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Ayn Rand

First published Tue Jun 8, 2010

Ayn Rand (1905–1982) was a philosopher and a novelist who outlined a comprehensive philosophy, including an epistemology and a theory of art, in her novels and essays. Early in her career she also wrote short stories, plays (one of which, Night of January 16th, was produced on Broadway (1935) and in Hollywood (1941)), and screenplays (two of which were made into movies in 1945: Love Letters and You Came Along). Rand's first and most autobiographical novel, We the Living (1936), set in the Soviet Union, was published only after many rejections, owing to widespread sympathy for the Soviet “experiment” among the intellectuals of the day. It was made into a movie in two parts (Noi Vivi and Addio, Kira!) in Italy in 1942, banned by Mussolini after a short run because of its anti-totalitarianism, and re-released as We the Living, with English subtitles, to great critical acclaim in the United States in 1986. We the Living was quickly followed by the dystopian novel, Anthem (1938), written as “a kind of rest” from work on her next major novel, The Fountainhead (1943). The Fountainhead, also published after many rejections because of its individualism, and largely panned by critics, soon became a best-seller by word of mouth, and was made into a movie in 1949. The Fountainhead brought Rand international fame, and Atlas Shrugged (1957) sealed this fame. By 1958, Rand's novels, increasingly philosophical, had won her ideas a sufficiently devoted following for her to form, in association with psychologist Nathaniel Branden (with whom she later broke), an official “Objectivist” philosophical movement, complete with journals and lecture courses.

In Rand's own words, her first and greatest love, her “life purpose,” was “the creation of the kind of world … that represents human perfection,” while her interest in philosophical knowledge was “only” for the sake of this purpose (Journal entry for 4 May 1946; in 1997, p. 479).[1] Nevertheless, her interest in philosophical knowledge continued long after she had created this world in her magnum opus, Atlas Shrugged, her last work of fiction. In essays and lectures, Rand developed her conception of metaphysical realism, rationality, ethical egoism (rational self-interest), individual rights, laissez-faire capitalism, and art, and applied her philosophy to social issues. The libertarian political movement, though largely disowned by Rand, drew—and draws—great inspiration from her defense of the minimal state, that is, the state whose only raison d'être is protection of individual rights.

1. Life and Work

Ayn Rand was born Alissa Zinovievna Rosenbaum, to a bourgeois Jewish family in St. Petersburg, Russia, on 2 February 1905; a witness to the Russian Revolution and civil war, Rand opposed both the Communists and the Tsarists. She majored in history, but the social science program in which she was enrolled at Petrograd State University included philosophy, law, and philology. Her teachers emphasized—as she herself later did—the importance of developing systematic connections among different areas of thought (Sciabarra 1995). Rand's formal philosophical education included ancient philosophy (especially Plato and Aristotle), logic, philosophical psychology, Marxism-Leninism, and non-Marxist political thought. But she was evidently also exposed to Hegelian and Nietzschean ideas, which blossomed during this period (known as the Russian Silver Age), and read a great deal of Friedrich Nietzsche on her own. After graduating from Petrograd State University in 1924, an interest in screenwriting led her to enroll in the State Institute for Cinematography. On the literary side, she studied the great Russian novelists and poets, but fell in love with Victor Hugo, to whose influence she owes the “Romantic Realism” of her novels.

In 1925 Rand succeeded in obtaining permission to visit relatives in the United States; hating the Soviet system, she left with no intention of returning. After six months with relatives in Chicago, she made her way to Hollywood where, on her second day, a fortuitous encounter with Cecil B. DeMille led to a job as a script reader, and later as a screenplay writer. The next week she had another fortuitous encounter, this time with the actor Frank O'Connor, whom she married in 1929. She was married to him till his death in 1979. She adopted the pen name Ayn Rand to (it is thought) protect her family back in Russia, although she also told the New York Evening Post in 1936 that “Rand” was an abbreviation of her Russian surname.

Rand and her husband moved permanently to New York City in 1951, where she became involved with, and influenced by, the circle of mostly New-York-based intellectuals involved in the revival of classical liberalism, such as the economic journalist Henry Hazlitt, the Austrian economist Ludwig von Mises, and the Canadian-American novelist, literary critic, and political philosopher Isabel Paterson. Rand also studied, and was a great admirer of, the Lockean philosophy of the American founding. Rand lived and worked in New York City until her death in 1982.

Rand holds that philosophy, like all forms of knowledge and achievement, is important only because it is necessary for living a good human life and creating a world conducive to living such a life. Philosophy supplies the most fundamental cognitive and normative abstractions which, respectively, identify and evaluate what is. Everyone, according to Rand, needs a philosophy and is guided by at least an implicit one (1982a, ch. 1). Her novels express her belief that if our philosophy is more or less correct, our lives will be more or less successful, while if our philosophy is wildly off the mark, our lives will be disastrous. Philosophy thus has an urgent, practical importance. But unlike Marx, her philosophical and political antipode, Rand thinks that social change has to start with a moral revolution within each individual and the spread of the right ideas and ideals through rational discourse and the inspiration of art.

Rand's ideal human being appears, in varying degrees of development, in all her novels; her ideal world appears in Atlas Shrugged. Her novels feature striking, complex plots with subtle psychological explorations of her characters' emotions and thoughts, and philosophical reflections that rarely lose sight of the dramatic context. Like many famous Russian novelists, especially Dostoevsky, whom she recognized as a great psychologist, Rand also uses long speeches to lay out her philosophy, a device that has both its supporters and its detractors. She described Atlas Shrugged as a “stunt novel” and a murder mystery—the murder of the human soul by a collectivist culture. By “soul,” however, she meant not an immortal substance that survives the death of the body—she was not a dualist in any aspect of her philosophy—but the mind, or the human spirit that celebrates life on this earth. The novel shows what happens when “the men of mind”—the “prime movers,” the producers—go on strike. It also shows how the wrong epistemology can lead to train wrecks, how the wrong metaphysics can lead to the wrong ethics and thus to disastrous personal choices and a disastrous political and economic system, and how the right philosophy is needed for the rebirth of the soul and the rebuilding of the world. Her protagonists are not knights on white steeds rescuing damsels in distress, or swordsmen who can fight off a dozen enemies single-handed, but men and women in the mid-century industrial America of steel mills, skyscrapers, and glimmering highways: women who run transcontinental railroads and men who revolutionize architecture or (long before clean energy became a cause célèbre) build a motor powered by static electricity to produce limitless, clean energy. The main reason for her novels' power to inspire, however, is that they bring moral perfection down to earth: her moral exemplars are people of action, passionately in love with life, with colorful and remarkable lives, made more remarkable by their philosophical depth.

She paid tribute to Aristotle, whom she considered the greatest of all philosophers, in the titles she gave to the three Parts of Atlas Shrugged (Non-Contradiction, Either-Or, A is A) and to one of the chapters (The Immovable Movers). While she differed sharply from Nietzsche on many issues, including rationality, free will, and individual rights, his influence is evident in her provocative, often aphoristic, point-counterpoint writing style, as well as in her “transvaluation” of traditional values and her powerful affirmation of life and joy and the spirit of youth. In the Introduction to the 25th Anniversary edition of The Fountainhead, she stated that the novel's sense of life is best conveyed by a quotation from Nietzsche's Beyond Good and Evil: “The noble soul has reverence for itself.” (For The Fountainhead's partly sympathetic and partly critical engagement with Nietzsche's ideas, see Hunt 2008.)

After publishing Atlas Shrugged in 1957 Rand devoted herself to non-fiction—albeit non-fiction liberally peppered with quotations from her heroes' speeches. She wrote polemical, philosophical essays, often in response to questions by fans of Atlas Shrugged and The Fountainhead; lectured on college campuses; and gave radio and television interviews. Her views of past and contemporary Anglo-American philosophy, however, seem to have been based largely on summaries of philosophers' works and conversations with a few philosophers and with her young acolytes, themselves students of philosophy. Unfortunately, this did not stop her from commenting dismissively, and often contemptuously, on other philosophers' works. Contemporary philosophers, by and large, returned the compliment by dismissing her work contemptuously, often on the basis of hearsay or cursory reading. A common source of misunderstanding is Rand's use of “selfishness” to mean rational self-interest rather than “disregard for others' legitimate interests,” and “altruism” to mean abject self-sacrifice for others rather than “other-regard”. In recent years, however, academic appreciation of Rand's work has increased, and many philosophers now recognize it as often original, containing insights that sometimes anticipate later academic work. These insights are usually not defended in the self-critical, detailed style of analytic philosophy, but that very fact makes her writing more accessible to the general reader.

