Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Trust

1. Other uncontroversial elements of trust are that trust can be unconscious or tacit (Lagerspetz 1998) and that trust and distrust are “contraries but not contradictories; between them lies a neutral space” (Jones 1996, 16). Elements of trust that specifically concern its epistemology, its value, or what sort of mental attitude it is appear under The Epistemology of Trust, The Value of Trust, and Trust and the Will, respectively.

2. Accounts of trust as a three-place relation can vary. For example, Baier describes the relation as “A trusts B with valued item C” (1986); in other words, A entrusts B with C. (For objections to Baier's entrusting model, see Jones 1996, 10, 17-19.) Interestingly, in “Trust and Terror,” Karen Jones objects to “three-place analyses” of trust for failing to account for a basic kind of trust that terror often undermines: what Jones calls “basal trust” (2004).

3. To return to a previous example: a sexist employer might truly care about his female employees, even though his caring attitude is informed by sexist stereotypes about female intelligence. Such stereotypes may prevent him from giving women hard tasks that he thinks would frustrate them, but that they would welcome. His female employees might recognize that he means well, but still fail to trust him.

4. Another proposed replacement is a readiness on the part of the trustee to feel betrayal (Holton 1994).

5. Insofar as they see trustworthiness as a moral disposition, philosophers have modeled it on theories other than Aristotle's. Such theories have included Kant's moral theory and consequentialist moral theory (see e.g. Hardin 2002, 36-40).

6. Points of convergence among philosophical theories of trustworthiness have to do with assumptions they make about the influence of social norms or conventions on who can be trustworthy. Philosophers tend to agree that if society is set up in such a way that it is difficult for people to be trustworthy, people are less likely to be that way. Feminist philosophers tend to agree in particular that in oppressive societies, oppressed people are stereotyped as untrustworthy, making it difficult in many contexts for these people to be trustworthy (because they are rarely trusted) or to be acknowledged as trustworthy (see e.g. Friedman 2004, 228; Webb 1992, 390).

7. For simplicity's sake, I do not distinguish here between trust that is well-grounded and trust that is justified. I assume that to benefit overall from trusting, or from being trusted, the trust only needs to be justified.

8. Another good often associated with trust is language, or the ability to acquire language (Hertzberg 1988, 308; Webb 1993, 260). This good is only available if one can trust people to use words correctly.