Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Aristotle's Rhetoric

First published Thu May 2, 2002; substantive revision Mon Feb 1, 2010

Aristotle's Rhetoric has had an enormous influence on the development of the art of rhetoric. Not only authors writing in the peripatetic tradition, but also the famous Roman teachers of rhetoric, such as Cicero and Quintilian, frequently used elements stemming from the Aristotelian doctrine. Nevertheless, these authors were interested neither in an authentic interpretation of the Aristotelian works nor in the philosophical sources and backgrounds of the vocabulary that Aristotle had introduced to rhetorical theory. Thus, for two millennia the interpretation of Aristotelian rhetoric has become a matter of the history of rhetoric, not of philosophy. In the most influential manuscripts and editions, Aristotle's Rhetoric was surrounded by rhetorical works and even written speeches of other Greek and Latin authors, and was seldom interpreted in the context of the whole Corpus Aristotelicum. It was not until the last few decades that the philosophically salient features of the Aristotelian rhetoric were rediscovered: in construing a general theory of the persuasive, Aristotle applies numerous concepts and arguments that are also treated in his logical, ethical, and psychological writings. His theory of rhetorical arguments, for example, is only one further application of his general doctrine of the sullogismos, which also forms the basis of dialectic, logic, and his theory of demonstration. Another example is the concept of emotions: though emotions are one of the most important topics in the Aristotelian ethics, he nowhere offers such an illuminating account of single emotions as in the Rhetoric. Finally, it is the Rhetoric, too, that informs us about the cognitive features of language and style.

1. Works on Rhetoric

According to ancient testimonies, Aristotle wrote an early dialogue on rhetoric entitled ‘Grullos’, in which he put forward the argument that rhetoric cannot be an art (technê); and since this is precisely the position of Plato's Gorgias, the lost dialogue Grullos has traditionally been regarded as a sign of Aristotle's (alleged) early Platonism. But the evidence for the position of this dialogue is too tenuous to support such strong conclusions: it also could have been a ‘dialectical’ dialogue, which listed the pros and cons of the thesis that rhetoric is an art. We do not know much more about the so-called ‘Technê Sunagogê’, a collection of previous theories of rhetoric that is also ascribed to Aristotle. Cicero seems to use this collection itself, or at least a secondary source relying on it, as his main historical source when he gives a short survey of the history of pre-Aristotelian rhetoric in his Brutus 46–48. Finally, Aristotle once mentions a work called ‘Theodecteia’ which has also been supposed to be Aristotelian; but more probably he meant the rhetorical handbook of his follower Theodectes, who was a former pupil of Isocrates.

What has come down to us are just the three books on rhetoric, which we know as The Rhetoric, though the ancient catalogue of the Aristotelian works, reported by Diogenes Laertius, mentions only two books on rhetoric (perhaps our Rhetoric I & II), and two further books on style (perhaps our Rhetoric III?). Whereas most modern authors agree that at least the core of Rhet. I & II presents a coherent rhetorical theory, the two themes of Rhet. III are not mentioned in the agenda of Rhet. I & II. The conceptual link between Rhet. I & II and Rhet. III is not given until the very last sentence of the second book. It is quite understandable that the authenticity of this ad hoc composition has been questioned: we cannot exclude the possibility that these two parts of the Rhetoric were not put together until the first edition of Aristotle's works completed by Andronicus in the first century. In the Poetics (1456a33) we find a cross-reference to a work called ‘Rhetoric’ which obviously refers to Rhet. I & II, but excludes Rhet. III. Regardless of such doubts, the systematic idea that links the two heterogeneous parts of the Rhetoric does not at all seem to be unreasonable: it is not enough to have a supply of things to say (the so-called “thought”), the theorist of rhetoric must also inform us about the right way to say those things (the so-called “style”).

The chronological fixing of the Rhetoric has turned out to be a delicate matter. At least the core of Rhet. I & II seems to be an early work, written during Aristotle's first stay in Athens (it is unclear, however, which chapters belong to that core; regularly mentioned are the chapters I.4–15 and II.1–17). It is true that the Rhetoric refers to historical events that fall in the time of Aristotle's exile and his second stay in Athens, but most of them can be found in the chapters II.23–24, and besides this, examples could have been updated, which is especially plausible if we assume that the Rhetoric formed the basis of a lecture held several times. Most striking are the affinities to the (also early) Topics; if, as it is widely agreed, the Topics represents a pre-syllogistic state of Aristotelian logic, the same is true of the Rhetoric: we actually find no hints of syllogistic inventory in it.

2. The Agenda of the Rhetoric

The structure of Rhet. I & II is determined by two tripartite divisions. The first division consists in the distinction among the three means of persuasion: The speech can produce persuasion either through the character of the speaker, the emotional state of the listener, or the argument (logos) itself (see below §5). The second tripartite division concerns the three species of public speech. The speech that takes place in the assembly is defined as the deliberative species. In this rhetorical species, the speaker either advises the audience to do something or warns against doing something. Accordingly, the audience has to judge things that are going to happen in the future, and they have to decide whether these future events are good or bad for the polis, whether they will cause advantage or harm. The speech that takes place before a court is defined as the judicial species. The speaker either accuses somebody or defends herself or someone else. Naturally, this kind of speech treats things that happened in the past. The audience or rather jury has to judge whether a past event was just or unjust, i.e., whether it was according to the law or contrary to the law. While the deliberative and judicial species have their context in a controversial situation in which the listener has to decide in favor of one of two opposing parties, the third species does not aim at such a decision: the epideictic speech praises or blames somebody, it tries to describe things or deeds of the respective person as honorable or shameful.