Rand states that her philosophy, “in essence, is the concept of man as a heroic being, with his own happiness as the moral purpose of his life, with productive achievement as his noblest activity, and reason as his only absolute” (Rand 1957, Afterword). Capitalism, “the unknown ideal,” is the only political-economic system compatible with this philosophy because it is the only system based on respect for human beings as ends in themselves.

Fundamental to Rand's outlook—so fundamental that she derives the name of her philosophical system, “Objectivism,” from it—is a trichotomy among three categories: the intrinsic, the subjective, and the objective. (Rand 1990, 52–54; Rand 1965, 13–23) An intrinsic phenomenon is one whose nature depends wholly on factors external to the mind; a subjective phenomenon is one whose nature depends wholly on the mind; and an objective phenomenon is defined, variously, as that which depends on the relation between a living entity's nature (including the nature of its mind) and its environment, or as that which depends on the relation between a properly functioning (rational) mind and extramental reality. Commentators are divided over the best way to interpret Rand's views on this issue.

Rand holds that there is a widespread tendency to ignore the third category or to assimilate it to the second, thus setting up a false dichotomy between the intrinsic and the subjective; on Rand's view, many of the fundamental questions of philosophy, from the existence of universals to the nature of value, involve fruitless debates over the false alternative “intrinsic or subjective?” in cases where the phenomenon in question is neither intrinsic nor subjective, but rather objective.

2. Metaphysics and Epistemology

2.1 General Approach

If ethics is the branch of philosophy concerned with practice, then in a sense all of Rand's philosophy is ethics, for Rand stresses “the supremacy of actual living over all other considerations,” and insists that philosophy needs to be “brought up to the realm of actual living”—adding “I say intentionally brought up to it, not down” (Journal entry for 15 May 1934, p. 72; in Rand 1997, p. 73). Consequently, Rand regularly concerns herself with the practical implications and social relevance not only of moral and political philosophy, but likewise of the seemingly more arcane strata of metaphysics and epistemology—as when she identifies errors in concept-formation as one of the roots of racism, or mind-body dualism as a root of the dichotomy between economic and personal freedom. This approach likewise reflects Rand's emphasis on integrating each piece of information into the total context of one's knowledge, and her consequent hostility to compartmentalization.

Rand's conviction of the vital practical importance of abstract theory may help to explain the passionately polemical nature of her philosophical writing, which some readers find inspiring and others hyperbolic and off-putting—though Rand's admiration for Nietzsche, as well as her having been educated in a Marxist-Leninist atmosphere, may also play a role. Rand also tended—perhaps owing in part to the same two influences—to regard philosophical errors as revelatory of the psychological flaws of their authors.

2.2. Perception

For Rand, all knowledge is derived from perception, and a judgment can be “validated” (Rand's term for establishing an idea's basis in reality) only by tracing it to its foundations at the perceptual level. In this sense Rand counts as a kind of empiricist; but she rejects the traditional rationalist/empiricist dichotomy, taking it to embody a false alternative: conceptually-based knowledge independent of perception (rationalism) versus perceptually-based knowledge independent of concepts (empiricism). For Rand, neither is possible: while the senses provide the raw material of knowledge, conceptual processing is needed to establish knowable propositions. (Whether Rand's characterization of rationalists and empiricists is a fair one lies beyond the scope of this discussion.) Also, unlike many empiricists, Rand regards the deliverances of the special sciences as for the most part irrelevant to philosophy, inasmuch as these sciences depend on philosophical presuppositions which they cannot without circularity be invoked to establish.

For Rand the acquisition of knowledge is a process of differentiation and integration—of discriminating among objects of awareness on the basis of their differences, and then uniting the discriminated phenomena into a cognitively graspable whole. The process begins at the perceptual level (Rand accepts the existence of a pre-perceptual form of consciousness which she calls sensation, but does not assign it much of a role in her theory), when entities are differentiated from their surroundings and integrated as unified wholes.

The primary objects of perception—and the basic building blocks of Rand's ontology as well—are entities. Attributes and actions are secondary; they make sense only as actions and attributes of entities. This does not mean, however, that entities are bare substrata underlying their attributes. There is no such thing as existence other than as some definite thing with a specific identity; identity is the form that existence takes. Hence an entity just is the totality of its attributes.

Rand distinguishes two senses of “entity” (1990a, 268–74). In the narrow sense, an entity is an object whose unity is independent of our consciousness; Rand compares entities in this sense to Aristotelian primary substances (though without endorsing the details of Aristotle's hylomorphism), and regards them as the basic ontological constituents of reality. In the broader sense, an entity is anything we choose to consider apart from its surroundings, even if it has no more unity than what we give it in so considering it—as when we attend either to parts of entities or to groups of entities. Entities in the narrow sense have their entity status metaphysically, and presumably intrinsically, i.e., as explained above, apart from their relationship to our consciousness (though this is a matter of debate in Rand scholarship: Jilk 2003, Bissell 2007). Entities in the broad sense may have their entity status only epistemologically, i.e., only in relation to consciousness. Their status as existents, however, remains metaphysical. That is, they really exist apart from our manner of considering them, even if they do not exist as entities apart from our manner of considering them; thus their entity status at least remains objective, not subjective—belonging to the relation between the mind and extramental reality, and not to the mind alone.

While Rand sometimes refers to the evidence of the senses as “data,” she does not regard the deliverances of the senses as “sense-data” understood as features of our subjective experience; the data of the senses, for her, are genuine extramental entities and their attributes. Our perceptual faculties place us in direct contact with reality; in this sense Rand's theory of perception is a version of direct realism, holding that the objects of perception are extramental entities (rather than, say, subjective experiences on the basis of which we infer entities as their causes).

The validity of sense-perception is not susceptible of proof, because it is presupposed by all proof—since proof just is a matter of adducing sensory evidence. Nor can its validity be denied or questioned, since the very conceptual tools one would have to use to do this are derived from sensory data and so presuppose their validity. Hence perceptual error is not strictly possible, though it is possible to misinterpret perceptual evidence—and phenomena that many would regard as perceptual illusions are instead identified by Rand either as correct perceptions misinterpreted (e.g., optical illusions) or as non-perceptions mistaken for perceptions (e.g., dreams and hallucinations).

The formation of concepts and beliefs upon this sensory basis, by contrast, is a volitional process that is quite definitely capable of being subject to error. Rand accepts sensory data as a basic, unquestionable, pre-conceptual starting-point of all knowledge, and so in that sense embraces a version of the epistemologically “Given.” Rand's “Given,” however, are extramental entities and their attributes, not propositional judgments about them; all propositional judgments are products of the volitional, conceptual level of consciousness and so are potentially fallible.

Rand distinguishes between the content of a perception and its form; when we perceive an object as, e.g., square and red, Rand regards the squareness as an intrinsic feature of the entity being perceived, but the redness, on Rand's view, belongs to the form that our awareness of the object takes, and this perceptual form is determined by the nature of our perceptual organs and their interaction with the environment. (Which features belong to form and which to content Rand regards as a matter for scientific rather than philosophical investigation.) In this sense Rand accepts a version of, or perhaps a successor distinction to, a distinction she rejects in its traditional form, namely that between primary and secondary qualities (Rand 1990a, 279ff.); but she denies any implication that qualities belonging to the form are subjective (Kelley 1986, Peikoff 1993). Attributes that belong to the form rather than the content of our perception are still attributes of the perceived entity—but relational attributes, consisting in the interaction between the entity and the perceiver.

Thus while Rand is a direct realist in the sense explained above, she is not a naive realist in the sense of regarding all perceived attributes as enjoying equal extramental status. It is possible for us to misidentify features of a perception's form as belonging to its content (and presumably vice versa); but Rand does not regard this fact as impugning the reliability of the senses, since the judgment that a particular feature belongs to a perception's content rather than its form is not contributed by the perception itself but is a volitionally, fallibly formed conceptual response to that perception.

Nor is the existence of features belonging to the form rather than the content of perception indicative of any flaw in our perceptual faculties. On the contrary, every process must have some definite nature and occur by some definite means; thus it is inevitable, on Rand's view, that the way objects appear to us should depend on the nature of our perceptual organs. The fact that the form of our knowledge is partly determined by the means by which it is acquired does not invalidate its status as knowledge; to assume otherwise would be, in effect, to conclude that “you can know nothing, because you know it by means of something”—that you are “blind … because you have eyes, and deaf … because you have ears” (1997, p. 655). Nor, again, should the discovery that attributes like color are not intrinsic features of entities be taken to imply their subjectivity; inasmuch as such attributes depend not on consciousness alone but rather on the relationship between consciousness and its objects, they are neither intrinsic nor subjective, but rather objective. (Thus an entity can exist intrinsically even if some of its attributes exist only objectively.)

