Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Guidelines and Policies for Entry Content

In this document, we develop guidelines and policies concerning the content of entries written for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

  1. Entry Substance, Style and Length
  2. Writing Your Entry in HTML
  3. Entry Format
  4. Entry Revision
  5. The Use of Footnotes
  6. The Use of Special Symbols

1. Entry Substance, Style, and Length

The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy is intended to serve as an authoritative reference work suitable for use by professionals and students in the field of philosophy, as well as by all others interested in authoritative discussions on philosophical topics. Entries should therefore be scholarly, written with the highest of professional standards, yet strive to be of interest to as wide an audience as possible. Entries should focus on the philosophical issues and arguments rather than on sociology and individuals, particularly in discussions of topics in contemporary philosophy. In other words, entries should be "idea-driven" rather than "person-driven". One indication that the entry is "person-driven" is that the section and subsection titles invoke the names of philosophers; this should be avoided, though the editors may make exceptions if the entry is primarily historical in character. (If in doubt, check with the editors.) Thus, authors should try to structure the entry so as to organize the ideas into common themes and avoid where possible straight historical presentations of "who said what when and why". Biographical entries should be critical and not hagiographical. Authors should strive to minimize the use of jargon.

Entries should be objective/neutral analyses/surveys that offer a broad perspective of the topic rather than advocate a point of view (no matter whether it is widespread or controversial). Authors should see their mission as that of introducing advanced undergraduates (or grad students and colleagues), who may have no special knowledge of the topic, to the main issues and the most important pieces of literature on the topic, so as to bring them to a state where they can read the primary and secondary literature with insight and understanding. Clarity of substance and style should also be one of the most important goals.

Encyclopedia entries should therefore not be idiosyncratic or polemical, but rather strive for balance by presenting the important arguments that have been put forward on both sides of an issue. Controversial claims should be identified as such. Authors should not use the first person pronouns "I" and "my", and should avoid such constructions as "as I have argued (elsewhere/previously/in this essay) …" or "my interpretation of this passage is …", etc. The sources of all quotations should be clearly identified. In addition, authors should avoid reference to unpublished and inaccessible materials. Authors should also be circumspect with respect to the number of references to their own work, though obviously, since they are experts on the topic and typically will have written widely on it, occasional references may be appropriate. The editors of the Encyclopedia will ensure that entries do not overstep the bounds of propriety in this regard.

SEP policy is that authors should not cite their own dissertations. Authors who believe that it is necessary should seek an exception beforehand. The SEP editors will then provide a list of criteria that need to be met and if the author demonstrates that those criteria are satisfied, permission may be given.

The length of entries should depend on the topic. SEP entries now average 10,000 words, but may be somewhat longer if the topic is broad and there is much literature to introduce and explain. Please contact us if the entry is looks like it will grow to more than 12,000 words. We encourage authors to organize longer entries by writing a set of nested, cross-linked documents rather than by writing a single, linear document. By this we mean that overly detailed, highly technical, or highly scholarly material should be put into separate HTML ("supplementary") documents and linked into the main entry. (See below.) In such circumstances the main (index.html) file for the entry should still provide a comprehensive overview of the entire topic. This way, the main entry should become readable by an intelligent undergraduate in a sitting of about an hour or two. More advanced readers can follow the links to the highly technical, detailed or scholarly material. Such a cross-linked set of documents will therefore be accessible to a wide audience. However, authors should create such "nested" entries only if it seems unlikely that a separate entry in the Encyclopedia will be created to discuss the supplementary material.

2. Writing Your Entry in HTML

Because the Encyclopedia is being served over the World Wide Web, all entries must eventually be formatted in the HTML (HyperText Markup Language) document format for delivery over the web. This is the formatting language that controls the way text, graphics, and links are displayed in Web browsers. Entries prepared using other document formats have to be converted to HTML. Normally, the SEP will help authors convert entries prepared in Word, RTF, or LaTeX into HTML. However, authors should be aware that SEP doesn't have the resources to convert especially long entries or entries that have lengthy and detailed mathematical or logical formatting. In these cases, we expect the author to provide some assistance, either by doing the conversion themselves or by reimbursing the SEP for the extra time its document editors must spend converting and formatting the document in HTML. (All our documents are now being prepared so that they parse as valid forms of the version of HTML known "XHTML 1.0 Transitional". This is just HTML 4 written in an XML language.)