The first book of the Rhetoric treats the three species in succession. Rhet. I.4–8 deals with the deliberative, I.9 with the epideictic, I.10–14 the judicial species. These chapters are understood as contributing to the argumentative mode of persuasion or—more precisely—to that part of argumentative persuasion that is specific to the respective species of persuasion. The second part of the argumentative persuasion that is common to all three species of rhetorical speech is treated in the chapters II.19–26. The second means of persuasion, which works by evoking the emotions of the audience, is described in the chapters II.2–11. Though the following chapters II.12–17 treat different types of character these chapters do not, as is often assumed, develop the third means of persuasion, which depends on the character of the speaker. The underlying theory of this means of persuasion is elaborated in a few lines of chapter II.1. The aforementioned chapters II.12–17 give information about different types of character and their disposition to emotional response, which can be useful for those speakers who want to arouse the emotions of the audience. Why the chapters on the argumentative means of persuasion are separated by the treatment of emotions and character (in II.2–17) remains a riddle, especially since the chapter II.18 tries to give a link between the specific and the common aspects of argumentative persuasion. Rhetoric III.1–12 discusses several questions of style (see below §8.1), Rhetoric III.13–19 is on the several parts of a speech.

3. Rhetoric as a Counterpart to Dialectic

Aristotle stresses that rhetoric is closely related to dialectic. He offers several formulas to describe this affinity between the two disciplines: first of all, rhetoric is said to be a “counterpart” (antistrophos) to dialectic (Rhet. I.1, 1354a1); (ii) it is also called an “outgrowth” (paraphues ti) of dialectic and the study of character (Rhet. I.2, 1356a25f.); finally, Aristotle says that rhetoric is part of dialectic and resembles it (Rhet. I.2, 1356a30f.). In saying that rhetoric is a counterpart to dialectic, Aristotle obviously alludes to Plato's Gorgias (464bff.), where rhetoric is ironically defined as a counterpart to cookery in the soul. Since, in this passage, Plato uses the word ‘antistrophos’ to designate an analogy, it is likely that Aristotle wants to express a kind of analogy too: what dialectic is for the (private or academic) practice of attacking and maintaining an argument, rhetoric is for the (public) practice of defending oneself or accusing an opponent.

This analogy between rhetoric and dialectic can be substantiated by several common features of both disciplines:

The analogy to dialectic has important implications for the status of rhetoric. Plato argued in his Gorgias that rhetoric cannot be an art (technê), since it is not related to a definite subject, while real arts are defined by their specific subjects, as e.g. medicine or shoemaking are defined by their products, i.e., health and shoes. However, though dialectic has no definite subject, it is easy to see that it nevertheless rests on a method, because dialectic has to grasp the reason why some arguments are valid and others are not. Now, if rhetoric is nothing but the counterpart to dialectic in the domain of public speech, it must be grounded in an investigation of what is persuasive and what is not, and this, in turn, qualifies rhetoric as an art.

Further, it is central to both disciplines that they deal with arguments from accepted premises. Hence the rhetorician who wants to persuade by arguments or (rhetorical) proofs can adapt most of the dialectical equipment. Nevertheless, persuasion that takes place before a public audience is not only a matter of arguments and proofs, but also of credibility and emotional attitudes. This is why there are also remarkable differences between the two disciplines:

4. The Purpose of Rhetoric

4.1 The Definition of Rhetoric

Aristotle defines the rhetorician as someone who is always able to see what is persuasive (Topics VI.12, 149b25). Correspondingly, rhetoric is defined as the ability to see what is possibly persuasive in every given case (Rhet. I.2, 1355b26f.). This is not to say that the rhetorician will be able to convince under all circumstances. Rather he is in a situation similar to that of the physician: the latter has a complete grasp of his art only if he neglects nothing that might heal his patient, though he is not able to heal every patient. Similarly, the rhetorician has a complete grasp of his method, if he discovers the available means of persuasion, though he is not able to convince everybody.

4.2 The Neutrality of Aristotelian Rhetoric

Aristotelian rhetoric as such is a neutral tool that can be used by persons of virtuous or depraved character. This capacity can be used for good or bad purposes; it can cause great benefits as well as great harms. There is no doubt that Aristotle himself regards his system of rhetoric as something useful, but the good purposes for which rhetoric is useful do not define the rhetorical capacity as such. Thus, Aristotle does not hesitate to concede on the one hand that his art of rhetoric can be misused. But on the other hand he tones down the risk of misuse by stressing several factors: Generally, it is true of all goods, except virtue, that they can be misused. Secondly, using rhetoric of the Aristotelian style, it is easier to convince of the just and good than of their opposites. Finally, the risk of misuse is compensated by the benefits that can be accomplished by rhetoric of the Aristotelian style.

4.3 Why We Need Rhetoric

It could still be objected that rhetoric is only useful for those who want to outwit their audience and conceal their real aims, since someone who just wants to communicate the truth could be straightforward and would not need rhetorical tools. This, however, is not Aristotle's point of view: Even those who just try to establish what is just and true need the help of rhetoric when they are faced with a public audience. Aristotle tells us that it is impossible to teach such an audience, even if the speaker had the most exact knowledge of the subject. Obviously he thinks that the audience of a public speech consists of ordinary people who are not able to follow an exact proof based on the principles of a science. Further, such an audience can easily be distracted by factors that do not pertain to the subject at all; sometimes they are receptive to flattery or just try to increase their own advantage. And this situation becomes even worse if the constitution, the laws, and the rhetorical habits in a city are bad. Finally, most of the topics that are usually discussed in public speeches do not allow of exact knowledge, but leave room for doubt; especially in such cases it is important that the speaker seems to be a credible person and that the audience is in a sympathetic mood. For all those reasons, affecting the decisions of juries and assemblies is a matter of persuasiveness, not of knowledge. It is true that some people manage to be persuasive either at random or by habit, but it is rhetoric that gives us a method to discover all means of persuasion on any topic whatsoever.

