy.

One might expect that Boole was building toward an axiomatic foundation for his algebra of logic, just as in MAL, evidently having realized that the three laws in MAL were not enough. Indeed he did discuss the rules of inference, that adding or subtracting equals from equals gives equals, and multiplying equals by equals gives equals. But then the development of an axiomatic approach came to an abrupt halt. There was no discussion as to whether these axioms and rules were sufficient to build his algebra of logic. Instead he simply and briefly, with remarkably little fanfare, presented a radically new foundation for his algebra of logic.

He said that since the only idempotent numbers were 0 and 1, this suggested that the correct algebra to use for logic would be the common algebra of the ordinary numbers modified by restricting the symbols to the values 0 and 1. He stated what, in this article, is called The Rule of 0 and 1, that a law or argument held in logic iff after being translated into equational form it held in common algebra with this 0,1-restriction on the possible interpretations (i.e., values) of the symbols. Boole would use this Rule to justify his main theorems ( Expansion, Reduction, Elimination ), and for no other purpose. The main theorems in turn yielded Boole's General Method for analyzing the consequences of propositional premises.

In Chapter V he discussed the role of uninterpretables in his work; as a (partial) justification for the use of uninterpretable steps in symbolic algebra he pointed to the well known use of √−1. In succeeding chapters he gave the Expansion Theorem, the new full-strength Elimination Theorem, a Reduction Theorem, and the use of division to solve an equation.

After many examples and results for special cases of solving equations, Boole turned to the topic of the interpretability of a logical function. Boole had already stated that every equation is interpretable (by converting it into a collection of constituent equations). However terms need not be interpretable, e.g., 1+1 is not interpretable.

Boole's chapter on secondary propositions was essentially the same as in MAL except that he changed from using “the cases when X is true” to “the times when X is true”. In Chapter XIII Boole selected some well-known arguments of Clarke and Spinoza, on the nature of an eternal being, to put under the magnifying glass of his algebra of logic, starting with the comment:

2. The chief practical difficulty of this inquiry will consist, not in the application of the method to the premises once determined, but in ascertaining what the premises are.

One conclusion was:

19. It is not possible, I think, to rise from the perusal of the arguments of Clarke and Spinoza without a deep conviction of the futility of all endeavours to establish, entirely a priori, the existence of an Infinite Being, His attributes, and His relation to the universe.

In the final chapter on logic, chapter XV, Boole presented his analysis of the conversions and syllogisms of Aristotelian logic. He considered this ancient logic to be a weak, fragmented attempt at a logical system. This much neglected chapter is quite interesting because it is the only chapter where he analyzed particular propositions, making essential use of additional letters like “v” to encode “some”. This is also the chapter where he detailed (unfortunately incompletely) the rules for working with “some”.

Briefly stated, Boole gave the reader a summary of traditional Aristotelian categorical logic, and analyzed some simple examples using ad hoc techniques with his algebra of logic. Then he launched into proving a comprehensive result by applying his General Method to the pair of equations:

vx  =  vy
wz  =  wy,
noting that the premises of many categorical syllogisms can be put in this form. His goal was to eliminate y and find expressions for x, 1−x and vx in terms of z, v, v′, w, w′. This led to three equations involving large algebraic expressions. Boole omitted almost all details of his derivation, but summarized the results in terms of the established results of Aristotelian logic. Then he noted that the remaining categorical syllogisms are such that their premises can be put in the form:
vx  =  vy

wz  =  w′(1−y),

and this led to another triple of large equations.

5. Later Developments

5.1 Objections to Boole's Algebra of Logic

Many objections to Boole's system have been published over the years; three among the most important concern:

We look at a different objection, namely at the Boole/Jevons dispute over adding X + X = X as a law. In Laws of Thought, p. 66, Boole said:

The expression x + y seems indeed uninterpretable, unless it be assumed that the things represented by x and the things represented by y are entirely separate; that they embrace no individuals in common.
[The following details are from “The development of the theories of mathematical logic and the principles of mathematics, William Stanley Jevons,” by Philip Jourdain, 1914.]