Please note that there are special instructions to follow for Entry Revision. See the section on Entry Revision below.

To begin writing an entry, authors should follow our instructions for downloading the sourcefile of the "Entry Template". (These instructions were sent to you when you accepted your commission and they indicate that you can download the template by logging onto the authors web interface, for which you have a login ID and password.) Once the template is downloaded, the author may simply "Open" that file using an HTML-editor. This Entry Template will ensure that there is a uniform entry style, which is described below, in the section on "Entry Format".

For those authors who prefer to create an HTML sourcefile directly, without the assistance of an HTML-editor, our instructions indicate how to obtain the "Annotated Sourcefile", which is to be edited with a "plain text editor". After downloading the sourcefile, authors can replace the sample text in this file with their own content. This will minimize the number of HTML commands authors will need to learn.

Note that it is easy to create a link from your main entry to supplementary documents containing overly technical or scholarly material that would interfere with the presentation of the main ideas. To create a link from the main document to a supplementary document, suppose that the main document is entitled "index.html" and the supplementary document is entitled "supplement.html". Now suppose that at the end of a paragraph, you wish place a labeled link to the supplementary document. Here is what the link might be displayed as:

... . We discuss this last point in further detail in the following supplementary document:
Supplement on [Title of Supplement]

Authors using an HTML-editor will have to use the functions provided by their software to create such a link. However, authors who can edit their HTML sourcefiles directly would insert the following HTML code in order to produce this link to the supplementary document: the following supplementary document.
<a href="supplement.html" name="return-1">Supplement on [Title of Supplement]</a>

Note that this can be done in other places in your main document, if you have more than one supplementary document. (You will have to name your supplements as "supplement1.html", "supplement2.html", etc.) You can find the sourcefile for the supplement template here (use the View Source function of your browser after following this link).

3. Entry Format

The Entry Template and Annotated Sourcefile are formatted in HTML so that the following divisions are preserved in every entry:

These are discussed in turn.


The Introduction should contain a brief definition of the subject. This may take one or two paragraphs, and if possible, these paragraphs should contain some statement of the subject's interest and significance. The main topics to be covered in the body of the entry may be mentioned here, so that the reader will get some idea of what is to follow.

Internal Links

The internal links should be a list of the main sections of the entry, and each item in the list should be a link to that section. The HTML commands needed to do this are included in the template and in the annotated sourcefile.

Main Sections

The sectioning of the entry is at the discretion of the author. However, we encourage authors to include a Chronology or "Life" section in Biographical entries. Moreover, a "History" section is called for in the discussion of many topics.


SEP House Style for Bibliographies

Please use the following bibliographic format:

With this style of Bibliography, you can then cite these sources in your main text in the following ways, with placement of parentheses dependent on whether you are referring to the author, the work, or both:

Please note that we strive to eliminate the use of dates that would mislead the reader into thinking that work is published much later. So please avoid such anachronisms as "Plato 1962", "Locke 1950", etc. Instead, in the case of works of Plato, Aristotle, etc., for which publications dates are not known, please just cite the title of the work. E.g., In a sentence discussing one of Plato's dialogues, you can simply cite "(Parmenides, 132a-b)", and then list this in the Bibliography as:

Similarly, cite sections of Locke's Essay by section number rather than by page number, so that those with other editions can find the passage you cite. So, for example, to cite Locke's Two Treatises of Government, you could refer to it as "Locke 1689" in the text (using the original year of publication), and then include the following listing in the Bibliography:

Please also note: (1) The Bibliography section may be divided into subsections such as Primary Literature and Secondary Literature, or References Cited and Other Important Works, etc. and (2) The Bibliography is reserved primarily for refereed material, whether print-based or on the web.