4.4 Aristotelian Rhetoric as Proof-Centered and Pertinent

Aristotle joins Plato in criticizing contemporary manuals of rhetoric. But how does he manage to distinguish his own project from the criticized manuals? The general idea seems to be this: Previous theorists of rhetoric gave most of their attention to methods outside the subject; they taught how to slander, how to arouse emotions in the audience, or how to distract the attention of the hearers from the subject. This style of rhetoric promotes a situation in which juries and assemblies no longer form rational judgments about the given issues, but surrender to the litigants. Aristotelian rhetoric is different in this respect: it is centered on the rhetorical kind of proof, the enthymeme (see below §6), which is called the most important means of persuasion. Since people are most strongly convinced when they suppose that something has been proven (Rhet. I.1, 1355a5f.), there is no need for the orator to confuse or distract the audience by the use of emotional appeals, etc. In Aristotle's view an orator will be even more successful when he just picks up the convincing aspects of a given issue, thereby using commonly-held opinions as premises. Since people have a natural disposition for the true (Rhet. I.1, 1355a15f.) and every man has some contribution to make to the truth (Eudemian Ethics I.6, 1216b31,) there is no unbridgeable gap between the commonly-held opinions and what is true. This alleged affinity between the true and the persuasive justifies Aristotle's project of a rhetoric that essentially relies on the persuasiveness of pertinent argumentation; and it is just this argumentative character of Aristotelian rhetoric that explains the close affinity between rhetoric and dialectic (see above §3).

4.5 Is There an Inconsistency in Aristotle's Rhetorical Theory?

Of course, Aristotle's rhetoric covers non-argumentative tools of persuasion as well. He tells the orator how to stimulate emotions and how to make himself credible (see below §5); his art of rhetoric includes considerations about delivery and style (see below §8.1) and the parts of a speech. It is understandable that several interpreters found an insoluble tension between the argumentative means of pertinent rhetoric and non-argumentative tools that aim at what is outside the subject. It does not seem, however, that Aristotle himself saw a major conflict between these diverse tools of persuasion—presumably for the following reasons: (i) He leaves no doubt that the subject that is treated in a speech has the highest priority (e.g. Rhet. III.1, 1403b18–27). Thus, it is not surprising that there are even passages that regard the non-argumentative tools as a sort of accidental contribution to the process of persuasion, which essentially proceeds in the manner of dialectic (cp. Rhet. I.1, 1354a15). (ii) There are, he says (III.1, 1404a2f.), methods that are not right, but necessary because of certain deficiencies of the audience. His point seems to be that the argumentative method becomes less effective, the worse the condition of the audience is. This again is to say that it is due to the badness of the audience when his rhetoric includes aspects that are not in line with the idea of argumentative and pertinent rhetoric. (iii) In dealing with methods of traditional rhetoric, Aristotle obviously assumes that even methods that have traditionally been used instead of argumentation can be refined so that they support the aim of an argumentative style of rhetoric. The prologue of a speech, for example, was traditionally used for appeals to the listener, but it can also be used to set out the issue of the speech, thus contributing to its clearness. Similarly, the epilogue has traditionally been used to arouse emotions like pity or anger; but as soon as the epilogue recalls the conclusions reached, it will make the speech more understandable.

5. The Three Means of Persuasion

The systematical core of Aristotle's Rhetoric is the doctrine that there are three technical means of persuasion. The attribute ‘technical’ implies two characteristics: (i) Technical persuasion must rest on a method, and this, in turn, is to say that we must know the reason why some things are persuasive and some are not. Further, methodical persuasion must rest on a complete analysis of what it means to be persuasive. (ii) Technical means of persuasion must be provided by the speaker himself, whereas preexisting facts, such as oaths, witnesses, testimonies, etc. are non-technical, since they cannot be prepared by the speaker.

A speech consists of three things: the speaker, the subject that is treated in the speech, and the listener to whom the speech is addressed (Rhet. I.3, 1358a37ff.). It seems that this is why only three technical means of persuasion are possible: Technical means of persuasion are either (a) in the character of the speaker, or (b) in the emotional state of the hearer, or (c) in the argument (logos) itself.

(a) The persuasion is accomplished by character whenever the speech is held in such a way as to render the speaker worthy of credence. If the speaker appears to be credible, the audience will form the second-order judgment that propositions put forward by the credible speaker are true or acceptable. This is especially important in cases where there is no exact knowledge but room for doubt. But how does the speaker manage to appear a credible person? He must display (i) practical intelligence (phronêsis), (ii) a virtuous character, and (iii) good will (Rhet. II.1, 1378a6ff.); for, if he displayed none of them, the audience would doubt that he is able to give good advice at all. Again, if he displayed (i) without (ii) and (iii), the audience could doubt whether the aims of the speaker are good. Finally, if he displayed (i) and (ii) without (iii), the audience could still doubt whether the speaker gives the best suggestion, though he knows what it is. But if he displays all of them, Aristotle concludes, it cannot rationally be doubted that his suggestions are credible. It must be stressed that the speaker must accomplish these effects by what he says; it is not necessary that he is actually virtuous: on the contrary, a preexisting good character cannot be part of the technical means of persuasion.

(b) The success of the persuasive efforts depends on the emotional dispositions of the audience; for we do not judge in the same way when we grieve and rejoice or when we are friendly and hostile. Thus, the orator has to arouse emotions exactly because emotions have the power to modify our judgments: to a judge who is in a friendly mood, the person about whom he is going to judge seems not to do wrong or only in a small way; but to the judge who is in an angry mood, the same person will seem to do the opposite (cp. Rhet. II.1, 1378a1ff.). Many interpreters writing on the rhetorical emotions were misled by the role of the emotions in Aristotle's ethics: they suggested that the orator has to arouse the emotions in order (i) to motivate the audience or (ii) to make them better persons (since Aristotle requires that virtuous persons do the right things together with the right emotions). Thesis (i) is false for the simple reason that the aim of rhetorical persuasion is a certain judgment (krisis), not an action or practical decision (prohairesis). Thesis (ii) is false, because moral education is not the purpose of rhetoric (see above §4), nor could it be effected by a public speech: “Now if speeches were in themselves enough to make men good, they would justly, as Theognis says, have won very great rewards, and such rewards should have been provided; but as things are … they are not able to encourage the many to nobility and goodness.” (EN X.9. 1179b4–10)

