Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to Relativism

The Linguistic Relativity Hypothesis

Many linguists, including Noam Chomsky, contend that language in the sense we ordinary think of it, in the sense that people in Germany speak German, is a historical or social or political notion, rather than a scientific one. For example, German and Dutch are much closer to one another than various dialects of Chinese are. But the rough, commonsense divisions between languages will suffice for our purposes.

There are around 5000 languages in use today, and each is quite different from many of the others. Differences are especially pronounced between languages of different families, e.g., between Indo-European languages like English and Hindi and Ancient Greek, on the one hand, and non-Indo-European languages like Hopi and Chinese and Swahili, on the other.

Many thinkers have urged that large differences in language lead to large differences in experience and thought. They hold that each language embodies a worldview, with quite different languages embodying quite different views, so that speakers of different languages think about the world in quite different ways. This view is sometimes called the Whorf-hypothesis or the Whorf-Sapir hypothesis, after the linguists who made if famous. But the label linguistic relativity, which is more common today, has the advantage that makes it easier to separate the hypothesis from the details of Whorf's views, which are an endless subject of exegetical dispute (Gumperz and Levinson, 1996, contains a sampling of recent literature on the hypothesis).

The suggestion that different languages carve the world up in different ways, and that as a result their speakers think about it differently has a certain appeal. But questions about the extent and kind of impact that language has on thought are empirical questions that can only be settled by empirical investigation. And although linguistic relativism is perhaps the most popular version of descriptive relativism, the conviction and passion of partisans on both sides of the issue far outrun the available evidence. As usual in discussions of relativism, it is important to resist all-or-none thinking. The key question is whether there are interesting and defensible versions of linguistic relativism between those that are trivially true (the Babylonians didn't have a counterpart of the word ‘telephone’, so they didn't think about telephones) and those that are dramatic but almost certainly false (those who speak different languages see the world in completely different ways).

A Preliminary Statement of the Hypothesis

Interesting versions of the linguistic relativity hypothesis embody two claims:

Linguistic Diversity:
Languages, especially members of quite different language families, differ in important ways from one another.

Linguistic Influence on Thought:
The structure and lexicon of one's language influences how one perceives and conceptualizes the world, and they do so in a systematic way.

Together these two claims suggest that speakers of quite different languages think about the world in quite different ways. There is a clear sense in which the thesis of linguistic diversity is uncontroversial. Even if all human languages share many underlying, abstract linguistic universals, there are often large differences in their syntactic structures and in their lexicons. The second claim is more controversial, but since linguistic forces could shape thought in varying degrees, it comes in more and less plausible forms.

1. History of the Hypothesis

Like many other relativistic themes, the hypothesis of linguistic relativity became a serious topic of discussion in late-eighteenth and nineteenth-century Germany, particularly in the work of Johann Georg Hamann (1730-88), Johann Gottfried Herder (1744-1803), and Wilhelm von Humboldt (1767-1835). It was later defended by thinkers as diverse as Ernst Cassirer and Peter Winch. Thus Cassirer tells us that

...the distinctions which here are taken for granted, the analysis of reality in terms of things and processes, permanent and transitory aspects, objects and actions, do not precede language as a substratum of given fact, but that language itself is what initiates such articulations, and develops them in its own sphere (1946, p. 12).

But the hypothesis came to prominence though the work of Edward Sapir and his student Benjamin Lee Whorf. Indeed, it is often called the Sapir-Whorf hypothesis, or simply the Whorf hypothesis.

There are connections among some of these writers; for example, Sapir wrote his M.A. thesis on Herder's Origin of Language. Still, this is a remarkably diverse group of thinkers who often arrived at their views by different routes, and so it is not surprising that the linguistic relativity hypothesis comes in a variety of forms.

Sapir and Whorf

It will help to see why the linguistic relativity hypothesis captivated so many thinkers if we briefly consider the more arresting claims of Edward Sapir and Benjamin Lee Whorf. Sapir was an American anthropological linguist who, like so many anthropologists of his day, was a student of Franz Boas. He was also the teacher of Whorf, a businessman and amateur linguist.

Unlike earlier partisans of linguistic relativism, Sapir and Whorf based their claims on first-hand experience of the cultures and languages they described, which gave their accounts a good deal of immediacy. I will quote a few of the purpler passages to convey the flavor of their claims, for this was partly what galvanized the imagination of so many readers.