Citations to Online Materials

Citations to online materials require special handling. If a journal article appears in an electronic journal that isn't printed, then a full URL should be identified. E.g., you would reference Alexander George's entry in the Philosopher's Imprint as follows:

However, sometimes, an article is primarily in a print-based journal. That journal may have an online version, or the journal doesn't have an electronic version but instead the author has put a preprint at an archive site or on his own web page. We encourage authors to create links to online versions of refereed, published material, even if the only version online is a preprint of something that has been published. In these cases, a URL need not be identified explicitly (since the print publication information will suffice), but a specially annotated link should be included, as follows:

  1. Links which lead to online versions of a published paper or book at the publisher's website, should be annotated "[Reprint available online]" or "[Available online]". These are independent archival versions, and any changes to the articles must conform with the policies of the publisher. Note that the SEP accepts links only to material that is freely available on the web.
  2. Links which lead to online preprints of a published paper at an independent archive site should be annotated "[Preprint available online]". Since the preprint site is an independent archive, the author must conform to their policies for making changes to the preprinted articles.
  3. Links which lead to online preprints or reprints of a published article at the author's website should be annotated "[Preprint available from the author]" or "[Reprint available from the author]", respectively. This applies even to PDF reprints sent to the author from the publisher and hosted on the author's site, or scanned versions which the author has made of material published elsewhere. The reader should know that this is not an independent "archival" version. In cases where it is unclear whether the author's web site is serving a preprint or a reprint, the default annotation should be "[Preprint available from the author]".

None of the above applies if the article to be cited is not published or forthcoming in a refereed journal. In such cases, if the online material is simply self-archived (possibly on a preprint site such as or on the author's home page), then the citation information for references to those articles should be put into the Other Internet Resources section of the entry, possibly in a special "Preprint" section.

How to Cite SEP Entries in the Bibliography

Sometimes, an author will have occasion to cite another SEP entry in the Bibliography, as opposed to just listing other SEP entries in the Related Entries section. (For example, if an author quotes a passage from another SEP entry.) Proper citation of SEP entries in the Bibliography should follow our citation guidelines, which indicate that one should cite only an "archived" versions of an SEP entry. To cite an SEP entry in your Bibliography, such as Andrew Irvine's entry on Bertrand Russell, you would list it as follows:

Other Internet Resources

The author should cite material on the web that is of excellent value but which may not have undergone a referee process. The author serves as referee for these materials (and our subject editors will referee these choices). The items listed in this section can be segregated into subsections, such as:


Other Sources

To complete this section, authors are encouraged to conduct an on-line search of the Web for webpages and websites with high-quality, academic content on the topic in question. Such webpages and websites should be written and maintained by qualified individuals having a clear expertise on the topic. The task of finding such external websites is made considerably simpler by using one of the premier search engines which rank sites on the basis of the number of links to them on the web (i.e., these links are like web citations). The best engines we know of are:

One other place to look for academically interesting web sites is <>. Please do not create links to websites that are not maintained by qualified individuals. In addition, authors should not link to their own homepages or to their own list of online publications, though if you have an online publication that is relevant to your topic, it may be appropriate to include a link to it along with other online papers that are relevant to the topic. (Remember that the Bibliography section is reserved for refereed publications and so if your online paper has also been refereed and published somewhere, it should be included in the Bibliography, if cited in the body of your entry, and not in the Other Internet Resources section.) Again, our subject editors will check that self-citations are within the bounds of propriety.

Related Entries

Please list the names of the most important concepts and philosophers that occur in your entry. You may list keywords that do not appear as topics in our Table of Contents if you feel that they are important. We are running software which will notice the discrepancy and alert the Editor. A decision will be made whether or not to include a new entry on that topic. If we decide that the topic is too specialized or otherwise inappropriate for the Encyclopedia, we will eliminate this keyword from your list in the Related Entries section.

