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First published Tue Jan 26, 2010

In the accounts we give of one another, claims about our abilities appear to be indispensable. Some abilities are so widespread that many who have them take them for granted, such as the ability to walk, or to write one's name, or to tell a hawk from a handsaw. Others are comparatively rare and notable, such as the ability to hit a Major League fastball, or to compose a symphony, or to tell an elm from a beech. In either case, however, when we ascribe such abilities to one another we have the impression that we are making claims that, whether they are worth saying or not, are at least sometimes true. The impression of truth exerts a pressure towards giving a philosophical theory of ability. It is not an option, at least at the outset, to dismiss all our talk of ability as fiction or outright falsehood. A theory of ability can be reasonably expected to say what it is to have an ability in a way that vindicates the appearance of truth. Such a theory will deserve the name “philosophical” insofar as it gives an account, not of this or that range of abilities, but of abilities generally.

This article falls into three parts. The first part, Sections 1 and 2, states a framework for discussing philosophical theories of ability. Section 1 will say more about the distinction between abilities and other modal aspects of people and things. Section 2 will articulate constraints on a satisfactory theory. The second part, Sections 3 and 4, surveys theories of ability that have been defended in the philosophical literature. Section 3 concerns the most prominent kind of theory, on which abilities are to be understood in terms of a hypothetical relating an agent's actions to his volitions. Section 4 considers views of ability that are not hypothetical in this way. The third part, Section 5, turns to the relationship between a theory of ability and the free will debates. Such debates often involve claims about agents' abilities, and many have hoped that getting clearer on abilities themselves could resolve, or at least shed light on, such debates. The aim of this last section will be to assess whether these hopes are reasonable ones.

1. A taxonomy

What is an ability? On one reading, this question is a demand for a theory of ability of the sort described above. On another reading, however, this question simply asks for a rough guide to what sort of things we are speaking of when we speak of “abilities.” So understood, this question is not asking for a theory of ability, but for an explanation of what exactly a theory of ability would be a theory of. This section will offer an answer to this question on this second, more modest, reading.

1.1 Dispositions and powers

Let us begin with a much more general distinction, the distinction between dispositions on the one hand and powers on the other.

Dispositions are, at first pass, those properties picked out by predicates like ‘is fragile’ or ‘is soluble’, or perhaps more accurately by sentences of the form ‘x is disposed to break when struck’ or ‘x is disposed to dissolve when placed in water.’ Dispositions so understood have figured centrally in the metaphysics and philosophy of science of the last half-century (Carnap 1936 & 1937, Goodman 1954), and also in influential accounts of the mind (Ryle 1949). They are like abilities in many significant respects, in particular in the fact that they can exist even when not manifested. Indeed, it is an open question whether abilities simply are, or at least are realized by, certain dispositions (see the “new dispositionalist” proposals below in Section 5.2). But however that question is answered, there is at least a nominal distinction to be drawn between dispositions and the topic of this article, namely abilities.

We may approach that distinction via the distinction that is our topic in this section, namely the distinction between dispositions, so understood, and powers (Reid 1788; note this term is sometimes used to mean something like dispositions, e.g. in Molnar 2006). Powers, at first pass, are all and only those properties that (i) are possessed by agents and (ii) are typically expressed by the modal auxiliary ‘can.’ This immediately raises two difficult questions that will go unanswered here, namely what it is to be an agent and what it is to be typically expressed by ‘can.’ Nonetheless, we have some intuitive idea of what kind of things are included under the range of powers: these include, inter alia, competence (‘He can understand French’), potentiality (‘He can understand French (provided he takes classes)’), and opportunity (‘He can understand French now that he's sobered up’). (Compare van Inwagen 1983, 8–13.)

There may be some infelicities in this way of drawing the distinction. For example it classes those properties that satisfy (ii) but not (i) (such as the “capacities” of Cartwright 1994) as a species of disposition, which is perhaps mistaken, or at least overly simplistic. Nonetheless, this distinction is fit to play its present role, which is to fix on the domain of abilities. For, in these terms, an ability is simply a particular kind of power.

1.2 Powers and abilities

The distinction between dispositions and powers was drawn partly in terms of their subjects: it is a necessary condition on a power, but not on a disposition, that it be a property of an agent. The distinction between powers generally and abilities in particular may be drawn in terms of their objects. A power is an ability just in case it relates an agent to an action.

Some examples may make this distinction clear. Some powers, though properties of agents naturally expressed by ‘can,’ do not intuitively involve any relation to action. The case of understanding, just mentioned, is a good example of this. Understanding a sentence, while it is not wholly passive or arational, is not typically an action. In contrast, speaking a sentence is. Thus the power to understand French will be a power, but not an ability, on the present taxonomy. In contrast the power to speak French will be an ability, since it involves a relation to action. (Again, see van Inwagen 1983, 8–13.)

This way of drawing the distinction inherits the problems involved in drawing the distinction between actions and non-actions. First, there is the problem that the domain of action is itself a contentious matter. Second, there is the problem that, even if we have settled on an account of action, it is plausible that the domain of action will be vague, so that there are some events that are not definitely actions, but that are not definitely not actions either. If this is right, then the present account of ability, which is cashed out in terms of action, will be correspondingly contentious and vague. The cases borderline between action and non-action may generate problems for the theory of ability. But such problems will not be central here. For giving such a theory will be difficult enough even when we focus on paradigm cases of action, and so on paradigm cases of ability.

Note there is a similarity between the present distinction between powers and abilities and the traditional distinction between intellectual and active powers, with the latter being powers that essentially involve the will, and the former those that do not (Reid 1785 & 1788). But it is not clear that these distinctions overlap exactly. For example, the power to will itself will clearly be an active power. It is less clear whether it will count as an ability, for the answer to that question will turn on the contentious question of whether willing is itself an action.