How is it possible for the orator to bring the audience to a certain emotion? Aristotle's technique essentially rests on the knowledge of the definition of every significant emotion. Let, for example, anger be defined as “desire, accompanied with pain, for conspicuous revenge for a conspicuous slight that was directed against oneself or those near to one, when such a slight is undeserved.” (Rhet. II.2 1378a31–33). According to such a definition, someone who believes that he has suffered a slight from a person who is not entitled to do so, etc., will become angry. If we take such a definition for granted, it is possible to deduce circumstances in which a person will most probably be angry; for example, we can deduce (i) in what state of mind people are angry and (ii) against whom they are angry and (iii) for what sorts of reason. Aristotle deduces these three factors for several emotions in the chapters II.2–11. With this equipment, the orator will be able, for example, to highlight such characteristics of a case as are likely to provoke anger in the audience. In comparison with the tricks of former rhetoricians, this method of arousing emotions has a striking advantage: The orator who wants to arouse emotions must not even speak outside the subject; it is sufficient to detect aspects of a given subject that are causally connected with the intended emotion.

(c) We persuade by the argument itself when we demonstrate or seem to demonstrate that something is the case. For Aristotle, there are two species of arguments: inductions and deductions (Posterior Analytics I.1, 71a5ff.). Induction (epagôgê) is defined as the proceeding from particulars up to a universal (Topics I.12, 105a13ff.). A deduction (sullogismos) is an argument in which, certain things having been supposed, something different from the suppositions results of necessity through them (Topics I.1, 100a25ff.) or because of their being true (Prior Analytics I.2, 24b18–20). The inductive argument in rhetoric is the example (paradeigma); unlike other inductive arguments, it does not proceed from many particular cases to one universal case, but from one particular to a similar particular if both particulars fall under the same genus (Rhet. I.2, 1357b25ff.). The deductive argument in rhetoric is the enthymeme (see below §6):

but when, certain things being the case, something different results beside them because of their being true, either universally or for the most part, it is called deduction here (in dialectic) and enthymeme there (in rhetoric).

It is remarkable that Aristotle uses the qualification “either universally or for the most part”: obviously, he wants to say that in some cases the conclusion follows universally, i.e., by necessity, while in other cases it follows only for the most part. At first glance, this seems to be inconsistent, since a non-necessary inference is no longer a deduction. However, it has been disputed whether in arguments from probable premises the formula “for the most part” qualifies the inference itself (“If for the most part such and such is the case it follows for the most part that something different is the case”), or only the conclusion (“If for the most part such and such is the case it follows by necessity that for the most part something different is the case”). If the former interpretation is true, then Aristotle concedes in the very definition of the enthymeme that some enthymemes are not deductive. But if the latter interpretation (which has a parallel in An. post. 87b23–25) is correct, an enthymeme whose premises and conclusion are for the most part true would still be a valid deduction.

6. The Enthymeme

6.1 The Concept of Enthymeme

For Aristotle, an enthymeme is what has the function of a proof or demonstration in the domain of public speech, since a demonstration is a kind of sullogismos and the enthymeme is said to be a sullogismos too. The word ‘enthymeme’ (from ‘enthumeisthai—to consider’) had already been coined by Aristotle's predecessors and originally designated clever sayings, bon mots, and short arguments involving a paradox or contradiction. The concepts ‘proof’ (apodeixis) and ‘sullogismos’ play a crucial role in Aristotle's logical-dialectical theory. In applying them to a term of conventional rhetoric, Aristotle appeals to a well-known rhetorical technique, but, at the same time, restricts and codifies the original meaning of ‘enthymeme’: properly understood, what people call ‘enthymeme’ should have the form of a sullogismos, i.e., a deductive argument.

6.2 Formal Requirements

In general, Aristotle regards deductive arguments as a set of sentences in which some sentences are premises and one is the conclusion, and the inference from the premises to the conclusion is guaranteed by the premises alone. Since enthymemes in the proper sense are expected to be deductive arguments, the minimal requirement for the formulation of enthymemes is that they have to display the premise-conclusion structure of deductive arguments. This is why enthymemes have to include a statement as well as a kind of reason for the given statement. Typically this reason is given in a conditional ‘if’-clause or a causal ‘since’- or ‘for’-clause. Examples of the former, conditional type are: “If not even the gods know everything, human beings can hardly do so.” “If the war is the cause of present evils, things should be set right by making peace.” Examples of the latter, causal type are: “One should not be educated, for one ought not be envied (and educated people are usually envied).” “She has given birth, for she has milk.” Aristotle stresses that the sentence “There is no man among us who is free” taken for itself is a maxim, but becomes an enthymeme as soon as it is used together with a reason such as “for all are slaves of money or of chance (and no slave of money or chance is free).” Sometimes the required reason may even be implicit, as e.g. in the sentence “As a mortal, do not cherish immortal anger” the reason why one should not cherish mortal anger is implicitly given in the phrase “immortal,” which alludes to the rule that is not appropriate for mortal beings to have such an attitude.

6.3 Enthymemes as Dialectical Arguments

Aristotle calls the enthymeme the “body of persuasion”, implying that everything else is only an addition or accident to the core of the persuasive process. The reason why the enthymeme, as the rhetorical kind of proof or demonstration, should be regarded as central to the rhetorical process of persuasion is that we are most easily persuaded when we think that something has been demonstrated. Hence, the basic idea of a rhetorical demonstration seems to be this: In order to make a target group believe that q, the orator must first select a sentence p or some sentences p1pn that are already accepted by the target group; secondly he has to show that q can be derived from p or p1pn, using p or p1pn as premises. Given that the target persons form their beliefs in accordance with rational standards, they will accept q as soon as they understand that q can be demonstrated on the basis of their own opinions.