In a paper published in 1929 Sapir tells us:

Human beings do not live in the objective world alone, nor alone in the world of social activity as ordinarily understood, but are very much at the mercy of the particular language which has become the medium of expression for their society. It is quite an illusion to imagine that one adjusts to reality essentially without the use of language and that language is merely an incidental means of solving specific problems of communication or reflection (1929, p. 209).

Our language affects how we perceive things:

Even comparatively simple acts of perception are very much more at the mercy of the social patterns called words than we might suppose. …We see and hear and otherwise experience very largely as we do because the language habits of our community predispose certain choices of interpretation (p. 210).

But the differences don't end with perception:

The fact of the matter is that the ‘real world’ is to a large extent unconsciously built up on the language habits of the group. No two languages are ever sufficiently similar to be considered as representing the same social reality. The worlds in which different societies live are distinct worlds, not merely the same worlds with different labels attached (p. 209).

The linguistic relativity hypothesis grained its widest audience through the work of Benjamin Lee Whorf, whose collected writings became something of a relativistic manifesto.

Whorf presents a moving target, with most of his claims coming in both extreme and in more cautious forms. Debate continues about his considered views, but there is little doubt that his bolder claims, unimpeded by caveats or qualifications, were better suited to captivate his readers than more timid claims would have been.

When languages are similar, Whorf tells us, there is little likelihood of dramatic cognitive differences. But languages that differ markedly from English and other Western European languages (which Whorf calls, collectively, “Standard Average European” or SAE) often do lead their speakers to have very different worldviews. Thus

We are thus introduced to a new principle of relativity, which holds that all observers are not led by the same physical evidence to the same picture of the universe, unless their linguistic backgrounds are similar, or can in some way be calibrated. …The relativity of all conceptual systems, ours included, and their dependence upon language stand revealed (1956, p. 214f, italics added).

We dissect nature along lines laid down by our native languages. The categories and types that we isolate from the world of phenomena we do not find there because they stare every observer in the face; on the contrary, the world is presented in a kaleidoscopic flux of impressions which has to be organized by our minds--and this means largely by the linguistic systems in our minds (p. 213).

…no individual is free to describe nature with absolute impartiality but is constrained to certain modes of interpretation even while he thinks himself most free (p. 214).

In fairness it must be stressed that these passages come from a single essay, “Science and Linguistics,” of 1940, and in other places Whorf's tone is often more measured. But not always; elsewhere he also says thing like

…users of markedly different grammars are pointed by their grammars toward different types of observations and different evaluations of externally similar acts of observation, and hence are not equivalent as observers but must arrive at somewhat different views of the world (1956, p. 221).

And in yet a third essay “facts are unlike to speakers whose language background provides for unlike formulation of them” (1956, p. 235).

The passages from Sapir and Whorf bristle with metaphors of coercion: our thought is “at the mercy” of our language, it is “constrained” by it; no one is free to describe the world in a neutral way; we are “compelled” to read certain features into the world (p. 262). The view that language completely determines how we think is often called linguistic determinism. Hamann and Herder sometimes seem to equate language with thought, and in these moods, at least, they came close to endorsing this view.

1.1 Linguistic Relativism and Metaphysics

Some writers have linked these themes directly to issues in metaphysics. For example Graham (1989, Appendix 2) argues that there are vast differences among human languages and that many of the concepts or categories (e.g., physical object, causation, quantity) writers like Aristotle and Kant and Strawson held were central, even indispensable, to human thought, are nothing more than parochial shadows cast by the structure of Indo-European languages. These notions, it is said, have no counterparts in many non-Indo-European languages like Chinese. If this is so, then a fairly strong version of the linguistic relativity hypothesis might be true, but the thesis hasn't been backed with strong empirical evidence and the most common views today lie at the opposite end of the spectrum. Indeed, Whorf himself held a similar view:

[Western] Science …has not yet freed itself from the illusory necessities of common logic which are only at bottom necessities of grammatical pattern in Western Aryan grammar; [e.g.,] necessities for substances which are only necessities for substantives in certain sentence positions …(1956, pp. 269-270).

It is worth noting, finally, that although Whorf was certainly a descriptive relativist he was not a normative relativist. He believed that some languages gave rise to more accurate worldviews than others. Indeed, he thought that the Hopi worldview was superior in various ways to that of speakers of Indo-European languages (e.g., 1956, p. 55, p. 262).