In an 1863 letter to Boole regarding a draft of a commentary on Boole's system that Jevons was considering for his forthcoming book (Pure Logic, 1864), Jevons said:

It is surely obvious, however, that x+x is equivalent only to x, …

Professor Boole's notation [process of subtraction] is inconsistent with a self-evident law.

If my view be right, his system will come to be regarded as a most remarkable combination of truth and error.

Boole replied:
Thus the equation x + x = 0 is equivalent to the equation x = 0; but the expression x + x is not equivalent to the expression x.
Jevons responded by asking if Boole could deny the truth of x + x = x.

Boole, clearly exasperated, replies:

To be explicit, I now, however, reply that it is not true that in Logic x + x = x, though it is true that x + x = 0 is equivalent to x = 0. If I do not write more it is not from any unwillingness to discuss the subject with you, but simply because if we differ on this fundamental point it is impossible that we should agree in others.
Jevons's final effort to get Boole to understand the issue was:
I do not doubt that it is open to you to hold …[that x + x = x is not true] according to the laws of your system, and with this explanation your system probably is perfectly consistent with itself … But the question then becomes a wider one—does your system correspond to the Logic of common thought?
Jevons's new law, X + X = X, resulted from his conviction that “+” should denote what we now call union, where the membership of X + Y is given by an inclusive “or”. Boole simply did not see any way to define X + Y as a class unless X and Y were disjoint, as already noted.

Various explanations have been given as to why Boole could not comprehend the possibility of Jevons's suggestion. Boole clearly had the semantic concept of union—he expressed the union of X and Y as x + (yx), a union of two disjoint classes, and pointed out that the elements of this class are the ones that belong to either X or Y or both. So how could he so completely fail to see the possibility of taking union for his fundamental operation + instead of his curious partial union operation?

The answer is simple: the law x + x = x would have destroyed his ability to use ordinary algebra: from x + x = x one has, by ordinary algebra, x = 0. This would force every class symbol to denote the empty class. Jevons's proposed law x + x = x was simply not true if one was committed to making ordinary algebra function as the algebra of logic.

5.2. Modern Reconstruction of Boole's System

Given the enormous degree of sophistication achieved in modern algebra in the 20th century, it is rather surprising that a law-preserving total algebra extension of Boole's partial algebra of classes did not appear until Theodore Hailperin's book of 1976—the delay was likely caused by readers not believing that Boole was using ordinary algebra. Hailperin's extension was to look at labelings of the universe with integers, that is, each element of the universe is labeled with an integer. Each labeling of the universe creates a multi-set (perhaps one should say multi-class) consisting of those labeled elements where the label is non-zero—one can think of the label of an element as describing how many copies of the element are in the multi-set. Boole's classes correspond to the multi-sets where all the labels are 1 (the elements not in the class have the label 0). The uninterpretable elements of Boole become interpretable when viewed as multi-sets—they are given by labelings of the universe where some label is not 0 or 1.

To add two multi-sets one simply adds the labels on each element of the universe. Likewise for subtraction and multiplication. (For the reader familiar with modern abstract algebra, one can take the extension of Boole's partial algebra to be ZU where Z is the ring of integers, and U is the universe of discourse.) The multi-sets corresponding to classes are precisely the idempotent multi-sets. It turns out that the laws and principles Boole was using in his algebra of logic hold for this system. By this means Boole's methods are proved to be correct for the algebra of logic of universal propositions. Hailperin's analysis did not apply to particular propositions.

Boole could not find a translation that worked as cleanly for the particular propositions as for the universal propositions. In 1847 Boole used the following two translations, the second one being a consequence of the first:

Some Xs are Ys …………. v = xy and vx = vy.
He initially used the symbol v to capture the essence of “some”. Later he used other symbols as well, and also he used v with other meanings (such as for the coefficients in an expansion). One of the problems with his translation scheme with v was that at times one needed “margin notes,” to keep track of which class(es) the v was attached to when it was introduced. The rules for translating from equations with v's back to particular statements were never clearly formulated. For example in Chapter XV one sees a derivation of x = vvy which is then translated as Some X is Y. But he had no rules for when a product of v's carries the import of “some”. Such problems detract from Boole's system; his explanations leave doubts as to which procedures are legitimate in his system when dealing with particular statements.