1.3 General and specific abilities

The distinctions made thus far have been distinctions between abilities and other properties. But there is also a distinction to be made within the class of abilities itself. This is the distinction between general and specific abilities (Honoré 1964, Mele 2002).

The distinction between general and specific abilities may be brought out by way of example. Consider a well-trained tennis player equipped with ball and racquet, standing at the service line. There is, as it were, nothing standing between him and a serve: every prerequisite for his serving has been met. Such an agent is in a position to serve, or has serving as an option. Let us say that such an agent has the specific ability to serve.

In contrast, consider an otherwise similar tennis player who lacks a racquet and ball, and is miles away from a tennis court. There is clearly a good sense in which such an agent has the ability to hit a serve: he has been trained to do so, and has done so many times in the past. Yet such an agent lacks the specific ability to serve, as that term was just defined. Let us say that such an agent has the general ability to serve.

The concern of this article will be general abilities in this sense, and unqualified references to “ability” should be read in that way. But specific abilities will also be at issue. This is for three reasons. The first is one of coverage: many of the proposals that are relevant to the understanding of ability, especially the classical “conditional analysis” (discussed in Section 3.1 below), are naturally read as proposals about specific ability in the present sense. The second reason is that one may reasonably question whether this distinction is a significant one. Perhaps ascriptions of specific abilities are just highly-specified ascriptions of general abilities. Conversely, perhaps ascriptions of general abilities are just somewhat relaxed and underspecified ascriptions of specific abilities. Each of these is a substantive proposal, and we neither want to dismiss them or presuppose them at the outset. So while the distinction between general and specific abilities will often be useful here, we want to leave open the question of whether this distinction is more than merely superficial.

The third reason is the following. Even if the distinction between general and specific abilities is a genuine one, a full account of abilities should involve an account of both sorts of abilities, and, one hopes, of how they are related. For this distinction is not plausibly diagnosed as mere ambiguity; it rather marks off something like two modes of a single kind of power. Insofar as we are interested in the prospects for just such a full account of ability, we want to keep both kinds of ability within our ken in what follows.

1.4 The question of “know how”

Some will expect that an account of ability would also be an account of what it is to know how to perform an action, on the supposition that one knows how to perform a certain action just in case one has the ability to perform that action. This supposition, which we may call the Rylean account of know how (since it is most explicitly defended in Ryle 1949, 25–61), has been called into question in an influential discussion by Jason Stanley and Timothy Williamson (Stanley and Williamson 2001). Let us briefly consider Stanley and Williamson's argument and how it bears on the theory of ability.

Stanley and Williamson argue, on broadly linguistic grounds, that our default view of know how ought to be rather different from Ryle's. Part of the argument for this is that standard treatments of embedded questions (“know who,” “know where,” and so forth; see Karttunen 1977) suggest a rather different treatment. On this treatment, to know how to A is to know a certain proposition. At first pass, in Stanley and Williamson's presentation, for S to know how to A is for S to know, of some contextually relevant way of acting w, that w is a way for S to A. Stanley and Williamson develop and defend such a treatment, and offer independent considerations for rejecting Ryle's own arguments for the Rylean view. On their view, then, to know how to A is not to have an ability.

Stanley and Williamson's arguments are far from widely accepted (see Noë 2005), but they tell at the very least against simply assuming that an account of ability will also be an account of know how. So we will leave questions of know how to one side in what follows. It is also reasonable to hope that an account of ability, while it may not simply be an account of know how, will at least shed light on disputes about know how. For so long as we lack a theory of what an ability is, the precise content of the Rylean view (and of its denial) remains unclear. So it may be that getting clear on abilities may help us, perhaps indirectly, to get clear on know how as well.

2. Constraints on a theory of ability

If one wishes to give a theory of ability of the sort described at the outset—one that does justice to our ordinary judgments about abilities—that theory will have to meet certain constraints. This section canvasses two of the most important kinds of such constraints.

2.1 Extensional constraints

Since our ordinary conception of ability is one on which almost everyone has some abilities and lacks others, we do not want our theory to ascribe too few or too many abilities to agents. These are extensional constraints on a theory of ability.

One theory that appears to ascribe too few abilities to agents is the error theory about ability, according to which agents never have the ability to do anything. A slightly more modest theory which also ascribes too few abilities to agents is one that says that agents have the ability to do only what they actually do. In the Metaphysics, Aristotle ascribes such a view to the Megarians:

There are some—such as the Megarians—who say that something is capable only when it is acting, and when it is not acting it is not capable. For example, someone who is not building is not capable of building, but someone who is building is capable when he is building; and likewise too in other cases. It is not hard to see the absurd consequences of this. (1046b; Makin 2006, 3)

Such views of abilities have not received much explicit defense, though they follow naturally from some views that have been widely defended. For example, they naturally follow from “necessitarian” views which deny that anything but what is actual is possible. Nonetheless, insofar as we are seeking a theory of ability that does some justice to our ordinary judgments, these views fall outside the domain of plausible candidates for such a theory.

There is also the risk of ascribing too many abilities to agents. One theory that does so is what we might call the omnipotence theory, according to which any agent has the ability to do anything whatsoever. It is not obvious that such a view, which Descartes for one seems to have attributed to God, is coherent, let alone plausible (see the discussion in Curley 1984). A somewhat more modest theory is one on which any agent has the ability to do anything that is metaphysically possible. But this view too is implausible, for it is plausible, at least by the lights of our ordinary judgments, that there are many actions that it is metaphysically possible for someone to perform that he lacks the ability to perform.

A theory of ability that wants to uphold our ordinary conception of ability will therefore have to avoid ascribing too few or too many abilities to agents. This is not a trivial task, and it remains to be seen whether there is an account of ability that can successfully steer between these extremes. If there is not, one reaction may be to revise the extensional constraints and revisit some of the more radical views of ability just mentioned.