Consequently, the construction of enthymemes is primarily a matter of deducing from accepted opinions (endoxa). Of course, it is also possible to use premises that are not commonly accepted by themselves, but can be derived from commonly accepted opinions; other premises are only accepted since the speaker is held to be credible; still other enthymemes are built from signs: see §6.5. That a deduction is made from accepted opinions—as opposed to deductions from first and true sentences or principles—is the defining feature of dialectical argumentation in the Aristotelian sense. Thus, the formulation of enthymemes is a matter of dialectic, and the dialectician has the competence that is needed for the construction of enthymemes. If enthymemes are a subclass of dialectical arguments, then it is natural to expect a specific difference by which one can tell enthymemes apart from all other kinds of dialectical arguments (traditionally, commentators regarded logical incompleteness as such a difference; for some objections against the traditional view, see §6.4). Nevertheless, this expectation is somehow misled: The enthymeme is different from other kinds of dialectical arguments, insofar as it is used in the rhetorical context of public speech (and rhetorical arguments are called ‘enthymemes’); thus, no further formal or qualitative differences are needed.

However, in the rhetorical context there are two factors that the dialectician has to keep in mind if she wants to become a rhetorician too, and if the dialectical argument is to become a successful enthymeme. First, the typical subjects of public speech do not—as the subject of dialectic and theoretical philosophy—belong to the things that are necessarily the case, but are among those things that are the goal of practical deliberation and can also be otherwise. Second, as opposed to well-trained dialecticians the audience of public speech is characterized by an intellectual insufficiency; above all, the members of a jury or assembly are not accustomed to following a longer chain of inferences. Therefore enthymemes must not be as precise as a scientific demonstration and should be shorter than ordinary dialectical arguments. This, however, is not to say that the enthymeme is defined by incompleteness and brevity. Rather, it is a sign of a well-executed enthymeme that the content and the number of its premises are adjusted to the intellectual capacities of the public audience; but even an enthymeme that failed to incorporate these qualities would still be enthymeme.

6.4 The Brevity of the Enthymeme

In a well known passage (Rhet. I.2, 1357a7–18; similar: Rhet. II.22, 1395b24–26), Aristotle says that the enthymeme often has few or even fewer premises than some other deductions, (sullogismoi). Since most interpreters refer the word ‘sullogismos’ to the syllogistic theory (see the entry on Aristotle's logic), according to which a proper deduction has exactly two premises, those lines have led to the widespread understanding that Aristotle defines the enthymeme as a sullogismos in which one of two premises has been suppressed, i.e., as an abbreviated, incomplete syllogism. But certainly the mentioned passages do not attempt to give a definition of the enthymeme, nor does the word ‘sullogismos’ necessarily refer to deductions with exactly two premises. Properly understood, both passages are about the selection of appropriate premises, not about logical incompleteness. The remark that enthymemes often have few or less premises concludes the discussion of two possible mistakes the orator could make (Rhet. I.2, 1357a7–10): One can draw conclusions from things that have previously been deduced or from things that have not been deduced yet. The latter method is unpersuasive, for the premises are not accepted, nor have they been introduced. The former method is problematic, too: if the orator has to introduce the needed premises by another deduction, and the premises of this pre-deduction too, etc., one will end up with a long chain of deductions. Arguments with several deductive steps are common in dialectical practice, but one cannot expect the audience of a public speech to follow such long arguments. This is why Aristotle says that the enthymeme is and should be from fewer premises.

Supplement on The Brevity of the Enthymeme

6.5 Different Types of Enthymemes

Just as there is a difference between real and apparent or fallacious deductions in dialectic, we have to distinguish between real and apparent or fallacious enthymemes in rhetoric. The topoi for real enthymemes are given in chapter II.23, for fallacious enthymemes in chapter II.24. The fallacious enthymeme pretends to include a valid deduction, while it actually rests on a fallacious inference.

Further, Aristotle distinguishes between enthymemes taken from probable (eikos) premises and enthymemes taken from signs (sêmeia). (Rhet. I.2, 1357a32–33). In a different context, he says that enthymemes are based on probabilities, examples, tekmêria (i.e., proofs, evidences), and signs (Rhet. II.25, 1402b12–14). Since the so-called tekmêria are a subclass of signs and the examples are used to establish general premises, this is only an extension of the former classification. (Note that neither classification interferes with the idea that premises have to be accepted opinions: with respect to the signs, the audience must believe that they exist and accept that they indicate the existence of something else, and with respect to the probabilities, people must accept that something is likely to happen.) However, it is not clear whether this is meant to be an exhaustive typology. That most of the rhetorical arguments are taken from probable premises (“For the most part it is true that …” “It is likely that …”) is due to the typical subjects of public speech, which are rarely necessary. When using a sign-argument or sign-enthymeme we do not try to explain a given fact; we just indicate that something exists or is the case: “… anything such that when it is another thing is, or when it has come into being, the other has come into being before or after, is a sign of the other's being or having come into being.” (Prior Analytics II.27, 70a7ff.). But there are several types of sign-arguments too; Aristotle offers the following examples:

  Rhetoric I.2 Prior Analytics II.27
(i) Wise men are just, since Socrates is just. Wise men are good, since Pittacus is good.
(ii) He is ill, since he has fever./ She has given birth, since she has milk. This woman has a child, since she has milk.
(iii) This man has fever, since he breathes rapidly. She is pregnant, since she is pale.

Sign-arguments of type (i) and (iii) can always be refuted, even if the premises are true; that is to say that they do not include a valid deduction (sullogismos); Aristotle calls them asullogistos (non-deductive). Sign-arguments of type (ii) can never be refuted if the premise is true, since, for example, it is not possible that someone has fever without being ill, or that someone has milk without having given birth, etc. This latter type of sign-enthymemes is necessary and is also called tekmêrion (proof, evidence). Now, if some sign-enthymemes are valid deductions and some are not, it is tempting to ask whether Aristotle regarded the non-necessary sign-enthymemes as apparent or fallacious arguments. However, there seems to be a more attractive reading: We accept a fallacious argument only if we are deceived about its logical form. But we could regard, for example, the inference “She is pregnant, since she is pale” as a good and informative argument, even if we know that it does not include a logically necessary inference. So it seems as if Aristotle didn't regard all non-necessary sign-arguments as fallacious or deceptive; but even if this is true, it is difficult for Aristotle to determine the sense in which non-necessary sign-enthymemes are valid arguments, since he is bound to the alternative of deduction and induction, and neither class seems appropriate for non-necessary sign-arguments.