There is one point on which even Hailperin was not faithful to Boole's work, namely he used modern semantics, where the simple symbols x, y, etc., can refer to the empty class as well as to a non-empty class. With modern semantics one cannot have the Conversion by Limitation which held in Aristotelian logic: from All X is Y follows Some Y is X. In his Formal Logic of 1847, De Morgan pointed out that all writers on logic had assumed that the classes referred to in a categorical proposition were non-empty. This restriction of the class symbols to non-empty classes, and dually to non-universe classes, will be called Aristotelian semantics. Boole had evidently followed this Aristotelian convention because he derived all the Aristotelian results, such as Conversion by Limitation. A proper interpretation (faithful to Boole's work) of Boole's system requires Aristotelian semantics for the class symbols x, y, z, … ; unfortunately it seems that the published literature on Boole's system has failed to note this.

6. Boole's Methods

While reading through this section, on the technical details of Boole's methods, the reader may find it useful to consult the

supplement of examples from Boole's two books.

These examples have been augmented with comments explaining, in each step of a derivation by Boole, which aspect of his methods is being employed.

6.1 The Three Methods of Argument Analysis Used by Boole in LT

Boole used three methods to analyze arguments in LT:

(1) The first was the purely ad hoc algebraic manipulations that were used (in conjunction with a weak version of the Elimination Theorem) on the Aristotelian arguments in MAL.

(2) Secondly, in section 15 of Chapter II of LT, one finds the method that, in this article, is called the Rule of 0 and 1.

The theorems of LT combine to yield the master result,

(3) Boole's General Method (in this article it will always be referred to using capitalized first letters—Boole just called it “a method”).

When applying the ad hoc method, he used parts of ordinary algebra along with the idempotent law x2 = x to manipulate equations. There was no pre-established procedure to follow—success with this method depended on intuitive skills developed through experience.

The second method, the Rule of 0 and 1, is very powerful, but it depends on being given a collection of premiss equations and a conclusion equation. It is a truth-table like method (but Boole never drew a table when applying the method) to determine if the argument is correct. Boole only used this method to establish the theorems that justified his General Method, even though it is an excellent tool for simple arguments like syllogisms. The Rule of 0 and 1 is a somewhat shadowy figure in LT—it has no name, and is never referred to by section or page number.

The third method to analyze arguments was the highlight of Boole's work in logic, his General Method (discussed immediately after this). This is the one he used for all but the simplest examples in LT; for the simplest examples he resorted to the first method of ad hoc algebraic techniques because, for one skilled in algebraic manipulations, using them is usually far more efficient than going through the General Method.

The final version (from LT) of his General Method for analyzing arguments is, briefly stated, to:

(1) convert (or translate) the propositions into equations,

(2) apply a prescribed sequence of algebraic processes to the equations, processes which yield desired conclusion equations, and then

(3) convert the equational conclusions into propositional conclusions, yielding the desired consequences of the original collection of propositions.

With this method Boole had replaced the art of reasoning from premiss propositions to conclusion propositions by a routine mechanical algebraic procedure.

In LT Boole divided propositions into two kinds, primary and secondary. These correspond to, but are not exactly the same as, the Aristotelian division into categorical and hypothetical propositions. First we discuss his General Method applied to primary propositions.

6.2. Boole's General Method for Primary Propositions

Boole recognized three forms of primary propositions:

These were his version of the Aristotelian categorical propositions, where X is the subject term and Y the predicate term. The terms X and Y could be complex names, for example, X could be X1 or X2.