If you would like to create the links to related entries yourself, then here is how you proceed. (This only works for published entries, since you won't be able to discover the canonical directory (folder) names for projected but unpublished entries.) Say you are writing an entry on Frege and you wish to create a link to the entry on Davidson in the Related Entries section. The line in the HTML sourcefile which does this will look like this:

<a href="../davidson/">Davidson, Donald</a>

The part of the code which creates the link is the bit:

<a href="...">...</a>

You fill in the first ellipsis with the location of the file you want to link to, and you fill in the second ellipsis with the label on the link you want a web browser to display. In the example, the location of the entry on Davidson is "../davidson/". (The string "davidson" here is the canonical name of the directory containing the entry on Davidson.) This is server code which tells the browser to request the default file in the directory "davidson" which appears in the parent directory ("../") of the current directory. In our example, since we are writing on Frege, we assume that the current directory contains the entry on Frege and so if the browser goes to the parent directory (which is the "entries" directory containing all the entries) and then down to the "davidson" directory, it will find the default file.

Now you can find out that the canonical name of the directory containing the entry on Davidson by visiting the entry on Davidson in the Encyclopedia. When you reach it, you will see that the URL is:

The last field of this string is "davidson", and that is the canonical name of the directory containing the entry on Davidson.

4. Entry Revision

Once an entry has been published, authors should no longer use Word, or an HTML-editor (with two exceptions, see below) to revise the file. The HTML in published SEP entries has been carefully formatted so that it parses as valid at Word and other HTML-editors (with few exceptions) will damage the HTML, for they will rewrite our internationally compliant HTML with lots of junk and HTML that fails international standards. Please DO NOT REVISE by downloading your entry, opening it in Word, revising, and then saving as a webpage. That will completely corrupt the file. Please follow the instructions below.

Because the Encyclopedia is designed to be a dynamic reference work, authors are responsible for maintaining and periodically updating their entries. Specifically, authors are expected: (1) to update their entries regularly, especially in response to important new research on the topic of the entry, and (2) to revise their entries in a timely way in light of any valid criticism they receive, whether it comes from the subject editors on our Editorial Board, other members of the profession, or interested readers. In connection with (1), authors should update the Bibliography and the Other Internet Resources sections of their entries regularly, to keep pace with significant new publications, both in print and on the web. In connection with (2), the validity of criticism shall be determined by the Editor, typically in consultation with the relevant members of the Editorial Board. The length of time required for a "timely" revision will be negotiable and will both respect the author's current commitments and reflect the seriousness of the criticism. However, entries which require revision but which are not revised within the negotiated timetable may be retired from the active portion of the Encyclopedia and left in the Encyclopedia Archives until such time as the entry is revised so as to engage the valid criticisms in question.

Making Minor Modifications:

There is a preferred, recommended, and easy to use protocol for making minor changes to your entry. If you would like to add/revise a paragraph, add an item to the Bibliography, fix a typo, etc., then the proper procedure to follow is to log in to our Author Area:

and initiate the action "Revise Entry on Server". This will allow you to directly edit a copy of your entry on our machine (from whichever browser you are using). There is an Instructions/Help file for using this software. However, as you will see, when you use the Revise Entry function, you will be prompted to select the file you wish to edit. In most cases, you will select the main document, which is called "index.html" (some entries have multiple files, e.g., a main document "index.html" and supplementary documents). Once you have made your selection, a new window will open on your browser and you will be presented with a page on which the file you wanted to edit is divided up into segments, each containing a "View" box and an "Edit" box. You will find the material you wish to edit in the View box, since the text in this box is rendered, or formatted, HTML. Then you edit in the corresponding "Edit" box, which contains the HTML sourcefile (which is plain text with markup tags). It should be clear how add content in the Edit box. Please do not cut and paste from a Word document or a Word-generated HTML document into the Edit box unless you are sure that (1) you have configured Word to serve as a plain text editor and (2) you are not pasting corrupted HTML code into the Edit box. You can cut and paste in HTML code, but you should be able to see the code itself and determine that it is simple HTML and not something that looks complicated and ugly.