7. The Topoi

Generally speaking, an Aristotelian topos (‘place’, ‘location’) is an argumentative scheme that enables a dialectician or rhetorician to construe an argument for a given conclusion. The use of so-called topoi or ‘loci communes’ can be traced back to early rhetoricians such as Protagoras, Gorgias (cp. Cicero, Brutus, 46–48) and Isocrates. But while in earlier rhetoric a topos was understood as a complete pattern or formula that can be mentioned at a certain stage of the speech to produce a certain effect, most of the Aristotelian topoi are general instructions saying that a conclusion of a certain form can be derived from premises of a certain form; and because of this ‘formal’ or ‘semi-formal’ character of Aristotelian topoi, one topos can be used to construe several different arguments. Aristotle's book Topics lists some hundred topoi for the construction of dialectical arguments. These lists of topoi form the core of the method by which the dialectician should be able to formulate deductions on any problem that could be proposed. Most of the instructions that the Rhetoric gives for the composition of enthymemes are also organized as lists of topoi; especially the first book of the Rhetoric essentially consists of topoi concerning the subjects of the three species of public speech.

7.1 The Definition of ‘Topos’

It is striking that the work that is almost exclusively dedicated to the collection of topoi, the book Topics, does not even make an attempt to define the concept of topos. At any rate the Rhetoric gives a sort of defining characterization: “I call the same thing element and topos; for an element or a topos is a heading under which many enthymemes fall.” (Rhet. 1403a18–19) By ‘element’ Aristotle does not mean a proper part of the enthymeme, but a general form under which many concrete enthymemes of the same type can be subsumed. According to this definition, the topos is a general argumentative form or pattern, and the concrete arguments are instantiations of the general topos. That the topos is a general instruction from which several arguments can be derived, is crucial for Aristotle's understanding of an artful method of argumentation; for a teacher of rhetoric who makes his pupils learn ready samples of arguments would not impart the art itself to them, but only the products of this art, just as if someone pretending to teach the art of shoe-making only gave samples of already made shoes to his pupils (see Sophistical Refutations 183b36ff.).

7.2 The Word ‘Topos’ and the Technique of Places

The word ‘topos’ (place, location) most probably is derived from an ancient method of memorizing a great number of items on a list by associating them with successive places, say the houses along a street, one is acquainted with. By recalling the houses along the street we can also remember the associated items. Full descriptions of this technique can be found in Cicero, De Oratore II 86–88, 351–360, Auctor ad Herennium III 16–24, 29–40 and in Quintilian, Institutio XI 2, 11–33). In Topics 163b28–32, Aristotle seems to allude to this technique: “For just as in the art of remembering, the mere mention of the places instantly makes us recall the things, so these will make us more apt at deductions through looking to these defined premises in order of enumeration.” Aristotle also alludes to this technique in On the soul 427b18–20, On Memory 452a12–16, and On Dreams 458b20–22.

But though the name ‘topos’ may be derived from this mnemotechnical context, Aristotle's use of topoi does not rely on the technique of places. At least within the system of the book Topics, every given problem must be analyzed in terms of some formal criteria: Does the predicate of the sentence in question ascribe a genus or a definition or peculiar or accidental properties to the subject? Does the sentence express a sort of opposition, either contradiction or contrariety, etc.? Does the sentence express that something is more or less the case? Does it maintain identity or diversity? Are the words used linguistically derived from words that are part of an accepted premise? Depending on such formal criteria of the analyzed sentence one has to refer to a fitting topos. For this reason, the succession of topoi in the book Topics is organized in accordance with their salient formal criteria; and this, again, makes a further mnemotechnique superfluous. More or less the same is true of the Rhetoric—except that most of its topoi are structured by material and not by formal criteria, as we shall see in section 7.4. Besides all this, there is at least one passage in which the use of the word ‘topos’ can be explained without referring to the previously mentioned mnemotechnique: In Topics VIII.1, 155b4–5 Aristotle says: “we must find the location (topos) from which to attack”, where the word ‘topos’ is obviously used to mean a starting point for attacking the theses of the opponents.

7.3 The Elements of a Topos

A typical Aristotelian topos runs as follows: “Again, if the accident of a thing has a contrary, see whether it belongs to the subject to which the accident in question has been declared to belong: for if the latter belongs, the former could not belong; for it is impossible that contrary predicates should belong at the same time to the same thing.” (Topics 113a20–24). Like most topoi, it includes (i) a sort of general instruction (“see, whether …”); further it mentions (ii) an argumentative scheme—in the given example, the scheme ‘if the accidental predicate p belongs to the subject s, then the opposed P* cannot belong to s too’. Finally, the topos refers to (iii) a general rule or principle (“for it is impossible, …”) which justifies the given scheme. Other topoi often include the discussion of (iv) examples; still other topoi suggest (v) how to apply the given schemes.—Though these are elements that regularly occur in Aristotelian topoi, there is nothing like a standard form with which all topoi comply. Often Aristotle is very brief and leaves it to the reader to add the missing elements.

7.4 The Function of a Topos

In a nutshell, the function of a topos can be explained as follows. First of all, one has to select an apt topos for a given conclusion. The conclusion is either a thesis of our opponent that we want to refute, or our own assertion we want to establish or defend. Accordingly, there are two uses of topoi: they can either prove or disprove a given sentence; some can be used for both purposes, others for only one of them. Most topoi are selected by certain formal features of the given conclusion; if, for example, the conclusion maintains a definition, we have to select our topos from a list of topoi pertaining to definitions, etc. When it comes to the so-called ‘material’ topoi of the Rhetoric, the appropriate topos must be selected not by formal criteria, but in accordance with the content of the conclusion—whether, for example, something is said to be useful or honorable or just, etc. Once we have selected a topos that is appropriate for a given conclusion, the topos can be used to construe a premise from which the given conclusion can be derived. If for example the argumentative scheme is ‘If a predicate is generally true of a genus, then the predicate is also true of any species of that genus’, we can derive the conclusion ‘the capacity of nutrition belongs to plants’ using the premise ‘the capacity of nutrition belongs to all living things’, since ‘living thing’ is the genus of the species ‘plants’. If the construed premise is accepted, either by the opponent in a dialectical debate or by the audience in public speech, we can draw the intended conclusion.