STEP 1: Names are converted into algebraic terms as follows:

Terms MAL LT
universe 1 p. 15 1 p. 48
empty class 0 p. 47
not X 1 − x p. 20 1 − x p. 48
X and Y xy p. 16 xy p. 28
X or Y (inclusive)
x + y(1 − x)
xy + x(1 − y) + y(1− x)
p. 56
X or Y (exclusive) x(1 − y) + y(1 − x) p. 56

We will call the letters x, y, … class symbols (as noted earlier, the algebra of the 1800s did not use the word variables).

STEP 2: Having converted names for the terms into algebraic terms, one then converts the propositions into equations using the following:

Primary Propositions MAL (1847) LT (1854)
All X is Y x(1−y) = 0 p. 26 x  =  vy p. 64, 152
No X is Y xy  =  0 (not primary)
All X is all Y (not primary) x = y
Some X is Y v  =  xy vx  =  vy
Some X is not Y v  =  x(1−y) (not primary)

Boole used the four categorical propositions as his primary forms in 1847, but in 1854 he eliminated the negative propositional forms, noting that one could change “not Y” to “not-Y”. Thus in 1854 he would express “No X is Y” by “All X is not-Y”, with the translation

x(1 − (1 − y))  =  0,
which simplifies to xy  =  0.

STEP 3: After converting the premises into algebraic form one has a collection of equations, say

p1  =  q1, p2  =  q2, …, pn  =  qn.
Express these as equations with 0 on the right side, that is, as
r1  =  0, r2  =  0, …, rn  =  0,
r1  :=  p1q1, r2  :=  p2q2, …, rn  :=  pnqn.
STEP 4: (REDUCTION) [LT (p. 121) ]

Reduce the system of equations

r1  =  0, r2  =  0, …, rn  =  0,
to a single equation r  =  0. Boole had three different methods for doing this—he seemed to have a preference for summing the squares:
r  :=  r12 + · · · + rn2  =  0.
Steps 1 through 4 are mandatory in Boole's General Method. After executing these steps there are various options for continuing, depending on the goal.

STEP 5: (ELIMINATION) [LT (p. 101) ]

Suppose one wants the most general equational conclusion derived from r  =  0 that involves some, but not all, of the class symbols in r. Then one wants to eliminate certain symbols. Suppose r involves the class symbols

x1, … , xj and y1, … , yk.

Then one can write r as r(x1, … , xj, y1, … , yk).

Boole's procedure to eliminate the symbols x1, …, xj from

r(x1, … , xj, y1, … , yk)  =  0
to obtain
s(y1, … , yk)  =  0
was as follows:

1. form all possible expressions r(a1, … , aj, y1, … , yk) where a1, … , aj are each either 0 or 1, then

2. multiply all of these expressions together to obtain s(y1, … , yk).

For example, eliminating x1, x2 from

r(x1, x2, y)  =  0
s(y)  =  0
s(y)  :=  r(0, 0, y) · r(0, 1, y) · r(1, 0, y) · r(1, 1, y).
STEP 6: (DEVELOPMENT, or EXPANSION) [ MAL (pp. 60), LT (pp. 72, 73) ]

Given a term, say r(x1, … , xj, y1, … , yk), one can expand the term with respect to a subset of the class symbols. To expand with respect to x1, … , xj gives

r  =  sum of the terms
r(a1, … , aj, y1, … , yk) · C(a1, x1) · · · C(aj, xj),

where a1, … , aj range over all sequences of 0s and 1s of length j, and where the C(ai, xi) are defined by:

C(1, xi)  :=  xi,  and  C(0, xi)  :=  1− xi.

Boole said the products:

C(a1, x1) · · · C(aj, xj)

were the constituents of x1, … , xj. There are 2j different constituents for j symbols. The regions of a Venn diagram give a popular way to visualize constituents.