Rand's identification of certain features of perceived objects as belonging to the form rather than to the content of perception, but as nevertheless being objective, seems strikingly reminiscent of Kant; but Rand regards her position as the antithesis of Kant's, since she, controversially, interprets Kant as denying the veracity of perceptual knowledge. Still, critics have sometimes charged that Rand's position makes a crucial concession to Kantianism. Other charges raised against Rand's epistemology include: making the reliability of perception vacuous (since nothing counts as perception unless it's accurate); assuming a foundationalist approach that conflates the perceptual process by which judgments are formed with the way in which they are to be justified; and leaving it unclear how judgments with propositional structure can be validated by sensory data lacking such structure (Dipert 1987, Long 2000).

2.3. Theory of Concepts

The process of differentiation and integration that begins at the perceptual level continues at the level of concept-formation, as we selectively attend to certain attributes of an entity, discriminate it from entities lacking those attributes, and mentally group it together with entities that share the attributes; this makes it possible to treat entities as units, that is, as members of a group with shared characteristics (Rand 1990a; Kelley 1984; Kelley and Krueger 1984; Peikoff 1993). An entity's status as a unit is not intrinsic, but since it is based on actually existing similarities it is not subjective either, but instead objective. Consequently, Rand rejects as a false dichotomy the debate between realists and nominalists over the nature of universals. (“Realism,” as a theory about universals, is to be distinguished from the kind of perceptual realism that Rand accepts.) Rand identifies universals with concepts, understood as attributes of consciousness, and so repudiates the intrinsicism of the realists; for Rand, the problem of universals belongs to epistemology, not to metaphysics. But because she takes concepts to be objective in her sense, Rand likewise distinguishes her theory from nominalism, which she interprets as a subjectivist approach to universals.

Attributes can also be regarded as units; this makes possible the process of measurement, which involves relating perceptible attribute-units to larger or smaller quantities, including those too large or small to perceive, thus permitting the expansion of our knowledge beyond the perceptual level; measurement is here understood broadly, as covering ordinal as well as cardinal relationships, and thus applies to all concepts, not just narrowly quantitative ones. Concepts expand the range of our knowledge by reducing the number of units with which we must deal.

Rand holds a “measurement-omission” theory of abstraction; that is, she regards concept-formation as a matter of grouping items together on the basis of a commensurable characteristic while omitting the specific measurements (e.g., grouping red objects together while omitting specific shades of red). Such abstraction does not falsify its objects, as in omitting specific measurements we do not specify their absence, we merely fail to specify their presence. The similarities on the basis of which we form our earliest concepts are perceptually identified; more sophisticated concepts involve conceptually identified similarities.

The extramental attributes on the basis of which we form our concepts are presumably intended by Rand to be particulars, not universals (since otherwise she would be a traditional realist). But Rand says little about the metaphysical status of the “similarity” or “sameness” that we identify among such attribute-particulars. Theories of universals traditionally seek to account both for generic identity across specific difference (e.g. how redness applies to two distinct shades of red), and specific identity across numerical difference (e.g. how a specific shade of red applies to two particulars of that shade). Rand's theory of measurement-omission seems primarily intended to address the former issue, and she has little to say about the latter; Rand's insistence that everything in reality is particular has been taken by critics as undermining the possibility of the mind-independent similarities needed to ground the objectivity of concepts (for how can two objects be similar if there's nothing real that they share in common?). But it is possible that Rand would regard similarities as themselves being relational property-particulars or tropes, rather than universals—so that the canine-similarity between Fido and Lassie would be a different particular from the canine-similarity between Lassie and Snoopy.

Abstractions, once formed, are “open-ended,” applying not just to the specific concretes from which they were formed but to all concretes of the same kind. The characteristics on the basis of which items are conceptually grouped should be essential, that is, explanatorily fundamental; but since Rand regards explanation as an epistemological rather than a metaphysical category, essences are objective, not intrinsic. These essential characteristics determine the definition of the concept; however, the meaning of a concept lies not in its definition but in its referents, where membership in the class of referents is determined not by anything like Fregean “sense,” but rather by a prospective member's fundamental similarities (whether as yet known or unknown) to the original concretes on which the concept is based. The test of whether to include a new instance under a concept is ultimately not whether it fits the existing definition but whether it is of the same kind as the instances already established. Definitions are context-relative and can change in response to new discoveries without requiring a change in the concept itself; thus continuity of reference can be preserved across revision in definitions. Hence Rand rejects the analytic-synthetic distinction; that is, she denies any significant difference in metaphysical or modal status, as well as in means of being known,. between those characteristics of a class that are and those that are not mentioned in the definition. Despite various differences, Rand's overall discussion of reference obviously bears intriguing similarities to the realist theories of reference developed by Saul Kripke and Hilary Putnam during the 1970s (though Rand developed her ideas independently, their earliest statement appearing in the 1966–1967 issues of her periodical The Objectivist).

Critics have objected that Rand offers no argument against the possibility that some concepts may have their referents determined by the definition (Browne 2000; Long 2005a, 2005b). Rand describes the meaning of “capitalism,” for example, as “full, pure, uncontrolled, unregulated laissez-faire” (1964a, p. 33). Since Rand does not regard such as a system as ever having existed, it's hard to see how the concept of “capitalism” could have been formed on the basis of its referents (what referents?); if instead Rand's definition of “capitalism” serves as the criterion to determine what would count as a referent, then some statements will be “true by definition” after all, thereby potentially resurrecting the analytic-synthetic distinction.

Concepts (or attempts at concepts) that group their purported referents according to non-essential or inconsistent characteristics, or otherwise embody mistaken presuppositions—such as “extremism,” which implicitly treats any consistent or thoroughgoing conviction as bad, regardless of its content—are invalid and cannot be rationally used; in Rand's view, such “anti-concepts” or “package deals” are frequently employed as an ideological strategy to hinder people's ability to grasp politically inconvenient concepts. (It's worth noting that Rand's novella Anthem (1938), about a collectivist society that deliberately distorts the use of language in order to prevent the development of individualist thinking—replacing all uses of “I” with “we,” for example—predates by over a decade George Orwell's use of a similar idea in Nineteen Eighty-Four.) Judgments that deny their own conceptual presuppositions are likewise invalid; the possibility that all of our experience is a dream, for example, is rejected as what Rand calls a “stolen concept” fallacy, since possession of the concept “dream” presupposes the ability to distinguish dreaming from waking. This is because genuine possession of a concept requires both the ability to derive an abstraction from concretes and the ability to go on to apply it to new concretes; if all our experience were a dream, the concept of waking could neither be derived from nor applied to any concretes. Those who claim to have grasped a concept but are unable to recognize instances of it “have not performed either part of the cycle: neither the abstraction nor the translating of the abstraction into the concrete.” As with an electric circuit, “no part of it can be of any use, until and unless the cycle is completed” (Journal entry for 4 May 1946, in 1997, p. 481).

Thus many people who appear to be operating at the conceptual level may not in fact be fully doing so; Rand appeals to this “anti-conceptual mentality”—the result of laziness or miseducation—to explain the prevalence of thoughtless social conformity, since those who have not mastered higher abstractions are compelled to navigate the social world by imitating the concrete behavior of other people. In other words, for an anti-conceptual mentality a concept like “justice” would simply refer to the concrete practices that people in a given society engage in when they use the term, thereby forestalling the possibility of any critical reflection on the actual justice of those practices (1982a, ch. 4; 1999a, ch. 3).

2.4. Existence, Identity, and Consciousness

Epistemologically, the most important concepts are those Rand identifies as axiomatic concepts. (Axioms themselves are secondary, being propositional expressions of the corresponding concepts, which themselves are non-propositional.) The three axiomatic concepts to which Rand devotes the most attention are existence, identity, and consciousness; these three, she tells us, are implicit in all knowledge, and cannot be rejected without being relied upon in the course of the attempted rejection. Unlike ordinary concepts, they are not susceptible of definition (except ostensively), because there are no more basic concepts in terms of which they could be defined; nor are the axioms that express them susceptible of proof, since they are presupposed by all proof (Rand 1990a, Peikoff 1993).