2.2 Actuality constraints

Having an ability to perform some action stands in some relationship to actually performing that action. But on our ordinary conception of ability this relationship is a rather relaxed and indirect one. The actuality constraints rule out overly stringent ways of construing this relationship.

We do not want, first of all, for a theory of ability to take actually performing an action to be a necessary condition for having the ability to perform that action. This is precisely the view that, as noted above, Aristotle attributes to the Megarians. This view is too stringent because it seems that we can retain abilities even at times when we are not actually exercising those abilities. Indeed, it is plausible that there are abilities that we never actually exercise. For example, for a normal speaker of a language, there is some sentence that he has the ability to meaningfully utter but never in fact meaningfully utters. If we wish to uphold these sorts of possibilities, then we do not want to make performance a necessary condition on having an ability.

A more delicate question is whether actually performing an action is a sufficient condition for having the ability to perform that action. Here intuitions diverge. On the one hand, as J.L. Austin famously notes of a golfer who sinks a difficult putt, there is one sense in which “it follows merely from the premise that he does it, that he has the ability to do it, according to ordinary English” (Austin 1956, 218). On the other hand, there seems also to be a sense in which abilities are somewhat more demanding than this. This is the sense in which fluky success, as in the case of the golfer, is not sufficient for ability. On this reading, having an ability seems to demand a measure of robustness and control that is not underwritten by one instance of success.

One conjecture suggests itself in light of the foregoing. This is that the former sense of ability is what we have called specific ability, and the latter what we have called general ability. (This is the conjecture suggested by Honoré 1964, 466–468). If this is correct, then the second actuality constraint may be stated as follows. An account of specific ability may, and indeed ought to, treat actual success as a sufficient condition for having a specific ability. But an account of general ability ought not treat actual success as a sufficient condition for having a general ability. The plausibility of this diagnosis will depend on an issue already raised, namely whether we ought to regard the distinction between specific and general ability as a genuine one. (A rather different diagnosis is suggested by Mele 2002, who suggests that there are several kinds of specific ability, and that this sort of distinction may be drawn within the realm of specific ability.)

3. Hypothetical theories of ability

The bulk of theories of ability that have been defended in the historical and contemporary literature have been what we might call hypothetical theories. On such views, to have an ability is for it to be the case that one would act in certain ways if one were to have certain volitions. One arrives at different theories depending on how one understands the volitions in question and how exactly these actions would hypothetically depend on them, but nonetheless these views constitute something like a unified family. Given their prominence and unity, it is natural to begin our survey of theories of ability with them.

3.1 “The conditional analysis”

The most prominent hypothetical theory of ability is what has come to be called “the conditional analysis.” In this section, we will survey that form of analysis, the problems for it, and alternatives to it that are supposed to overcome those problems.

“The conditional analysis” of ability, as it has come to be called, has at least two aspects. First, S has an ability to A just in case a certain conditional is true of him. Second, that conditional has the following form: S would A if S were to have a certain volition. The precise form such an analysis will take will depend on, first, how we interpret this conditional and, second, which volition figures in the antecedent.

It has been standard in the literature, when this first question has been raised, to understand the conditional as a subjunctive conditional (Ginet 1980), and we will assume in what follows that this is the best form of the conditional analysis. There has been some disagreement about whether it is a might or a would conditional that is relevant (for an account of this distinction, see Lewis 1973, 21–24), as well as about which volition is relevant. In the following we will take the relevant conditional to be a would conditional, and the relevant volition to be trying, though nothing will hang on these selections, and the points to be raised would apply also to other forms of conditional analysis, mutatis mutandis.

We thus arrive at the following form of the conditional analysis:

(CA) S has the ability to A iff S would A if S tried to A.

If (CA) were true, it would constitute a theory of ability in that it would say under exactly what conditions some agent has the ability to perform some action without making reference to the idea of ability itself. (Note that a variant on (CA) that is sometimes discussed, according to which S has the ability to A iff S could A if S tried to A, would not meet this standard, since the “could” seems to make a claim about S's abilities. So such a view is not really a conditional analysis. Indeed, it is not even clear that it involves a genuine conditional, for reasons discussed in Austin 1970: 211–213).

The conditional analysis so understood has been subject to a fair amount of criticism, which will be reviewed in the following section. It bears noting, however, just how apt an account of ability it seems at first pass. It satisfies, at least at first approximation, the extensional constraints: there are many actions with respect to which a typical agent satisfies the relevant conditional, and also many actions with respect to which he does not, and these roughly correspond to his abilities. This imposes a demand even on those who wish to reject (CA), namely to explain why, if (CA) is simply false, it so closely approximates to the truth about abilities.

Its approximate satisfaction of the extensional constraints is also plausibly a reason why something like (CA) has found so many thoughtful advocates. It is at least strongly suggested, for example, by the following remarks from Hume's Enquiry:

For what is meant by liberty, when applied to voluntary actions? We cannot surely mean that actions have so little connexion with motives, inclinations, and circumstances, that one does not follow with a certain degree of uniformity from the other, and that one affords no inference by which we can conclude the existence of the other. For these are plain and acknowledged matters of fact. By liberty, then, we can only mean a power of acting or not acting, according to the determinations of the will; this is, if we choose to remain at rest, we may; if we choose to move, we also may. Now this hypothetical liberty is universally allowed to belong to every one who is not a prisoner and in chains. (8.1; Hume 1748, 72)

Of course, Hume and many of those who have followed him have been attempting to do something rather more than to offer a theory of ability. Hume's intent was to show that disputes over “question of liberty and necessity, the most contentious question of metaphysics” have been “merely verbal” (8.1; Hume 1748, 72). Whatever we may think of this striking claim, however, there is a dialectical gap between it and the alleged truth of (CA). To anticipate a theme that will be central in what follows, we must be careful to distinguish between, on the one hand, the adequacy of various views of ability and, on the other, the more contentious metaphysical questions about freedom to which they are doubtlessly related. It is the former that will be our concern in this section.