Every so often, you should SAVE your work, using the Save buttons at the left or at the top of the page. You may SAVE your work without submitting it for review, but when you believe you have completed the revisions you need to make, use the Save/Submit option, or return to the authors main menu page and use the Submit/Resubmit Privates Files to Editor function.

The above procedure will work for most major, as well as minor modifications. If you wish to make a structural change to your entry, then the editors would be happy to help you reorganize the HTML in the file. They can create new sections and rearrange others. They can get the file into a state where you can then use the Revise Entry on Server function.

Please note: If you are revising your entry, and you want to add or delete a footnote, you do not need to renumber the footnotes by hand. We have a script which will do this automatically. Please simply bring it to our attention and we renumber the notes for you.

Making Major Modifications:

In cases where authors plan to make major modifications to their entries, it may be acceptable for the author to download the file and work on it using software on his/her own computer. There are only two conditions under which it is acceptable to follow such a procedure. (1) If you know the difference between a simple (plain-) text editor and an HTML-editor, and you know that your simple text editor can be used to edit the raw HTML as plain text without damaging or rewriting the HTML, then you may use the Download Existing Entry File function, edit the file using your simple text editor in plain text mode, save as plain text, and then reupload the file. It would be prudent to set up a test with the editors to check that your plain text editor is not damaging the file, for if you damage the file, you will have to redo your changes.

(2) Authors will be permitted to download the file and use Dreamweaver or Nvu ( / KompoZer ( to edit their files. But please first contact the editors, so they can set up a test to determine whether you can edit the file without damaging it. Most HTML-editors, such Word, Netscape Composer, Front Page, etc., do not follow international standards for producing correct HTML. Some add irrelevant tags, or create HTML that can't be easily parsed and indexed for information retrieval, or add non-ASCII characters to the file; others rewrite our internationally compliant HTML, following their own conception of how HTML should be written. We want to avoid the situation where the work we have done to put your entry into clean, internationally compliant HTML, is lost by the simple act of saving that file in one of these non-compliant HTML-editors. Dreamweaver and Nvu are exceptions, however. Dreamweaver is expensive, but many universities will own a site license for it. Nvu is freely available from and KompoZer is freely available from

Before using Nvu or Kompozer please make sure the Preferences are set to "Retain original source formatting" and, under the Advanced settings, make sure that the Markup is set to XHTML 1 and Transitional instead of HTML 4 and Strict. Finally, the Special Characters setting should be "HTML4 special characters".

5. The Use of Footnotes

Footnotes may be included. Then can often help to shorten the main page of the entry, to make it more readable. Please note, however, that they should not be used solely for citations, or even lists of citations. All citations should be included in the main text in parentheses, in the following format: (Author Year, page). Multiple citations should be separated by a semicolon. The footnotes themselves should be put into a separate html file called "notes.html" and these should be placed into the same directory on as the entry. If you are using an HTML-editor to create your entry, then you will need to use the functions provided by your software in order to create footnotes as links to a footnote file.

However, for those authors who wish to edit their HTML sourcefile directly in order to create links from the text to the footnotes, here are some guidelines to follow. Suppose you want to add footnote number x at a point in the text:

...some text.[x]

To produce this in your HTML sourcefile, use the following HTML code at the point in the text where the footnote should occur:

...some text.<sup>[<a href="notes.html#x" name="note-x">x</a>]</sup>

This will place "[x]" as a superscript in the text, with "x" a link to the place in the notes.html file identified as name="x" (see below). The name="note-x" marks the spot in the current file to which a "Return" link from the notes.html file will return (again, see below). Then, create another HTML file named "notes.html" and in that file you will try to produce something that looks like this:

x. Begin the body of the footnote here.