It has been disputed whether the topos (or, more precisely, the ‘if …, then …’ scheme that is included in a topos) that we use to construe an argument must itself be regarded as a further premise of the argument. It could be either, as some say, the premise of a propositional scheme such as the modus ponens, or, as others assume, as the conditional premise of a hypothetical syllogism. Aristotle himself does not favor one of these interpretations explicitly. But even if he regarded the topoi as additional premises in a dialectical or rhetorical argument, it is beyond any doubt that he did not use them as premises that must be explicitly mentioned or even approved by the opponent or audience.

Supplement on the Topoi of the Rhetoric

8. Style: How to Say Things with Words

Rhet. III.1–12 introduces the topic of lexis, usually translated as ‘style’. This topic was not announced until the final passage of Rhet. II, so that most scholars have come to think of this section as a more or less self-contained treatise. The insertion of this treatise into the Rhetoric is motivated by the claim that, while Rhet. I & II dealt with thought (dianoia), i.e., about what the orator should say, it remains to inquire into the various ways of saying or formulating one and the same thing. In the course of Rhet. III.1–12 it turns out that Aristotle tackles this task by using some quite heterogeneous approaches. After an initial exploration of the field of delivery and style (III.1) Aristotle tries to determine what good prose style consists in; for this purpose he has to go into the differentiation and the selection of various kinds of nouns, one of which is defined as metaphor (III.2). The following chapters III.3–6 feature topics that are at best loosely connected with the theme of good prose style; among these topics is the opposite of good style, namely frigid or deterring style (psuchron) (III.3), the simile, which turns out to be connected with the metaphor (III.4), the issue of correct Greek (III.5), the appropriateness (III.7) and the means by which one's style becomes long-winded and dignified (III.6). Chapters III.8–9 introduce two new approaches to the issue of style, which seem to be unrelated to everything that has been said so far: These are the topics of the rhythmical shaping of prose style and of periodic and non-periodic flow of speech. Chapters III.10–11 are dedicated to how the orator can ‘bring things before one's eyes’, which amounts to something like making the style more vivid. Again metaphors are shown to play a crucial role for that purpose, so that the topic of metaphor is taken up again and deepened by extended lists of examples. Chapter III.12 seems to make a new start by distinguishing between oral and written style and assessing their suitability for the three genres of speech (see above §2). The philosophical core of Aristotle's treatise on style in Rhet. III.1–12 seems to be included in the discussion of the good prose style (see below §8.1), however it is the topic of metaphor (see below §8.2) that has attracted the most attention in the later reception up to the present day.

8.1 The Virtue of Style

Originally the discussion of style belongs to the art of poetry rather than to rhetoric; the poets were the first, as Aristotle observes, to give an impulse for the study of style. Nevertheless he admits that questions of style or, more precisely, of different ways to formulate the same subject, may have an impact on the degree of clarity: “What concerns the topic of lexis, however, has some small necessary place in all teaching; for to speak in one way rather than another makes some difference in regard to clarity; although not a great difference…” (Rhet. III.1, 1404a8–10). Clarity again matters for comprehension and comprehensibility contributes to persuasiveness. Indeed Aristotle even claims that the virtue or excellence (aretê) of prose style ultimately depends on clarity, because it is the genuine purpose of a speech is to make something clear. In prose speeches, the good formulation of a state of affairs must therefore be a clear one. However, saying this is not yet enough to account for the best or excellent prose style, since clear linguistic expressions tend to be banal or flat, while good style should avoid such banality. If the language becomes too banal it will not be able to attract the attention of the audience. The orator can avoid this tendency of banality by the use of dignified or elevated expressions and in general by all formulations that deviate from common usage. On the one hand, uncommon vocabulary has the advantage of evoking the curiosity of an audience. On the other hand the use of such elevated vocabulary bears a serious risk: Whenever the orator makes excessive use of it, the speech might become unclear, thus failing to meet the default requirement of prose speech, namely clarity. Moreover, if the vocabulary becomes too sublime or dignified in relation to prose's subject matter (Aristotle assumes it is mostly everyday affairs), the audience will notice that the orator uses his words with a certain intention and will become suspicious about the orator and his intentions. Hitting upon the right wording is therefore a matter of being clear, but not too banal; In trying not to be too banal, one must use uncommon, dignified words and phrases, but one must be careful not to use them excessively or inappropriately in relation to prose style and the typical subject matter of prose speeches.

Bringing all these considerations together Aristotle defines the good prose style, i.e. the virtue of prose style, as follows: “Let the virtue of linguistic form be defined as being clear, for since the logos is a (linguistic, sc.) sign, it would fail to bring about its proper function, whenever it does not make clear (whatever it is the sign of, sc.)—and neither banal/mean/flat (tapeinên) nor above the deserved dignity, but appropriate (prepon).” (Rhet. III.2, 1404b1–4; similar at III.12, 1414a22–26) According to this definition, the virtue of prose style has to avoid two opposed tendencies, both of which are excessive and therefore fallacious: The good style is clear in a way that is neither too banal nor too dignified, but appropriate (in proportion to the subject matter of prose speech). In this respect the definition of stylistic virtue follows the same scheme as the definition of ethical virtues in Aristotle's ethical writings, insofar as both the stylistic virtue and the virtue of character are defined in terms of a mean that lies between two opposed excesses. If the virtue of style is defined as a mean between the banality involving form of clarity and overly dignified (and hence inappropriate) speech, it is with good reason that Aristotle speaks of only one virtue of prose style, and not of clarity, ornament (by dignified expressions) and appropriateness as three distinct virtues of style. However, from the times of Cicero and Quintilianus on, these three, along with the correctness of Greek or Latin, became the canonical four virtues of speech (virtutes dicendi). Reading Aristotle through the spectacles of the Roman art of rhetoric, scholars often try to identify two, three or four virtues of style in his Rhetoric.