3.2 Problems for the conditional analysis

(CA) says that satisfying a certain conditional is both sufficient and necessary for having a certain ability. There are two kinds of counterexamples that may be brought against (CA): counterexamples to its sufficiency, and to its necessity. Let us take these in turn.

Counterexamples to the sufficiency of (CA) have been most prominent in the literature. Informally, they are suggested by the question: “but could S try to A?” There are a variety of ways of translating this rhetorical question into a counterexample. We may distinguish two: global counterexamples, according to which (CA) might always get the facts about ability wrong, and local counterexamples, according to which (CA) might sometimes get the facts about ability wrong.

Begin with global counterexamples. Let us say that determinism is true at our world. Familiar arguments purport to show that, if this is the case, then no one has the ability to do anything, except perhaps for what he actually does (for several developments of such an argument, see van Inwagen 1983, 55–105). But if (CA) is true, then agents would have the ability to perform various actions that they do not actually perform. For it is plausible that the conditionals in terms of which (CA) analyzes ability would still be true in a deterministic world. But then, since it makes false predictions about such a world, which for all we know may be our own, (CA) is false.

The difficulties involved in this sort of counterexample are clear. The proponent of (CA) will reject the arguments for the incompatibility of ability and determinism as unsound. Indeed, it is precisely his thought that such arguments are unsound that has typically led him to take ability to be analyzed in terms like those of (CA). So global counterexamples, while they may be successful, are dialectically ineffective relative to the range of questions that are at issue in the debates over ability.

It seems, however, that we can show that (CA) is false even relative to premises that are shared between various disputants in the free will debates. This is what is shown by local counterexamples to (CA). One such example is given by Keith Lehrer:

Suppose that I am offered a bowl of candy and in the bowl are small round red sugar balls. I do not choose to take one of the red sugar balls because I have a pathological aversion to such candy. (Perhaps they remind me of drops of blood and … ) It is logically consistent to suppose that if I had chosen to take the red sugar ball, I would have taken one, but, not so choosing, I am utterly unable to touch one. (Lehrer 1968, 32)

Such an example shows that (CA) is false without assuming anything contentious in debates over freedom. It turns rather on a simple point: that psychological shortcomings, just as much as external impediments, may undermine abilities. (CA), which does not recognize this point, is therefore subject to counterexamples where such psychological shortcomings become relevant. We may, if we like, distinguish “psychological” from “non-psychological” ability, and claim that (CA) correctly accounts for the latter (this sort of strategy is suggested, for example, by Albritton 1985). But our ordinary notion of ability, that of which we are attempting to give a theory, seems to involve both psychological and non-psychological requirements. And if that is correct, then Lehrer's example succeeds as a counterexample to (CA) as a theory of our ordinary notion of ability.

Counterexamples to the necessity of (CA) have been less frequently discussed (though see Wolf 1990), but they also raise important issues about ability. Consider again Austin's golfer. Earlier we considered the case where a poor golfer makes a difficult putt. But consider now the case where a good golfer misses an easy putt. Given that this golfer tried to make the putt and failed to, it is false that he would have made the putt if he had tried to; after all, he did try it and did not make it. (This thought is vindicated by standard views of subjunctive conditionals; see Bennett 2003, 239). But, as a good golfer, he presumably had the ability to make the putt. So this seems to be a case where one can have an ability without satisfying the relevant conditional, and hence a counterexample to the necessity of (CA).

Here the defender of (CA) might avail himself of the distinction between specific and general abilities. (CA), he might say, is an account of what it is to have a specific ability: that is, to actually be in a position to perform an action. The golfer does lack this ability in this case, as (CA) correctly predicts. It is nonetheless true that the golfer has the general ability to sink putts like this. But (CA) does not purport to be an analysis of general ability, and as such is compatible with the golfer having that sort of ability. Again, the plausibility of this response will hang on the viability of the distinction between specific and general abilities.

We have seen that (CA) faces serious problems, especially as a sufficient condition for ability, even once we set to one side contentious claims about freedom and determinism. If this is correct, then (CA) must either be modified or rejected outright. Let us first consider the prospects for modification.

3.3 The conditional analysis: some variations

The guiding idea of hypothetical accounts is that abilities are to be defined in terms of what someone would do were he in certain psychological conditions. There are a number of ways of developing this idea that do not fit into the form of (CA). At least two such proposals deserve attention here.

Donald Davidson takes concerns about the sufficiency of (CA), especially as developed in Chisholm 1964, to tell decisively against it. More specifically, he takes the lesson of this problem to be is that:

The antecedent of a causal conditional that attempts to analyze ‘can’ or ‘could’ or ‘free to’ must not constrain, as its dominant verb, a verb of action, or any verb which makes sense of the question, Can someone do it? (Davidson 1980, 68)

Davidson suggests that we may overcome this difficulty at least by endorsing:

A can do x intentionally (under the description d) means that if A has desires and beliefs that rationalize x (under d), then A does x. (Davidson 1980, 68)

Davidson proceeds to consider a number of further problems for this proposal and for the causal theory of action generally, but he takes it to suffice at least to overcome standard objections to the sufficiency of (CA).

The trouble is that it is not at all clear it does so. For these objections did not essentially depend on a verb of action figuring in the antecedent of the analyzing conditional. Consider Lehrer's case again. It seems true that if Lehrer has desires and beliefs that rationalized that action under the description “eating a red candy”—namely, adopting the analysis of Davidson 1963, a desire for a red candy and a belief that this action is a way of eating a red candy—he would eat a red candy. But the trouble is precisely that, in virtue of his psychological disability, he is incapable of having this desire, and so cannot perform this action intentionally. For this reason it does not seem that Davidson's proposal successfully overcomes the sufficiency problem, at least not on Lehrer's way of developing that problem.