To produce this line in the notes.html file, you would add the following HTML code:

<a href="index.html#note-x" name="x">x.</a> Begin the body of the footnote.

This will start a new paragraph, start the footnote with the symbols "x." ("x." will be a link back to name="note-x" in the main index.html file; the name="x" identifies the place in the notes.html file to which the footnote in the main text will be linked). Note: Users of the Encyclopedia can always use the "Back" or "Return" button on their browsers to get back to the text.

Please note: If you are revising your entry, and you want to add or delete a footnote, you do not need to renumber the footnotes by hand. We have a script which will do this automatically. Please simply bring it to our attention and we renumber the notes for you.

6. The Use of Special Symbols

We have adopted the "XHTML 1.0 Transitional" markup language as the standard for formatting Encyclopedia entries. In addition, we allow the use of widely-supported Unicode characters. We have drawn up a page of symbols which we believe to be widely supported among current web browsers, though many do not work with older browsers and/or older operating systems (and this is noted at the top of every entry in the SEP which uses one of these special characters).

So, if you need special punctuation characters, special accented Latin characters, Greek characters, logic and/or mathematical symbols, Polish characters, etc., please visit our page:

Widely Supported XHTML/HTML4 and Unicode Characters

Note that you can use the formatting code that appears in either the 2nd or 3rd column of this table in your HTML source file.

There are various tricks one can use in HTML for formatting these symbols in the complicated ways needed by logicians and mathematicians. For example, to get a web browser to display the word "Gödel" properly, note that you will find "ö" (= "&#246;") in the list of Latin Characters (in the section by that name on the webpage listed above). It indicates that you can get the browser to display the umlauted character by placing either the character entity "&ouml;" or "&#246;" in your text. Thus, to produce the word "Gödel", you place the expression "G&ouml;del" or "G&#246;del" in your HTML source file.

We have set up table that shows you the HTML codes to use for more sophisticated kinds of mathematical and logical formatting. Please have a look at:

Mathematics HTML Sampler

As another example, note that the "set membership" relation ∈, the logical symbols ∀, ∃, and ≡, and the Greek symbol φ can all found in the list of symbols on our page Widely Supported XHTML/HTML4 and Unicode Characters. Now to produce the formatted line:

xy(yxyA & φ)

use the following sequence of HTML markup in your entry, where <em> … </em> is the formatting environment for italics:

&exist;<em>x</em>&forall;<em>y</em>(<em>y</em>&isin;<em>x</em> &equiv; <em>y</em>&isin;<em>A</em> &amp; &phi;)

In some cases, however, the symbol you will need is not widely supported in web browsers. This holds true for such symbols as

proves,   models,   doesn't prove,   doesn't model,   calM, etc.

Therefore, if you do not find the symbol you need on our page Widely Supported XHTL/HTML4 and Unicode Characters, have a look at the page:

Special Symbols Not Widely Supported

For example, we have produced the following graphics for the "calligraphic M" and the "models" sign, respectively:


These symbols can be found on the Special Symbols Not Widely Supported page and you can download them onto your machine from there. Follow the links to "calM.gif" and "models.gif" in the table of special symbols. You can then save those graphics onto the drive of your local computer.

If you are using an HTML-editor to create your entry, then you simply use your software's "add image" ("add graphic") function to place these graphics on a line in your entry. However, those authors who are editing their HTML sourcefiles directly should use the following guidelines. To produce the formatted line:

calM models φ

place the files "calM.gif" and "models.gif" into the directory containing your HTML entry and use the following HTML code in your entry:

<img src="calM.gif" alt="calligraphic M" /> <img src="models.gif" alt="models" /> &phi;

Note that you will not need to transfer the graphics to the same directory on when you transfer your entry to us — the first time you view your file on our server after uploading it, our software will recognize the links to our graphics and it will automatically install copies of the needed graphic files into your upload directory.

You may use any graphic found in our symbols page in this way. If you need a symbol not found on that page, write to the editor—they are easily constructed.