The concept of existence identifies as basic and unquestionable the fact that something exists; to ask for a cause or explanation of there being something rather than nothing is to misunderstand the place of existence in the hierarchy of concepts. (This is one of Rand's reasons for rejecting the idea of a divine creator as the reason for the universe's existence; though it is a matter of dispute whether this objection works if such a creator is merely supposed to be responsible for the existence of everything other than itself.) Rand's expression of this concept in propositional form, as the axiom that “existence exists,” is intended not as the mere tautological observation that “whatever exists, exists,” but rather as a recognition that something does indeed exist.

The concept of identity identifies the fact that everything that exists is some kind of thing or other—that it has a specific, non-contradictory nature. This concept—which Rand often expresses in propositional form as the Law of Identity, “A is A”—has as a corollary the principle of causality: since everything has a specific nature, a thing can act only in ways consistent with that nature.

Finally, the concept of consciousness identifies the fact that consciousness exists; Rand agrees with the Cartesian view that one cannot coherently deny the existence of one's own consciousness. Unlike Descartes, however, Rand denies the “prior certainty of consciousness,” i.e. the idea that we can be aware of the contents of our own minds without knowing whether any extramental reality corresponds to them; for Rand, there can be no content without an external reality. Rand regards consciousness as inherently relational; to be conscious is to be conscious of something beyond one's own consciousness, and of one's consciousness itself only secondarily.

Existence has primacy over consciousness both epistemologically and metaphysically (with the latter explaining the former): epistemologically, because consciousness has to be aware of a distinct object before it can be aware of itself; metaphysically, because consciousness is a response to its objects and so cannot precede them—thus ruling out metaphysical theories like theism and idealism that, in Rand's view, make existence dependent on consciousness.

From the fact that consciousness—both perceptual and conceptual—is an active and causally complex process, it does not follow that it is creative or distortive with regard to its objects. To suppose otherwise, Rand holds—to demand that consciousness, in order to be in contact with reality, must be purely passive and not involve any sort of processing—is to object to consciousness on the absurd grounds that it has a specific identity and employs specific means, and thus, once again, to regard us as blind because we have eyes and deaf because we have ears.

Our senses, as we've seen, cannot deceive us; and in forming conceptual judgments on the basis of sensory evidence, we can be deceived only if we allow ourselves to fall into inattention or evasion. Hence certainty is always available to us. But while Rand takes knowledge to require certainty, she distinguishes certainty from infallibility or inerrancy: a judgment can be certain, within a given context of available knowledge, even if it needs to be revised in the light of new information. On some interpretations of her view, so long as a contextual qualifier is understood to be implicit in one's judgments at each stage (e.g., “So far as can be determined in the light of present knowledge …”), the revised judgments need not contradict the original ones (Peikoff 1993).

Rand rejects both dogmatism (asserting knowledge or demanding assent in the absence of contextually sufficient evidence) and skepticism (denying knowledge, or demanding the withholding of assent, in the presence of contextually sufficient evidence). Mysticism—in the sense of claims to a non-rational, non-sensory mode of knowledge—is likewise rejected as a form of dogmatism. The application of logic—the “art of non-contradictory identification”—to sensory data should be the sole ultimate determinant of belief.

2.5. Metaphysics of Human Nature

Rand's conception of the role of metaphysics is fairly minimalist; its task is the investigation of the most general features of existence as such—of “being qua being,” in Aristotle's phrase. Hence a great deal of traditionally metaphysical inquiry into the specific characteristics of the universe and its constituents she regards as properly the province of the special sciences rather than philosophy. Moreover, consistent with her conviction that many of the central issues of philosophy turn on phenomena that are properly to be understood as objective rather than intrinsic, she tends to assign a broader role to epistemology than to metaphysics. For Rand, metaphysics tells us that entities have definite natures, epistemology tells us how to investigate those natures, and the special sciences then do the actual investigating.

Nevertheless, Rand does take a stand on a number of metaphysical questions more specific than the priority of existence to consciousness or of entities to attributes. For example, Rand denies the possibility of actualized infinities (as opposed to potential infinities, in the Aristotelian sense of processes that can be continued indefinitely), on the grounds that the axiom of identity requires every magnitude to be of some definite measurable extent. On the other hand, Rand maintains that given the character of existence as basic and unquestionable, it makes no sense to think of reality as a whole coming into or going out of existence; the universe is a fundamental fact that cannot be created or destroyed but has always existed. It's not clear whether Rand holds that the universe is infinitely old (a position that would seem to sit oddly with her denial of actualized infinities—though of course Aristotle held the same combination of views), or only that it was not preceded by a temporal period of nothingness (a potentially distinct claim if one holds, as Rand does, that the passage of time requires change).

But most of Rand's more specific metaphysical theses have to do with the nature of one particular type of entities—human beings. Rand regards human beings, and indeed living organisms generally, as teleologically ordered systems, though her teleology takes a naturalized form that makes no essential reference to purposiveness; her point is simply that organisms depend for their existence on the successful carrying out—conscious or otherwise—of self-maintenance activities, and so are necessarily organized around the goal of furthering their life functions. Rand rejects both substance dualism and reductive materialism, holding that a human being is an integrated unit of mind and body, a unified entity, with mental characteristics neither separable from nor fully explicable in terms of physical ones. (Whether Rand's position is best identified as property dualism, nonreductive physicalism, or neither is unclear.)

Consciousness is not epiphenomenal, but rather is causally efficacious—or, perhaps more precisely, human beings are causally efficacious in virtue, inter alia, of possessing consciousness; we know this on the basis of direct experience. Moreover, while perception is automatic, at the conceptual level the operation of consciousness is free from causal necessitation. The reality of incompatibilist free will is axiomatic, since the conceptual tools needed to question its reality presuppose our volitional command over our thought-processes, and in particular, our ability to raise or lower our level of mental alertness—inasmuch as our ability to judge whether we are reasoning correctly presupposes that our thinking is not directed by factors beyond our knowledge and control (Branden 1971).[2]

Free choices are not uncaused, since for Rand actions (in general, not just human actions) are caused not by prior events but by the natures of the entities involved. There is even a sense in which free choices are necessitated—namely, it is necessary that human beings, given their nature as conscious rational beings, make free choices, though it is not necessary that they choose this rather than that.

Beyond the realm of human choice, however, Rand regards all facts and events as necessary and “metaphysically given.” Rand seems to consider this position a corollary of the primacy of existence, though it is unclear, given Rand's exception for human choice, why there could not also be entities whose nature was such as to behave probabilistically, as postulated by many interpretations of quantum physics. (By contrast, the distinct view that a quantum particle's present state is merely probabilistic clashes much more obviously with the primacy of existence.)

3. Ethics

3.1 What is Ethics, and Why Do We Need It?

Ethics “is a code of values to guide man's choices and actions—the choices and actions that determine the purpose and the course of his life” (1961b, p. 13). Before we can decide which code of values we should accept, we need to ask why we need a code of values at all. Rand claims that no philosopher before her has provided a scientific answer to this question, and so none has provided a satisfactory ethics.

Rand starts by describing value or “the good,” in classical fashion, as the object of pursuit: “that which one acts to gain and/or keep” (ibid., p. 16). Thus, the concept of value presupposes the concept of “an entity capable of acting to achieve a goal in the face of an alternative” - and the basic alternative facing any living entity is life or death (p.16). It is the conditional nature of life that gives rise to values, not just human values, but values as such. As she puts it: “Metaphysically, life is the only phenomenon that is an end in itself: a value gained and kept by a constant process of action” (p. 18). Survival is the organism's ultimate value, the “final goal or end to which all [its] lesser goals are the means,” and the standard of all its other values: “that which furthers its life is the good, that which threatens it is the evil” (pp. 16–17). The same, suitably modified, applies to human beings. Life is the standard and goal of all genuine human values, in the sense that all of them - from food to philosophy to fine art to ethics—must be explained and justified as requirements of human survival. “Ethics is an objective, metaphysical necessity of man's survival” (p. 24). Thus, “[t]he standard of value of the Objectivist ethics … is man's life, or: that which is required for man's survival qua man” (p. 25), that is, “the terms, methods, conditions and goals required for the survival of a rational being through the whole of his lifespan—in all those aspects of existence which are open to his choice” (p. 27). To choose to live is to accept one's “own life” as one's “ethical purpose.”