A second and rather different approach to modifying (CA) has been taken in recent work by Christopher Peacocke. Peacocke accepts that (CA) is insufficient in light of counterexamples like Lehrer's. But he argues that we might supplement (CA) in order to overcome these difficulties. In the terms of the present discussion, Peacocke's proposal is: S has the ability to A just in case: (i) (CA) is true of S and (ii) the possibility in which S tries to A is a “close” one. The closeness of a possibility as it figures in (ii) is to be understood, at first pass, in terms of what we can reasonably rely on: a possibility is a distant one just in case we can reasonably rely on it not obtaining; otherwise it is a close one (Peacocke 1999, 310). To modify one of Peacocke's examples, the possibility of toxic fumes being released into a train car that is safely insulated is a distant one; on the other hand, the possibility of toxic fumes being released into a train car where they just happen to be blocked by a fortuitous arrangement of luggage is a close one.

Peacocke's thought is that this suffices to overcome the sufficiency objection: though Lehrer's agent satisfies (i), he does not satisfy (ii): given the facts about his psychology, the possibility that he tries to A is not a close one. The trouble, however, is that Peacocke's proposal is subject to modified versions of Lehrer's counterexample. Consider an agent whose aversion to red candies is not a permanent feature of his psychology, but an unpredictable and temporary “mood.” Consider the agent at some time when he is in his aversive mood. This agent satisfies (i), for the same reason as above, and he also satisfies (ii): given the fragility of his mood, the possibility of his trying is a close one in the relevant sense. Yet such an agent lacks the ability to eat a red candy, in precisely the same way as he does in Lehrer's original example.

It is an interesting question how we might develop other “supplementation” strategies for (CA) (such strategies are also suggested by Ginet 1980). But the worry is that unless the supplemental clause entails having an ability, it may be satisfied though the agent lacks the relevant ability. It is for this reason that the prospects for this sort of proposal look dim.

4. Non-hypothetical theories of ability

There is a surprising disconnect between the way abilities have been discussed in the philosophical literature that grows out of Hume and the way that they have been approached in more recent work in logic and linguistics. Here hypothetical approaches have had relatively little influence. Rather, abilities have been understood in terms of categorical possibility claims. This section provides an overview of this rather different way of developing a theory of ability.

4.1 Restricted possibility

Intuitively, claims about ability are claims about possibility. This was arguably implicit in the proposals discussed above, which took claims about ability to be reducible to claims about subjunctive conditionals. For the truth-conditions of such conditionals are plausibly given by facts about what would be the case in certain possible scenarios. The approaches to be canvassed in this section pursue a more direct connection between ability and possibility. On such views, ability is to be understood in terms of restricted possibility.

What does this mean? Begin with the thought that for S to have an ability to A it is necessary, but not sufficient, that it be possible that S does A. This claim will be contentious for various more specialized sorts of possibility, such as nomic possibility. But if we may help ourselves to the idea of possibility simpliciter (“metaphysical possibility,” on at least one reading of that phrase), then this claim is a plausible one. (Assuming, at least, that we can reasonably set aside the extreme omnipotence view of Descartes, discussed above at Section 2.1). On the other hand it seems implausible that this sort of possibility is a sufficient condition: there are any number of actions that it is possible for me to do in this unrestricted sense of possibility that I lack the ability to do (again, as noted above at Section 2.1).

This suggests a natural hypothesis. To have an ability is for it to be possible to A in some restricted sense of possibility. As nomic possibility is possibility relative to the laws of nature, and epistemic possibility is possibility relative to what an agent knows, so may ability be possibility relative to some independently specifiable set of conditions. In the language of possible worlds semantics, someone has the ability to A just in case there is an accessible world where he As. The task of giving a theory of ability is then simply the task of articulating the relevant accessibility relation.

One advantage of this hypothesis is that it links our theory of ability closely to a natural semantics for ‘can’. On a view defended by Angelika Kratzer, ‘can’ always expresses a restricted possibility, with the nature of the restriction depending on the contexts (Kratzer 1977; see also Lewis 1983, 246–247). On this view, there would be a natural connection between abilities and all the other properties that might be expressed by the modal auxiliary ‘can.’ This is that ability is simply one restriction on possibility.

4.2 Kenny's objections

There are two questions that might be raised for this proposal about ability. First, is ability indeed a restricted possibility? Second, if it is, how exactly are we to spell out the details of the restriction? This section will consider the first, more basic, question.

Anthony Kenny raises two considerations in favor of a negative answer to the question (Kenny 1975; the presentation of Kenny here is indebted to the discussion in Brown 1988). He argues that, if ability is indeed a restricted kind of possibility, then it should obey the principles that govern the possibility operator in standard modal logics. Kenny claims it fails to satisfy the following two principles:

(1) A → ◊ A.

Informally, (1) expresses the principle that if an agent performs an action, then he has the ability to perform this action. This is, Kenny argues, false of ability.

(2) ◊(AB) → (◊A ∨ ◊B).

Informally, (2) expresses the principle that if an agent has the ability to perform one of two actions, then he has the ability to perform either the first action or the second action. This is, Kenny argues, false of ability.

Let us begin with (1). Kenny claims that this principle is false in light of cases like the following: “A hopeless darts player may, once in a lifetime, hit the bull, but be unable to repeat the performance because he does not have the ability to hit the bull” (Kenny 1975, 136). This sort of counterexample we have already discussed in Section 2.1. There we conjectured that the truth or falsity of this sort of actuality entailment corresponded to the distinction between specific and general abilities. The defender of a restricted possibility account of ability may at this point simply take the strategy suggested there: he is purporting to give an account only of specific, not of general, ability.

But this response is unsatisfactory for two reasons. First, its viability hangs on the viability of the distinction between specific and general abilities, which remains an open matter. Second, even if this distinction is a good one, the restricted possibility view of ability plausibly aspires to be an account ultimately of all ability claims, including claims about general abilities. And if possibility does indeed require this sort of entailment by actuality, then that aspiration is one that could not be satisfied.