Finally, if the virtue of style is about finding a balance between banal clarity, which is dull, and attractive dignity, which is inappropriate in public speeches, how can the orator manage to control the different degrees of clarity and dignity? For this purpose Aristotle equips the orator with a classification of words (more or less the same classification can also be found in Poetics chapter 21): First of all Aristotle distinguishes between the kuria onamata, the standard expressions, and the glôtta, the borrowed words, idioms or vernacular expressions. Most examples that Aristotle gives of this latter class are taken from the different Greek dialects, and most examples of this type are in turn taken from the language of the Homeric epos. Further classes are defined by metaphors and by several expressions that are somehow altered or modified, e.g., newly coined expressions (pepoiêmena), composite expressions (especially new or unusual compositions (ta dipla)), and lengthened, shortened or otherwise altered expressions. Sometimes Aristotle also uses the term kosmos under which he collects all epithets and otherwise ornamental expressions. These different types of words differ in accordance with their familiarity. Most familiar are the usual or current words, the least familiar words are the glôtta or words that are newly coined. The metaphors are also unknown and unusual, because a usual, well-known word is used to designate something other than its usual designation (see below §8.2). The best established words, the kuria, make their subject clear, but do not excite the audience's curiosity, whereas all other types of words are not established, and hence have the sort of attraction that alien or foreign things used to have. Since remote things are admirable (thaumaston) and the admirable is pleasant, Aristotle says, one should make the speech admirable and pleasant by the use of such unfamiliar words. However one has to be careful not to use inappropriately dignified or poetic words in prose speech. Thus the virtue of style is accomplished by the selection and balanced use of these various types of words: Fundamental for prose speech is the use of usual and therefore clear words. In order to make the speech pleasant and dignified and in order to avoid banality the orator must make moderate use of non-familiar elements. Metaphor plays an important role for prose style, since metaphors contribute, as Aristotle says, clarity as well as the unfamiliar, surprising effect that avoids banality and tediousness.

8.2 Aristotelian Metaphors

According to Aristotle Poetics 21, 1457b9–16 and 20–22, a metaphor is “the application of an alien name by transference either from genus to species, or from species to genus, or from species to species, or by analogy, that is, proportion”. These four types are exemplified as follows:

Type Example Explanation
(i) From genus to species There lies my ship Lying at anchor is a species of the genus “lying”
(ii) From species to genus Verily ten thousand noble deeds hath Odysseus wrought Ten thousand is a species of the genus “large number”
(iii) From species to species (a) With blade of bronze drew away the life (a) “To draw away” is used for “to cleave”
    (b) Cleft the water with the vessel of unyielding bronze (b) “To cleave” is used for “to draw away.” Both, to draw away and to cleave, are species of “taking away”
(iv) From analogy (a) To call the cup “the shield of Dionysus” (a) The cup is to Dionysus as the shield to Ares
    (b) To call the shield “the cup of Ares” (b) The shield is to Ares as the cup to Dionysus

Most of the examples Aristotle offers for types (i) to (iii) would not be regarded as metaphors in the modern sense; rather they would fall under the headings of metonomy or synecdoche. The examples offered for type (iv) are more like modern metaphors. Aristotle himself regards the metaphors of group (iv), which are built from analogy, as the most important type of enthymemes. An analogy is given if the second term is to the first as the fourth to the third. Correspondingly, an analogous metaphor uses the fourth term for the second or the second for the fourth. This principle can be illustrated by the following Aristotelian examples:

  Analogy Metaphor
(a) The cup to Dionysus as shield to Ares. To call the cup “the shield of Dionysus” or the shield “the cup of Ares” is a metaphor.
(b) Old age to life as the evening to day To call old age “the evening of the life” or the evening “old age of the day” is a metaphor
(c) Sowing to seed as X to sun rays, while the action of the sun in scattering his rays is nameless; still this process bears to the sun the same relation as sowing to the seed. To call (a nameless) X “sowing of sun rays” is a metaphor by analogy
(d) = (a) To call the shield “a cup without wine” is also a metaphor by analogy.

Examples (a) and (b) obey the optional instruction that metaphors can be qualified by adding the term to which the proper word is relative (cp. “the shield of Ares,” “the evening of life”). In example (c), there is no proper name for the thing that the metaphor refers to. In example (d) the relation of analogy is not, as in the other cases, indicated by the domain to which an item is referred to, but by a certain negation (for example “without name”); the negations make clear that the term is not used in its usual sense.

Metaphors are closely related to similes; but as opposed to the later tradition, Aristotle does not define the metaphor as an abbreviated simile, but, the other way around, the simile as a metaphor. The simile differs from the metaphor in the form of expression: while in the metaphor something is identified or substituted, the simile compares two things with each other, using words as “like,” “as”, etc. For example, “He rushed as a lion” is, according to Aristotle, a simile, but “The lion rushed” is a metaphor.

While in the later tradition the use of metaphors has been seen as a matter of mere decoration, which has to delight the hearer, Aristotle stresses the cognitive function of metaphors. Metaphors, he says, bring about learning (Rhet. III.10, 1410b14f.). In order to understand a metaphor, the hearer has to find something common between the metaphor and the thing the metaphor refers to. For example, if someone calls the old age “stubble”, we have to find a common genus to which old age and stubble belong; we do not grasp the very sense of the metaphor until we find that both, old age and stubble, have lost their bloom. Thus, a metaphor not only refers to a thing, but simultaneously describes the thing in a certain respect. This is why Aristotle says that the metaphor brings about learning: as soon as we understand why someone uses the metaphor “stubble” to refer to old age, we have learned at least one characteristic of old age.

Glossary of Selected Terms


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Aristotle | Aristotle, General Topics: logic | Cicero | Plato: rhetoric and poetry