Rand's metaphysical arguments make two points central to her axiology and ethics. (1) Values are not just a human phenomenon but a phenomenon of life: life necessitates value. Thus, values are neither intrinsic properties of things, nor subjective, neither free-floating Platonic entities, nor mere matters of desire or preference, culture or time. Rather, values are relational or objective, following from the nature and existence-needs of the valuing entity. (2) An entity's values are determined by its objective life-needs, the requirements of survival for entities of its kind, and ethics is a requirement of human survival.

Rand seeks to bolster this claim by arguing that the concept of value entails the concept of life: “epistemologically, the concept of ‘value’ is genetically dependent upon and derived from the antecedent concept of ‘life’” (1961b, p. 18). She supports it by asking us “to imagine an immortal, indestructible robot, an entity which moves and acts, but which cannot be affected by anything, which cannot be changed in any respect, which cannot be damaged, injured or destroyed” (p. 16). Such an entity, she concludes, cannot have values.

Critics raise two objections to this argument. (i) It begs the question by assuming what is at issue, namely, that a non-living entity cannot be harmed (Nozick 1971, 1997). Unlike the robot of this example, real robots can be damaged or destroyed, not only by external events, but also by a failure to perform their functions well, that is, by their own actions or inactions. Hence they can, quite straightforwardly, be said to have values. [3] (ii) Even if one were to accept that the concept of value entails the concept of life, one could consistently regard one's survival as a means to a certain kind of life: a life of dedication to the greater glory of God, the common good, the environment, and so on (Mack 1984).

Rand's naturalism, and her rejection of intrinsicism and subjectivism in favor of objectivism, anticipate recent naturalisms and echo Aristotle's argument, against both the Platonist and the subjectivist, that “the good” must always be good-for-something. Her conception of the function of morality is notable both for its affinity to, and its difference from, Thomas Hobbes' conception: like Hobbes, Rand sees morality as a necessary means to long-term survival, but unlike Hobbes, she does not see morality as requiring a contract or even as a fundamentally social affair. The need for morality, according to Rand, is dictated by our nature as creatures that must think and produce to survive; hence we would need morality even on a desert island. There is, however, no duty to survive; morality is based on a hypothetical imperative: if you choose to live, then you must value your own long-term survival as an ultimate end, and morality as a necessary means to it. (The much-debated question of whether the choice to live is a moral choice (Mack 1984, 2003, Long 2000, Rasmussen 2002) or a pre-moral one (Peikoff 1993, Gotthelf 1999, Smith 2000, 2006), and the implications of either position for the objectivity of Rand's Objectivist ethics must, unfortunately, be left undiscussed.) If asked why the choice to live commits you to your own long-term survival rather than some other ultimate end (such as, for example, the greatest happiness of the greatest number (Nozick 1971, 1997), or becoming worthy of eternal life in heaven), the answer is: because any other ultimate end, if consistently adhered to, would lead to death.

Rand's ethics is thus firmly teleological, this-worldly, and foundationalist. Virtue is “the act by which one gains/and or keeps” values in light of a recognition of certain facts (1961b, pp. 27, 28); it “is not an end in itself … not its own reward” (1957, p. 939). A fact central to a “scientific” ethics is that reason is the chief indispensable human tool of survival, and we exercise reason by choice. Hence rationality is the fundamental moral virtue, a virtue implicated in all the other virtues, including productiveness (Section 3.4 below).

Rand is widely credited by Objectivists (Peikoff 1993, Binswanger 1990, 1992, Kelley & Thomas 1999 (Other Internet Resources); Gotthelf 2000; Smith 2000, 2006) with having solved the is-ought problem by showing that the requirements of long-term survival as a rational being determine the content of morality, and so anyone who chooses to live ought to be moral (1961b, p. 19). But how exactly is survival as a rational being—the life “proper to a rational being” (p. 27)—related to literal survival? Is it a necessary means to survival? Or is it part of one's ultimate goal, something to be created and preserved for its own sake? Again, what are we to make of the many passages in which Rand states that the ultimate goal is one's own happiness?

F Rand herself thought that she had only one, consistent metaethical view: the ultimate goal is the individual's own survival; the only way to survive long-term, i.e., over a complete life-span, is to live by the standard of man's life as a rational being, which means: to live morally; and happiness is the psychological “result, reward and concomitant” (p. 32) of living thus. Many of Rand's commentators follow her in holding that there is only one consistent view, while disagreeing on the right interpretation of it (Den Uyl & Rasmussen 1978, 1983, 1984b; Machan 1984, 2000; Peikoff 1993; Bidinotto 1994 (Other Internet Resources); Hunt 1999; Kelley & Thomas 1999 (Other Internet Resources); Gotthelf 2000; Smith 2000, 2006). Others (Mack 1984; Badhwar 1999, 2001; Long 2000) argue that Rand's writings actually allow of three, or at least two, mutually incompatible views of the ultimate goal, and our task is to see which of these is the dominant or most plausible view. The three views are: survival, survival qua rational being, and happiness (or flourishing or eudaimonia). In the rest of Section 3, we will present the textual evidence for each of these views of the final goal, and the common objections to them, in turn.

3.2 Survival as the Ultimate Value

The survivalist view holds that just as literal survival is the ultimate value for other living entities, so it is for human beings (Kelley & Thomas 1999 (Other Internet Resources); Gotthelf 2000; Smith 2000). Survival is the source and final goal of all the actions of an entity, that which gives point to all its other values. For human beings, happiness, intellectual and artistic pursuits and rationality/morality are all means to survival. The vicious can “achieve their goals [only] for the range of a moment,” as evidenced by “any criminal or any dictatorship” (1961b, p. 26). Even those whose vice consists of imitating others rather than looting them live a precarious existence because they are likely to follow any destroyer who promises to be their savior (p. 25).

“Non-survivalists” make the following objections:

  1. The biological premise that survival is the ultimate goal of all living things is mistaken. Animals of many species risk their own death for the sake of reproduction, or for protecting their young or even their group. But even if survival were the ultimate goal of other species, it need not be ours.
  2. Even if our own survival needs were the source of all our values, it would not follow that survival must be the ultimate psychological and moral goal to which all our other values are merely necessary means. The genesis of x does not logically determine the ultimate goal of x.
  3. The survivalist view that turns happiness into a mere means to survival entails, quite implausibly, that a long, unhappy life is better than a somewhat shorter but happy life, and just as good as a long and happy one.
  4. Many dictators, including the Pharaohs of the past and the Stalins and Maos of the 20th century, have survived by making elaborate plans to preserve their lives and their power by using a combination of terror, myth, and bribery. So have many common criminals. So even if morality enhances our chances of survival, it cannot be necessary for survival.
  5. Under some circumstances, such as in a dictatorial system, acting morally decreases our chances of survival, a point that Rand herself convincingly dramatizes in We the Living and Anthem.
  6. Rand is right to point out (as Hobbes did) that if everyone or most people were to start preying on each other, then no one would survive for long—literally, and that generations of predators would end up destroying or driving away the producers, and thus destroying “themselves” (Anthem and Atlas Shrugged). But survivalism rests on an illicit move from what the generic “man” (alone in the world) must do to survive to what particular men (in a society of producers) need to do.
  7. A survivalist ethics can support, at best, a bare-bones Hobbesian morality, not a virtue ethics. If Rand's virtues were necessary for survival, the human species would have perished a long time ago, instead of expanding exponentially. Her rich and challenging picture of human life and virtue in her novels points to a richer and more challenging conception of the final end than mere survival.
  8. Many of Rand's heroes, from Kira (We the Living) to Prometheus (Anthem) to John Galt (Atlas Shrugged), risk their lives for the sake of the values that make their lives worth living.
  9. Rand herself sometimes acknowledges that evil people can survive by free-riding (“hitch-hiking,” in her colorful language) on rational, productive people: “If some men attempt to survive by means of brute force or fraud … it still remains true that their survival is made possible only by their victims, only by the men who choose to think and to produce the goods which they, the looters, are seizing” (1961b, p. 25).
  10. Rand often says that the final end is survival proper to a human being (1961b, p. 26), or that the final end is happiness (1961b, pp. 27, 30). Neither can be reduced to survival.

3.3 Survival Qua Man as the Ultimate Value

Just as the standard of value is survival qua human being, so the ultimate goal is one's own survival qua human being. To accept this standard and goal is to accept (i) the three cardinal values of reason, purpose (or purposiveness) and self-esteem as not only “the means to” but also “the realization of one's ultimate value, one's own life” (1961b, p. 27), and (ii) the three “corresponding virtues” of rationality, productiveness, and pride. These values are means to one's life insofar as they further one's life as a rational being, and they realize it insofar as they express the value we place on our lives.