A better response denies that modal logics on which (1) is true, namely any system as strong as or stronger than the system T, are the right logics for modeling ability. To deny this is still to allow for a treatment of ability within the possible worlds framework adopted by Kratzer and Lewis. Notably, the modal logic K is not one on which (1) is true. A natural response to Kenny's first point, then, is to say that K, rather than T or some stronger system, is the correct modal logic of ability.

This response is not available, however, in response to Kenny's second objection. Recall that objection was that (2) is true of possibility but not of ability. Here the retreat to weaker modal logics will not work, since (2) is provable on the weakest standard modal logic, namely K. Yet the parallel claim does not seem true of ability. Kenny gives the following example:

Given a pack of cards, I have the ability to pick out on request a card which is either black or red; but I don't have the ability to pick out a red card on request nor the ability to pick out a black card on request. (Kenny 1975, 137)

This then appears to be a case where S has the ability to A or B but lacks the ability to A and lacks the ability to B. So it appears that (2) is false of ability. In light of this Kenny concludes that “if we regard possible worlds semantics as making explicit what is involved in being a possibility, we must say that ability is not any kind of possibility” (Kenny 1975, 140).

It is not clear that this is the only way to go. Mark Brown, for example, has suggested that, if we take accessibility relations to hold between a world and a set of worlds, that we may capture talk of ability within a possible worlds framework that is broadly in the spirit of standard views (Brown 1988). Conversely, we may take this sort of point to militate in favor of a return to hypothetical theories of ability, since, at least on Lewis's view of subjunctive conditionals, it may be that a disjunction follows from a counterfactual claim without either of its disjuncts following from that claim (Lewis 1973, 79–80). In any case, Kenny's objections make clear at least that the project of working out an adequate view of ability as a species of possibility will not be a trivial task.

4.3 The accessibility relation

Let us imagine, however, that we have answered Kenny's objections to our satisfaction. There still remains the second question: how, accepting the idea that ability is restricted possibility, do we spell out the nature of that restriction or, equivalently, the nature of the relation that determines which worlds are “accessible”? This is the question to which we now turn.

Rather than examine the many possible answers to this question, it will be most helpful to consider one answer in some detail. This will at least give us a sense of the general form that a satisfactory answer to the question would have to take. The proposal to be considered is due, again, to Keith Lehrer (Lehrer 1976). Lehrer's proposal centers around the intuitive idea that a person with the ability to A may actually A without gaining any advantage with respect to Aing. (Lehrer is actually offering a semantics for “could have” sentences, but a similar proposal yields, mutatis mutandis, a theory of ability). Thus someone who has the ability to punt a football 40 yards is someone who may punt a football 40 yards without gaining any advantage—such as training in punting, or a strong tailwind. This is one way of distinguishing him from those who lack the ability: they will perform the action only if they gain some such advantage.

Lehrer's proposal is complicated, but a highly simplified version will suffice for present purposes. Let us say that a world w is accessible from the actual world W just in case S has no advantages at w that he lacks at W. This proposal doubtless needs refinement. Perhaps we should restrict the scope of accessible worlds to those that have the same laws as W, as Lehrer does. And we need to allow for some “admissible” differences in advantages between w and W, for example those advantages that are due to S's own actions, as Lehrer also attempts to do. But, assuming these refinements may be successfully made, we have an elegant theory of ability: S has the ability to A iff there is an accessible world where S As, where the accessible worlds are determined by “advantages” in the way just sketched.

A full discussion of Lehrer's proposal is beyond the scope of the present paper. Much will hang, obviously, on how exactly “advantages” and the rule of the admissibility of advantages is to be understood. One particular worry is that the notion of advantage cannot be fully explained without appeal to precisely the notion of ability that is to be analyzed, in which case Lehrer's theory would fail to be a genuinely reductive one at all (see Fischer 1979). This proposal is provided here simply as an instance of the kind of theory that a defender of the relative possibility approach is required to provide, provided that he can overcome the more basic objections to conceiving of ability as possibility raised in the previous section.

There is one further apparent virtue of Lehrer's theory that bears noting. This is that it has the potential to explain the approximate success of hypothetical theories of the sort canvassed earlier. As Lehrer points out: “Usually, a person need no special advantages to choose, or try to perform an action” (Lehrer 1976, 262). This is why the truth of the relevant conditional will normally be sufficient for having an ability: in such a case, there will be an accessible world where the agent performs the action, namely the one in which he chooses to, and does, perform it. But since sometimes choosing does require a “special advantage”—as, for example, in the pathological cases addressed above—the truth of this conditional is not sufficient for there being such a world, and therefore not sufficient, on Lehrer's view, for there being such an ability. As pointed out above, the approximate success of hypothetical theories of ability is a striking fact that ought to be explained by the correct theory of ability. So if Lehrer's explanation here is a good one (which, again, will depend on the open question of whether we can give an adequate account of “advantage”), then this is a mark in favor of this development of a restricted possibility approach to ability.

5. Abilities and the free will debates

Thus far our questions about abilities have been formal ones: we have been asking what it is to have an ability without concerning ourselves with the substantive work that a theory of ability might have to do. But there is much work to be had for a theory of ability: abilities have figured as unexplained explainers in a range of philosophical theories, for example in accounts of concepts (Millikan 2000), of knowledge (Greco 2009), and of “knowing what it's like” (Lewis 1988). Perhaps the most prominent substantive role for a theory of ability, however, has been the uses to which accounts of ability have been put in the free will debates. So let us close with a brief survey of what work a theory of ability might be expected to do in those debates.

5.1 Compatibilism and the theory of ability

Questions about abilities have figured most prominently in debates over compatibilism. “Compatibilism” is used in many ways, but let us understand it here as the thesis that the ability to perform actions one does not perform is compossible with the truth of determinism, which we may take to be the view that the facts about the past and the laws jointly determine the facts about the present and all future moments. (We should sharply distinguish this view, which we might call classical compatibilism, from more recent views such as the “semi-compatibilism” of Fischer and Ravizza 1998). Insofar as compatibilism, so understood, has been explicitly defended, these defenses have made appeal to theories of ability, notably the “conditional analysis” and its variants canvassed above.

