Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Max Weber

1. In Weber’s discussion of modern selfhood, then, we see a reflection of the origin of one of the great paradoxes of modern philosophy. The philosophy of engagement and objectification has helped create a picture of a human being, at its most extreme in certain forms of materialism, from which the last vestiges of subjectivity seem to have been expelled. It is a picture of a human being seen completely from a third-person perspective. The paradox is that this severe outlook is connected with – indeed based on – attributing a central place to the first-person stance. Radical objectivity is intelligible and accessible only through radical subjectivity, which has been of course much commented on by Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty. Such a paradoxical interplay between introspective self-reflexivity and instrumental objectification of the self and mastery of the world constitutes the modern “inward turn” as Charles Taylor calls it [Taylor 1989]. It is also salient in the psychological dynamics that Weber captured with his genealogical construction of the Puritan Berufsmensch as the ideal-typical moral agency that has spawned the modern world.