What it means to value survival qua man turns on the relationship of the three cardinal values to the three virtues. Rand often states that virtue is only a means to value. But when she explains how the three cardinal values “correspond” to their three virtues, she does not provide a means-end analysis (Badhwar 1999, 2001). Thus, she says: “Productive work is the central purpose of a rational man's life, the central value that integrates and determines the hierarchy of all his other values. Reason is the source, the precondition of his productive work—pride is the result.” The virtue of productiveness becomes the central example of purpose (one of the three cardinal values), reason (another cardinal value) becomes its source, and the virtue of pride becomes its result. Rand also defines rationality, which is “the basic virtue,” in terms of “the recognition and acceptance of reason as one's only source of knowledge … and one's only guide to action” (p. 28). By this definition, being rational means valuing reason in thought, word, and deed, and realizing reason in one's life means being rational: the virtue and the value entail each other.

This point generalizes to all the virtues and values. Further, since the (cardinal) values are both “the means to” and “the realization of one's ultimate value” (p. 27), it follows that the (cardinal) virtues are also both the means to and the realization of one's ultimate value: long-term survival qua human being. On this interpretation, to survive qua human being is none other than to lead a virtuous life in which one has realized one's potential.

Both survivalists and eudaimonists, however, point out that this conception of the final end contradicts Rand's oft-repeated claim that “Virtue is not an end in itself.…” In addition, eudaimonists make the following objections:

  1. Since even a long, virtuous life need not be a happy one, positing it as the final end contradicts Rand's related claim that “Life is the reward of virtue - and happiness is the goal and reward of life” (1957, p. 939).
  2. It contradicts Rand's conception of the final end in her novels, where happiness is proclaimed as “the purpose, the sanction and the meaning of life” (1957, p. 674).

Eudaimonists hold that the dominant and/or more plausible view expressed in Rand's writings is that happiness is the ultimate value, where happiness is understood as a state that necessarily involves virtue, but is not identical with virtue (Den Uyl & Rasmussen 1978, 1984b; Machan 1984, 2000; Mack 1984; Badhwar 1999, 2001; Hunt 1999; Long 2000).

3.4. Happiness as the Ultimate Value

Happiness is the existentially and psychologically “successful state of life” (1961b, p. 27). As an emotion it is not simply a positive subjective state, as on some contemporary views, but an emotion that meets certain normative standards: “a state of non-contradictory joy—a joy without penalty or guilt,” achievable only by “the man who desires nothing but rational goals, seeks nothing but rational values and finds his joy in nothing but rational actions” (p. 32). Happiness is also a form of life-affirmation: “the feeling of one's blessing upon the whole of the earth, the feeling of being in love with the fact that one exists and in this kind of world” (1957, pp. 105–6). Thus, happiness is an objectively worthwhile and emotionally positive state of life.

Rand holds that the pursuit of happiness is inseparable from the activity of maintaining one's life through the rational pursuit of rational goals (1961b, pp. 29, 32). A virtuous life is, thus, essential to happiness. It is also a shield against soul-wracking unhappiness. Just as even great misfortunes don't throw Aristotle's virtuous individual into misery, they don't throw Rand's heroes into misery. Even at the worst of times, the virtuous individual's pain “only goes down to a certain point” (1943, p. 344), never touching the core of her being: the self-esteem that consists of the conviction that she is worthy and capable of happiness.[4]

In keeping with their richer conception of the final end, Rand's novels also employ a richer conception of virtue as an integrated intellectual-emotional character trait to think, feel, and act in certain ways, rather than simply as an act in light of a recognition of certain facts (Badhwar 1999, 2001). Her characters reveal their souls not only in what they say or do, notice or fail to notice, focus on or evade, but in their cognitive, emotional, and action dispositions, their style of being in the world. Their actions show not only an intellectual commitment to the right but a wholehearted “love of rectitude” (1957, p. 512).

This basically Aristotelian view of virtue goes hand-in-hand with a basically Aristotelian view of emotions. Rand rejects the reason-emotion dichotomy as, ultimately, stemming from a false mind-body dichotomy. Emotions are neither raw feelings nor inherently irrational but automatized value-judgments: “estimates of that which furthers man's values or threatens them … lightning calculators giving him the sum of his profit or loss” (1961b, p. 27). Emotions provide instant guidance when circumstances do not permit reasoning everything out anew. But our emotions are only as good as our reason, because they are “programmed” by our reason. Hence they can only be corrected by conscious reasoning, and in a conflict between reason and emotions, one must always side with the former.[5]

Eudaimonists argue that Rand's vision of a virtuous and happy life in her novels can be understood only as a form of eudaimonism, even if she often makes statements inconsistent with this vision. But eudaimonism faces the following objections:

  1. In defining happiness partly in terms of virtue, eudaimonism employs an unconvincing conception of happiness.
  2. Given its conception of happiness, eudaimonism cannot, without circularity, regard happiness as the standard of virtue, but neither does it have any other standard on offer.
  3. In addition, a naturalistic eudaimonism must show a connection between our survival needs and our values and virtues.

3.5 Virtues, Vices, and Egoism

The chief Objectivist virtues are rationality, integrity, honesty (with self and others), justice, independence, productiveness, and pride. Rationality, “one's total commitment … to the maintenance of a full mental focus in all issues, in all choices … to the fullest perception of reality within one's power” (1961b, p. 28), is the basic virtue of which the other virtues are aspects or derivatives. The virtues are thus united or reciprocal. Each virtue is defined partly in terms of a recognition and whole-hearted commitment to some fact or facts, a commitment understood by the agent to be indispensable for gaining, maintaining, or expressing her ultimate value. For example, integrity is “the recognition of the fact that you cannot fake your consciousness” (1957, p. 936), a recognition that is expressed in loyalty to one's rational values and convictions, especially in the face of social pressures to surrender them (1961b, p. 28; 1964a, pp. 52, 80); honesty is “the recognition of the fact that you cannot fake existence,” a recognition that is expressed in truthfulness in thought and speech (1957, pp. 936–37); and justice is “the recognition of the fact that you cannot fake the character of men as you cannot fake the character of nature, … that every man must be judged for what he is and treated accordingly…” (1957, p. 937).

Conspicuous by their absence from Rand's list of virtues are the “virtues of benevolence”, such as kindness, charity, generosity, and forgiveness. Rand states that charity is not a major virtue or moral duty (1964b); likewise, presumably, kindness, generosity, and forgiveness. Whether, and how much, one should help others depends on their place in one's rationally defined hierarchy of values, and on the particular circumstances (whether they are worthy of help, what the likely consequences are of helping them, and so on). The greater their value vis-à-vis one's rational self-interest, the greater the help that one should be willing to give, ceteris paribus. What is never morally appropriate is making sacrifices, that is, surrendering something of value to oneself for the sake of something of less or no value to oneself. Thus, it can never be moral to knowingly risk one's life for a stranger (unless, of course, one's life is no longer worth living) or to court unhappiness for the happiness of another, whether stranger or friend.

One might ask why charity etc. are not just as major virtues when they do meet all the conditions of appropriateness: the recipient is worthy of help, one can afford to help, it is in one's rational self-interest (or not contrary to it) to help, and so on. Perhaps Rand thinks that they are “minor” virtues because all the conditions for exercising them are only sometimes met. But Rand's view of the unity of the virtues seems to dictate that, even if we do not need to act on these virtues at all times, they are just as important to possess as the other virtues. A deeper reason for her relegation of kindness etc. to the status of minor virtues, however, might be her conception of people as essentially agents rather than patients, doers rather than receivers, self-sufficient rather than dependent. Yet, in keeping with her emphasis on the importance of goodwill towards others and “the benevolent universe premise,” Rand's heroes are often extraordinarily (and almost always appropriately) kind and generous, not only to those they love but also to mere acquaintances, and even sometimes adversaries (Badhwar 1993 in Other Internet Resources). Striking examples include Howard Roark's unsought-for attempt to give hope and courage to Steven Mallory, the gifted young sculptor whose failure to get work has driven him to the verge of a spiritual and physical collapse; Roark's unreproachful help to his erstwhile adversary, Peter Keating, when Keating falls on hard times; Dagny's support to a heart-broken and despairing Cheryl Taggart who, in the past, has treated Dagny with scorn; and Hank Rearden's generosity towards his exploitative family before he realizes their exploitativeness. By contrast, Rand's villains lack genuine goodwill towards others and, thus, lack true kindness or generosity.[6]

Just as rationality, a focus on reality, is at the heart of every virtue, so irrationality, evasion of reality (including self-deception), is at the heart of every vice. Rand's villains are all master evaders motivated by a desire for power, social status, fame, or unearned wealth, and resentment of the good. They are “second-handers”—people whose primary relationship is to other people rather than to reality. Between the virtuous and the vicious are the “innocently wrong,” people who adopt wrong moral principles or make wrong choices, not through evasion but through an error of judgment (Rand does not explicitly recognize any moral category other than virtue, vice, and moral error, although her novels portray characters that do not easily fit into any of these categories). Hank Rearden, in Atlas Shrugged, is the great innocent living under a burden of unearned guilt because of his mistaken sense of honor and his charity towards a family interested only in manipulating and using him. Cheryl Taggart is killed by the too-sudden revelation that the man she loved and admired as the embodiment of her ideals is a fraud—and that the world is full of such frauds.