There we distinguished between global and local counterexamples to hypothetical theories of ability, where the former appealed to the fact that any such theory would render ability compatible with determinism which, according to the objector, it is not. There we noted the dialectical limitations of such counterexamples, namely the contentiousness of their main premise. But compatibilists have often been guilty of what seems to be the opposite mistake. Namely, they have offered theories of ability which show abilities to be compatible with determinism, and have argued from this to the claim that such abilities are indeed compatible with determinism.

The shortcomings of this strategy are nicely diagnosed by Peter van Inwagen. After surveying the local counterexamples that arise for various hypothetical theories of ability, van Inwagen imagines that we have arrived at the best possible hypothetical theory of ability, which he labels “the Analysis.” van Inwagen then writes:

What does the Analysis do for us? How does it affect our understanding of the Compatibility Problem? It does very little for us, so far as I can see, unless we have some reason to think it is correct. Many compatibilists seem to think that they need only present a conditional analysis of ability, defend it against, or modify it in the face of, such counter-examples as may arise, and that they have thereby done what is necessary to defend compatibilism. That is not how I see it. The particular analysis of ability that a compatibilist presents is, as I see it, simply one of his premisses; his central premiss, in fact. And premisses need to be defended. (van Inwagen 1983, 121)

van Inwagen's point is that, provided the incompatibilist has offered arguments for the claim that such abilities are incompatible with determinism—as, in van Inwagen's presentation, he has—the production of an analysis is as yet no answer to those arguments. For those arguments are also arguments, inter alia, against the compatibilist's favored account of ability.

What is the compatibilist to say in response to van Inwagen's point? One response that is natural is to make a distinction between two kinds of compatibilist project. (Compare Pryor 2000 on responses to skepticism). One project is to convince someone moved by the incompatibilist's arguments to retreat from his position. Call this ambitious compatibilism. For precisely the reasons van Inwagen gives, it is doubtful that any theory of ability will suffice for a defense of ambitious compatibilism. There is another project, however, that the compatibilist might be engaging in. Let us say that, for some reason or other, he himself is not convinced by the incompatibilist's argument. He is still left with an explanatory burden, namely to explain, if only to his own satisfaction, how it could be that abilities are compatible with the truth of determinism. Here the compatibilist's aim is not to convince the incompatibilist of the error of his ways, but simply to work out a satisfactory conception of compatibilism. Let us call this modest compatibilism. This distinction is not often made, and it is not always clear which of these projects classical compatibilists are engaged in. If the latter project is indeed part of classical compatibilism, however, we may grant van Inwagen's point while still granting the theory of ability a central place in defenses of compatibilism. For it may be that, though a theory of ability is of no use to the ambitious compatibilist, it has a crucial role to play in the defense of modest compatibilism.

5.2 “The new dispositionalism”

In recent years several authors have revisited the thought that compatibilism may be defended by a broadly hypothetical theory of ability, but their approach differs in important ways from more traditional approaches. This is the view of compatibilism that has been defended by Michael Smith (Smith 2003), Kadri Vihvelin (Vihvelin 2004), and Michael Fara (Fara 2008). Following Randolph Clarke (Clarke 2009), we may label this view the “new dispositionalism.” Thinking through the new dispositionalism will shed further light on how a theory of ability may figure in a defense of compatibilism.

What unifies the new dispositionalists is that they return to the conditional analysis of ability in light of two thoughts. The first thought is one already noted: that dispositions and abilities are, despite their differences, naturally thought of as members of the same broad ontological category (see Sections 1.1 and 1.2 above). The second thought is that there are well-known problems of giving a conditional analysis of dispositions, in light of which many authors have been inclined to reject the long-assumed link between dispositions and conditionals. Taken together, these thoughts yield a promising new line on abilities: that though we ought to reject the conditional analysis of abilities, we may yet defend a dispositional account of abilities.

Why ought we reject the conditional analysis of dispositions? Consider the following analysis of the disposition to break when struck:

(CD) x is disposed to break when struck iff S would break if S were struck.

Despite the intuitive appeal of (CD), there appear to be at least two kinds of counterexamples to it. First, consider a crystal glass that, if it were about to be struck, would transform into steel. This glass is disposed to break when struck, but it is not true that it would break if struck—the transformation renders this false. This is a case of finking, in the language of Martin 1994. Second, consider a crystal glass stuffed with styrofoam packaging. This glass is disposed to break when struck, but it is not true that it would break if struck—the packaging prevents this. This is a case of masking, in the language of Johnston 1992. In light of such cases, it seems we ought to reject (CD).

The bearing of these points on our earlier discussion of the conditional analysis is the following. There appear to be quite general problems for giving a conditional analysis of dispositions and powers. So it may be that the failures of the conditional analysis of ability were not due to any fact about abilities, but rather to a shortcoming of conditional analyses generally. One way of overcoming this problem, if this diagnosis is correct, is to analyze abilities directly in terms of dispositions.

Such an analysis is proposed by Fara 2008, who claims:

S has the ability to A in circumstances C iff she has the disposition to A when, in circumstances C, she tries to A. (Fara 2008, 848)

The similarity of this analysis to the hypothetical analyses canvassed earlier are clear. This raises several immediate questions, such as whether this analysis can overcome the problem of sufficiency that plagued those approaches (see Fara 2008, 851–852 for an affirmative answer, and Clarke 2009, 334–336 for some doubts). What is most striking about the new dispositionalists, however, is how they bring this sort of account of ability to bear on some cases familiar in the free will debates.