STEP 7: (DIVISION: SOLVING FOR A CLASS SYMBOL) [MAL (p. 73), LT (pp. 86, 87)] ]

Given an equation r  =  0, suppose one wants to solve this equation for one of the class symbols, say x, in terms of the other class symbols, say they are y1, … , yk. To solve:

r(x, y1, …, yk)  =  0

for x, first let:

N(y1, … , yk)  =  − r(0, y1, … , yk)

D(y1, … , yk)  =  r(1, y1, … , yk) − r(0, y1, … , yk).


x  =  s(y1,…, yk)

where s(y1,…, yk) is:

(1) the sum of all constituents

C(a1, y1) · · · C(ak, yk),

where a1, … , ak range over all sequences of 0s and 1s for which:

N(a1, … , ak)  =  D(a1, … , ak)  ≠  0,


(2) the sum of all the terms of the form

Va1ak · C(a1, y1) · · · C(ak, yk)

for which:

N(a1, … , ak)  =  D(a1, … , ak)  =  0.

The Va1ak are parameters, denoting arbitrary classes (similar to what one sees in the study of linear differential equations, a subject in which Boole was an expert).

To this equation for x adjoin the side-conditions (that we will call constituent equations)

C(a1, y1) · · · C(ak, yk)  =  0


D(a1, … , ak)  ≠  N(a1, … , ak)  ≠  0.

Note that one is to evaluate the terms:

D(a1, … , ak)   and   N(a1, … , ak)

using ordinary arithmetic. Thus solving an equation r  =  0 for a class symbol x gives an equation

x  =  s(y1,…, yk),

perhaps with side-condition constituent equations.

STEP 8: (INTERPRETATION) [MAL pp. 64–65, LT (Chap. VI, esp. pp. 82–83)]

Suppose the equation r(y1, … , yk)  =  0 has been obtained by Boole's method from a given collection of premiss equations. Then this equation is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations

C(a1, y1) · · · C(ak, yk)  =  0

for which r(a1, … , ak) is not 0. A constituent equation merely asserts that a certain intersection of the original classes and their complements is empty. For example,

y1(1−y2)(1−y3)  =  0

expresses the proposition “All Y1 is Y2 or Y3,” or equivalently, “All Y1 and not Y2 is Y3.” It is routine to convert constituent equations into propositions.

6.3. Boole's General Method for Secondary Propositions

Secondary propositions were Boole's version of the propositions that one encounters in the study of hypothetical syllogisms in Aristotelian logic, statements like “If X or Y then Z.” The symbols X, Y, Z, etc. of secondary propositions did not refer to classes, but rather they referred to (primary) propositions. In keeping with the incomplete nature of the Aristotelian treatment of hypothetical propositions, Boole did not give a precise description of possible forms for his secondary propositions.

The key (but not original) observation that Boole used was simply that one can convert secondary propositions into primary propositions. In MAL he adopted the convention found in Whately (1826), that given a propositional symbol X, the symbol x will denote “the cases in which X is true”, whereas in LT Boole let x denote “the times for which X is true”. With this the secondary proposition “If X or Y then Z” becomes simply “All x or y is z”. The equation x  =  1 is the equational translation of “X is true” (in all cases, or for all times), and x  =  0 says “X is false” (in all cases, or for all times).

With this translation scheme it is clear that Boole's treatment of secondary propositions can be analyzed by the methods he had developed for primary propositions. This was Boole's propositional logic.

Boole worked only with Aristotelian propositions in MAL, using the traditional division into categoricals and hypotheticals. One does not consider “X and Y,” “X or Y,” etc., in categorial propositions, only in hypothetical propositions. In LT this division was replaced by the similar but more general primary versus secondary classification, where the subject and predicate were allowed to become complex names, and the number of propositions in an argument became unrestricted. With this the parallels between the logic of primary propositions and that of secondary propositions became clear, with one notable difference, namely it seems that the secondary propositions always translate into universal primary propositions.

Secondary Propositions MAL (1847) LT (1854)
X is true x  =  1 p. 51 x  =  1 p. 172
X is false x  =  0 " x  =  1 "
X and Y xy  =  1 " xy  =  1 "
X or Y (inclusive) x + yxy  =  1 p. 52
X or Y (exclusive) x −2xy+ y  =  1 p. 53 x(1 − y) + y(1 − x)  =  1 p. 173
If X then Y x(1−y)  =  0 p. 54 x  =  vy p. 173


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