As already indicated, Rand justifies virtue in both instrumental and non-instrumental terms, though without distinguishing between them. The instrumental arguments show the existential and psychological rewards of virtue and costs of vice. Like Plato and Aristotle, Rand argues that virtue creates a sense of inner harmony and certitude and enables mutually beneficial interactions with others. Evasiveness, by contrast, traps one in a “tangled web” of rationalizations and pretenses. The evader who deceives others is either eventually caught, or lives in fear of being caught, becoming dependent on others' unconsciousness. He is “a fool,” says a character in Atlas Shrugged, “whose source of values is the fools he succeeds in fooling” (1957, p. 945). There is also a psychological reason why evasiveness is contrary to the evader's self-interest: Rand holds, like Sartre, that no evasion is completely successful, because the truth constantly threatens to resurface. Hence, the evader's “diseased soul” is in a state of constant inner conflict and anxiety as he tries to suppress his awareness of uncomfortable truths while maintaining his hold on others. His lack of integrity and of esteem for reality results in a lack of self-love or self-esteem and, indeed, of a solid self. (It is noteworthy, however, that her portrayal of Gail Wynand in The Fountainhead is closer to Aristotle's portrayal of the vicious man in Book III of the Nicomachean Ethics as someone who is “unconscious of his vice,” than to her own stated view of the evader.)

These views are familiar from the history of philosophy, but many readers find their expression in Rand's novels to be of unusual psychological depth, subtlety, and conviction. Nevertheless, the views are subject to the well-known objection that the complexity and variability of human psychology and society allow only “for the most part” generalizations about the benefits of virtue or the costs of vice. Thus, it is possible for a small injustice to lead to great rewards, especially since others are willing to shrug off or forgive occasional transgressions. It is also possible for poor introspection, forgetfulness, or self-acceptance to allow one to evade something without any need for supporting evasions or damage to one's self-esteem. Again, even if every wrongdoing carries psychological costs, they might sometimes be outweighed by the long-term costs of doing the right thing (as Rand herself suggests in her portrayal of the embittered Henry Cameron and Stephen Mallory in The Fountainhead).

The non-instrumentalist justification of virtue in Rand's novels is largely immune to these objections (though subject to the objections noted in 3.4 above). To compromise morally is, necessarily, to compromise one's own happiness, because no existential loss can compare to the loss of moral integrity. Rectitude is partly constitutive of genuine happiness because it expresses the right relationship to reality: to existence, to oneself, and to others. For the same reason, it is partly constitutive of a self worth loving, an ideally human or rational self. Any value gained at the price of rectitude is only the simulacrum of genuine value. In a variety of conceptually interconnected ways, then, virtuous individuals are necessarily better off than those willing to take moral short-cuts. In its structure and much of its content, Rand's ethical egoism is thus of a piece with the egoism of ancient eudaimonistic theories.

An objection often levied against egoistic theories is that they give the wrong reason for acting in other-regarding ways: justly, kindly, etc. My act is not really just if I give you your due because it is good for me rather than because you deserve it; it is not really charitable if I help you for my own benefit rather than yours. A common reply is that the egoist's justification is egoistic but not her motivation, a reply that itself invites the charge of moral “schizophrenia”. Rand does not explicitly address the “wrong-reason” objection, but the non-instrumentalist strand in her theory implies that the objection itself is mistaken, because giving you what you deserve/merit is partly constitutive of my rational interests; there is no conflict between your rational interests and mine (cf. 1964a, pp. 57–65).

3.6 Altruism

Rand regards goodwill towards others, or a generalized benevolence, as an offshoot of proper self-love, with no independent source in human nature. There is only one alternative to being rationally self-interested: sacrificing one's proper interests for the sake of other people (altruism) or of the supernatural (mysticism) (1982a, ch. 7). Kant's ethics is a secularized mysticism insofar as it rests on categorical commands and duty for duty's sake, which is to say: regardless of any earthly desire or interest (1970). The altruistic ethics equates right action with self-sacrifice for the sake of others' good and immorality with “selfishness,” while saying nothing about the standard of the good (“Introduction,” 1964a, iii; 1974). It thus fails to answer the prior question of what code of values we should follow and why, and provides no motivation to be moral other than guilt over “selfishness”. When taken to its logical conclusion, altruism does not simply tell us that it is “selfish” to pursue our own desires, but also that it is “selfish to uphold… [our own] convictions, … [that we] must sacrifice them to the convictions of others” (Rand 1957, 943; Galt's Speech, Rand 1961a, 142).

As a moral code, altruism is impractical, because its requirements are contrary to the requirements of life and happiness, both the agent's and other people's. As such, it is also profoundly immoral. Like Kant's deontology, altruism leave us without any moral guidance in our everyday lives and gives morality a bad name.

What, then, is the psychological explanation for the widespread equation of altruism with morality? Rand suggests various explanations reminiscent of Nietzsche's analysis of the psychology of altruism. The theorists and preachers of altruism are motivated largely by a desire to control and manipulate others by playing on their guilt. Those who accept their teachings typically do so either because of guilt over their own superior achievements, or because, lacking any “intellectual integrity, love of truth…or a passionate dedication to an idea,” they have nothing much worth saving, and so do not mind sacrificing it (“Selfishness Without a Self,” 1973b; 1982a). Some altruists are altruists because their mentalities are still frozen in a tribal past when survival required the sacrifice of some for the sake of others (1973b).

4. Social-Political Philosophy

4.1 Rights, Capitalism, and the Trader Principle

Rand's moral society is a society of independent individuals who respect each other's natural rights to life, liberty, and property, and who trade value for value, materially and spiritually. They live, in her words, by “the trader principle”. Individual (natural) rights and the trader principle are both dictated by the fact that, as rational, independent beings, we need to think and act for our “proper survival” (1961b, p. 31). Both are required by respect for individuals as ends in themselves, not mere means to others' ends.

The concept of rights, says Rand, “provides a logical transition from the principles guiding an individual's actions to the principles guiding his relationship with others… Individual rights are the means of subordinating society to moral law” (1963b, p. 108). These natural rights are basically rights to action, not to things or outcomes, and can be violated only through the initiation of force or fraud. Hence, all natural rights are negative, that is, claims on others' non-interference, and not claims on them to provide one with certain goods or outcomes.[7] The fundamental right is the right to life: the right to take the actions necessary for sustaining the life proper to a human being. All other rights follow from this right. Thus, the right to liberty is the right to act (including to write and speak) on one's judgment; the right to the pursuit of happiness is the right to pursue goals for one's own fulfillment; the right to property is “the right to gain, to keep, to use and to dispose of material values” (1963b, p.94). Like the mind-body dichotomy, the common dichotomy between “human rights” and the right to property is a false one, because to own one's life is to own one's actions and their fruits (1962b, p. 91).[8] As there is a causal and logical connection between the virtues, so there is between rights: a government that violates one right violates others. Thus, for example, in violating the right to freedom of expression by banning “obscene” speech on TV, the government violates the property right of the owners of the TV station to use their property as they see fit.

Rand argues that the only just social-political system, the only system compatible with our rational nature, is capitalism (1965, 1967), that is, “laissez-faire capitalism — with a separation of state and economics, in the same way and for the same reasons as the separation of state and church” (1961b, 1964a). Her conception of capitalism is, thus, more radical than the mainstream conception, and her defense of it significantly different both from the utilitarian defenses given by most economists, and the religious defenses given by many conservatives (Den Uyl & Rasmussen 1984c; Machan 1984); at the same time, some critics have questioned whether Rand is too quick to associate the features of actually-existing big business with the virtues of capitalism as she defines it (Rothbard 1968; Johnson 2006 (Other Internet Resources)).