Consider how the new dispositionalism bears on “Frankfurt cases.” These are cases due to Frankfurt 1969, where an agent chooses to and performs some action A while at the same time there is some other action B such that, had the agent been about to choose B, an “intervener” would have altered the agent's brain so that the agent would have chosen, and performed, A instead. One question about such cases is whether the agent, in the actual sequence of events, had the ability to B. Frankfurt's intuition, and that of most others, is that he did not. Given the further claim that the agent is nonetheless morally responsible for doing A, this case appears to be a counterexample to the intuitive principle that an agent is morally responsible for Aing only if he had the ability to perform some action other than A (what Frankfurt dubs the “Principle of Alternate Possibilities”).

The new dispositionalists disagree. Let us focus on Fara's diagnosis of the case. The question of whether the agent had the ability to B turns, for Fara, on the question of whether he was disposed to B when he tried to B. Fara claims, plausibly, that he does have such a disposition. The presence of the intervener is, on Fara's view, like the aforementioned styrofoam packaging in a crystal glass. It masks the disposition of the glass to break when struck, but does not remove that disposition. Similarly, Fara argues, the presence of the intervener masks the agent's disposition to B when he tries to B, but does not remove that disposition. (There is some disagreement among the new dispositionalists about whether this is a case of finking or masking; see Clarke 2009, 340 for discussion). So, pace Frankfurt, the agent does have the ability to B after all. And so we have, in this case at least, no counterexample to the Principle of Alternate Possibilities.

A natural worry at this point is that the new dispositionalist has simply changed the subject. For it seems clear that, at least in the sense of ability that is most central to the free will debates, Frankfurt's agent lacks the ability to do otherwise. An account of ability which denies this seems to be speaking of some other concept altogether. One way of bringing out what is missing is the idea that there seems to be a connection between my abilities, in the sense of ability that is relevant to free will, and what is up to me. Clarke claims, plausibly, that this sort of connection fails on the new dispositionalist view of ability:

Although the presence of a fink or mask that would prevent one's Aing is compatible with having a general capacity (the unimpaired competence to A), there is an ordinary sense in which in such circumstances an agent might well be unable to A … If there is something in place that would prevent me from Aing should I try to A, if it is not up to me that it would so prevent me, and if it is not up to me that such a thing is in place, then even if I have a capacity to A, it is not up to me whether I exercise that capacity. (Clarke 2009, 339)

Thus the objection is that, while the new dispositionalist has perhaps offered a theory of something, it is not a theory of ability, at least insofar as ability is relevant to the free will debates.

How should the new dispositionalist respond? Here it is natural, again, to draw a distinction between two sorts of projects the compatibilist may be undertaking, which we may call descriptive and revisionary compatibilism (compare Strawson 1959, as well as the distinction between “hermeneutic” and “revolutionary” fictionalism in Burgess 1983). The descriptive compatibilist purports to give a theory of ability that vindicates all of our common-sense judgments about ability while also revealing ability to be compatible with the truth of determinism. If this is what the new dispositionalist means to do, there are serious doubts about whether he will succeed, for the reasons just given. But the revisionary compatibilist purports to do something different. He purports to give an account of ability that is both compatible with determinism and vindicates enough of our ordinary judgments about ability to play that role; it is, as it were, the “best deserver” for the “ability role” in a deterministic world. (Compare Jackson 1998, 44–45). If this is how the new dispositionalist project is understood, namely as a defense of compatibilism that is partly revisionary about our ordinary judgments about ability, then it may be that it is robust against some of the objections to it raised above.

5.3 Methodological possibilities

The compatibilist has traditionally appealed to a theory of ability in his defense of compatibilism. We have now surveyed some problems for that strategy. The first is one implicit in the discussion in Sections 3 and 4, namely the difficulty of actually giving an extensionally adequate theory of ability. In this section we have encountered some further problems that arise for the compatibilist even if such a theory were available. First, there is van Inwagen's point, namely that arguments for the incompatibility of abilities and determinism are, inter alia, arguments against any theory of ability that is congenial to the compatibilist. Second, there is the point that we encountered in the discussion of the new dispositionalism, which is that our thinking about ability involves platitudes that appear recalcitrant to compatibilist treatments. Taken together, these points seem to pose a serious obstacle to any theory of ability that is both compatible with determinism and in accord with our ordinary judgments about what ability requires.

Here one recourse available to the compatibilist is to appeal to some of the distinctions between compatibilist projects made above. The appeal to a theory of ability involved in the defenses of classical compatibilism has been both ambitious and descriptive in the senses given above. That is, compatibilists have attempted to give an account of our ordinary notion of ability which reveals that notion to be compatible with determinism. For the reasons already given, there are serious doubts about whether that project can succeed. But we have also seen that that is not the only project available to the compatibilist. The compatibilist may aim for a more modest compatibilism, which shows to his own satisfaction what ability is, and how it can be compatible with determinism. The compatibilist may also aim for a more revisionary compatibilism, which frankly departs from our ordinary thinking about ability and instead introduces a concept of ability which is close to our ordinary concept but is also compatible with determinism. The boundary between these projects is not a sharp one, and it is likely that they will to a certain extent coincide: insofar as our ordinary concept of ability is of something incompatible with determinism, it is likely that any account of ability involved in a modest defense of compatibilism will also be, to that degree, a revisionary one.

Even these compatibilist aspirations, however, may be overly optimistic, or at least premature. For in surveying theories of ability we have turned up serious difficulties, for both hypothetical and non-hypothetical approaches, which do not appear to turn on issues about determinism. So it may be that the best hope for progress is to pursue theories of ability while setting to one side the problems raised in the free will debates. For given the difficulties posed by abilities, and given the significance of theories of ability for areas of philosophy quite removed from the free will debates, there is something to be said for pursuing a theory of ability while embracing, if only temporarily, a certain quietism about the puzzles that determinism may pose.


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action | compatibilism | conditionals | dispositions | incompatibilism (arguments for) | logic (modal)