Rand holds that there is no conflict between one person's rational interests and another's, hence that respecting other people's rights is perfectly compatible with advancing or preserving one's own interests. Critics, however, object that if my ultimate value, whether this be my survival or my happiness, is related to respect for rights as goal to means, then this last claim is simply false (Mack 1984; Flew 1984 ). For under perfectly realistic scenarios, my ultimate value can require me to violate your right to life or property. The most that Rand can show, on an instrumentalist justification of respect for rights, is that there is no conflict between rights, not that there is no conflict between rational interests. In her justification of rights we see the same unresolved tension between the instrumentalist strand and the deontic strand as we do in her justification of morality in general (Mack 1984).

Rand defines government as “an institution that holds the exclusive power to enforce certain rules of social conduct in a given geographical area” (1963a, p. 125). A proper government is “the means of placing the retaliatory use of physical force under objective control—i.e., under objectively defined law” (1963b, p. 128). Such a government is minimal, limited to protecting us from criminals and foreign aggressors, and enforcing individual rights and contracts, with the help of the armed forces, police, and objectively defined civil and criminal laws and courts. Accordingly, the government may use force only in retaliation. A government that tries to enforce the brother's keeper principle—“from each according to his ability, to each according to his need”; or that drafts citizens into the armed services or “public service”; or that tries to make them more virtuous, educated, well-mannered, healthy, or wealthy, violates rights. Statism in all its forms, from unlimited democracy to a mixed economy to dictatorship, is at odds with our status as independent, rational beings, as ends in ourselves. Statism also destroys ability and fails to fulfill anyone's needs for long, because “[t]o deal with men by force is as impractical as to deal with nature by persuasion” (1973a, p. 32). The fountainhead of all progress is the human mind, and the mind does not function well when forced.

In Atlas Shrugged Rand depicts her utopia, Galt's Gulch, as an anarchist society: a “voluntary association of men held together by nothing but every man's self-interest,” without any formal organization (1957, p. 690). There is a judge to arbitrate disagreements, but there has never been any need for arbitration. In “The Nature of Government,” however, Rand rejects anarchism as irrational and unworkable because, she says, it is incompatible with a single, objective system of law and, thus, with rights and peaceful cooperation (1963a). Anarchist critics, such as Roy Childs (1969) and Murray Rothbard (1978), have questioned whether a territorial monopoly (a government), as opposed to, e.g., a competitive market of security providers, is necessary to provide an effective legal system (cf. Long and Machan 2009).

The trader principle states that a voluntary, mutually beneficial exchange between independent equals is the only basis for a mutually respectful and rational relationship (1961b, p. 31). It is also the only basis for a peaceful relationship among countries: “the trader and the warrior have been fundamental antagonists throughout history” (1966a, p. 38).

The trader principle applies to emotional relationships as well. To love or admire someone is to “pay” him for the pleasure one derives from his virtues (1961b, p. 31)—or, Rand might say in the case of love for a small child, from his personality. It would seem, however, that the trade between parent and child is unequal, given that the child receives both pleasure and material support from the parent. And it is unclear how the trader principle applies at all when a severe disability renders a child or beloved spouse a source of pain rather than pleasure.

4.2 Feminism

If feminism is the view that women are, and ought to be recognized as, men's intellectual, moral, sexual, and political equals, then the Objectivist philosophy of human nature is inherently feminist, since it applies equally to all human beings, regardless of gender (or race) (N. Branden 1999). Decades before it was considered acceptable for women to lack “maternal instincts” or pursue careers, Rand created heroines who lack the first and pursue the second, free of guilt or self-doubt.[9] Kira (We the Living) wants to be an engineer, and Dagny (Atlas Shrugged) runs Taggart Transcontinental, the largest and most successful transcontinental railroad in the country. None of Rand's heroines sacrifices her interests, intellect, or principles for the man or men in her life. One literary critic argues that Dagny is the first, and perhaps only, epic heroine in Western literature because of the grandness of her vision, her courage and integrity, her unusual abilities, and her national importance (Michalson 1999). Rand's depiction of her heroines' enjoyment of sex and their freedom from all merely conventional norms about sex anticipates the sexual liberation movement of the 20th century by at least 30 years. In all three novels, it is the heroine who has the power to choose which of the men who love, admire, and desire her (and only her) she will have. Rand was also an ardent champion of a woman's right to control her own reproductive choices (1968a, 1981).

Her relationship to the feminist movement, however, was more complex. Although she praised Betty Friedan's The Feminine Mystique, mainstream feminism's collectivism and emphasis on women as victims later led her to reject feminism as such. Many theorists argue that Rand's work, especially Atlas Shrugged, upholds important feminist ideals, even as it succumbs to some anti-feminist tendencies that contradict her individualistic ethics (e.g., Gladstein 1978, 1999; B. Branden 1999; Presley 1999; Sheaffer 1999; Taylor 1999). Many others regard her and her work as plainly anti-feminist, with Susan Brownmiller even calling her “a traitor to her own sex” (Brownmiller 1975, 1999). One criticism takes aim at the individualism of Rand's ethics and politics, which rejects any special government help for women or discrimination against men (e.g., Harrison 1978, 1999). Another objects that Rand has internalized a masculine conception of human nature and virtue, and then created her ideal woman in light of this conception (Brownmiller 1975, 1999; Glennon 1979). This may be responsible for Rand's puzzling (and offensive) view that the essence of femininity is to hero-worship (not men, but) masculinity, while insisting (as her novels show) that women and men are inherently equal and that the ideal romantic relationship is between moral and intellectual equals (1968b; cf. Brown 1999). At least as offensive to many are the violent sex scenes in her novels, especially the infamous “rape” scene in The Fountainhead, where Howard Roark “takes” Dominique in spite of her resistance.

Those who reject the charge of rape, however, argue that in the 1940s and 50s, when Rand wrote her novels, it was widely believed that the mere fact that a woman puts up a fight doesn't necessarily mean that she is withholding consent. More importantly, the reader is given to understand that the hero understands that the heroine has given her consent, and she understands that he understands, even if they have exchanged no words: violent sex must be distinguished from non-consensual sex (McElroy 1999; Sheaffer 1999).

5. Aesthetics

Rand holds that our actions need guidance by a vision of the fundamental nature of the universe and of the efficacy of human thought and activity—a vision that can be grasped directly rather than requiring the conscious repetition of long chains of abstract reasoning. The chief function of art is to meet this psychological need by expressing abstract conceptual values and metaphysical truths in concrete perceptible form. Art, according to Rand, constitutes a selective, stylized re-creation of reality, with the principle of selection being the artist's “sense of life,” a set of implicit “metaphysical value-judgments,” i.e., judgments about what is fundamentally significant about the world and our place in it. (There is controversy among Rand scholars as to whether what is re-created in art is certain elements of reality or reality as a whole, i.e. a “microcosm,” as well as how and whether the concept of re-creation applies to apparently non-representational forms of art: Torres and Kamhi 2000, Bissell 2004.) Both the artist's creative work and the audience's emotional responses to it are driven by their senses of life, that is, the worldviews they have “formed by a process of emotional generalization … a subconscious counterpart of a process of abstraction” (1966b, p. 27). The role of art in sustaining us psychologically by providing a concretization of our most fundamental values is a frequent theme in Rand's fiction as well, especially The Fountainhead.[10]

While art can be used to convey information or to advocate a position, such functions are secondary to its chief task: providing an object whose mere contemplation brings spiritual fulfillment. Hence Rand does not regard her own novels primarily as vehicles for her philosophy, though of course they are that inter alia. Given her own worldview, Rand favors literature with a strong plot as a way of expressing purposeful human action in a world of causal regularity, and stories involving value-conflicts as a way of expressing the importance of free choice; hence her preference for romantic (as opposed to, e.g., naturalistic) literature. But Rand holds that it is possible to evaluate an artwork's aesthetic value simply in terms of its success in conveying a concretization of the artist's sense of life, whether or not one shares the values and judgments so conveyed.


Primary Works

Works by Ayn Rand are listed by date of publication.

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Online Manuscripts

Other Websites of Interest

Related Entries

Aristotle | egoism | ethics: virtue | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | libertarianism | moral realism | reference | rights | substance


Thanks to Larry Abrams, David Kelley, Harry Kitchen, Eric Mack, Doug Rasmussen, William Thomas, and an anonymous SEP referee for helpful comments and to Chris Sciabarra for helpful references.