2. The Many Versions of Linguistic Relativism

Any serious discussion of the linguistic relativity hypothesis requires us to answer three questions

  1. Which aspects of language influence which aspects of thought in some systematic way?
  2. What form does that influence take?
  3. How strong is that influence?

For example, certain features of syntax or of the lexicon might exert a causal influence on certain aspects of visual perception (e.g., on which colors we can discriminate), classification (e.g., on how we sort things by their color), or long-term memory (e.g., on which differences among colors we remember most accurately) in clearly specifiable ways. If there is such an influence we would also like to know what mechanisms mediate it, but until we have clearer answers to the first three questions, we are not well positioned to answer this.

Human languages are flexible and extensible, so most things that can be said in one can be approximated in another; if nothing else, words and phrases can be borrowed (Schadenfreude, je ne sais quoi). But what is easy to say in one language may be harder to say in a second, and this may make it easier or more natural or more common for speakers of the first language to think in a certain way than for speakers of the second language to do so. A concept or category may be more available in some linguistic communities than in others (e.g., Brown, 1956, pp. 307ff). In short, the linguistic relativity hypothesis comes in stronger and weaker forms, depending on the hypothesized forms and the hypothesized strength of the hypothesized influence.


Various aspects of language might affect cognition.

Languages can differ in their grammar or syntax. To take a simple example, typical word order may vary. In English, the common order is subject, verb, object. In Japanese it is subject, object, verb. In Welsh, verb, subject, object. Languages can differ in whether they make a distinction between intransitive verbs and adjectives. And there are many subtler sorts of grammatical difference as well. It should be noted that grammar here does not mean the prescriptive grammar we learned in grammar school, but the syntactic structure of a language; in this sense, a grammar comprises a set of rules (or some equivalent device) that can generate all and only the sentences of a given language.

Different languages have different lexicons (vocabularies), but the important point here is that the lexicons of different languages may classify things in different ways. For example, the color lexicons of some languages segment the color spectrum at different places.

Different languages have different semantic features (over and above differences in lexical semantics)

Different languages employ different metaphors or employ them in different ways.

It is increasingly clear that context plays a vital role in the use and understanding of language, and it is possible that differences in the way speakers of different languages use their languages in concrete settings affects their mental life.

For the most part discussions of the linguistic relativity hypothesis have focused on grammar and lexicon as independent variables. Thus, many of Whorf's claims, e.g., his claims about the way Hopi thought about time, were based on (what he took to be) large-scale differences between Hopi and Standard Average European that included grammatical and lexical differences (e.g., 1956, p. 158). Subsequence research by Ekkehart Malotki (e.g., 1983) and others suggests that Whorf's more dramatic claims were false, but the important point here is that the most prominent versions of the linguistic relativity hypothesis involved large-scale features of language.


Language might influence many different aspects of thought. Most empirical work has focused, appropriately enough, on those aspects that are easiest to assess without relying on language. This is important, since we otherwise risk finding influences of one aspect of language on some related aspect of language, rather than on some aspect of thought. Commonly studied cognitive variables include perceptual discrimination, availability in memory, and classification.

2.1 Testing the Linguistic Relativity Hypotheses

In light of the vast literature on linguistic relativity hypotheses, one would expect that a good deal of careful experimental work had been done on the topic. It hasn't. Often the only evidence cited in favor of such hypotheses is to point to a difference between two languages and assert that it adds up to a difference in modes of thought. But this simply assumes what needs to be shown, namely that such linguistic differences give rise to cognitive differences. On the other hand, refutations of the hypothesis often target implausibly extreme versions of it or proceed as though refutations of it in one domain (e.g., color language and color cognition) show that it is false across the board.

2.2 Many Versions of the Hypothesis have not been Tested

A linguistic relativity hypothesis says that some particular aspect of language influences some particular aspect of cognition. Many different aspects of language could, for all we know, influence many different aspects of cognition. This means that a study showing that some particular aspect of language (e.g., the color lexicon of a language) does (or does not) influence some particular aspect of cognition (e.g., recognition memory of colors) does not tell us whether other aspects of language (e.g., the lexicon for spatial relations) influence other aspects of cognition (e.g., spatial reasoning). It does not even tell us whether the single aspect of language we focused on affects any aspects of thought besides the one we studied, or whether other aspects of language influence the single aspect of thought we examined.

The point here is not merely a theoretical one. When the mind is seen as all of a piece, whether it's the result of stepping through Piaget's universal stages of development, the output of universal learning mechanisms, or the operation of a general-purpose computer, confirming or disconfirming the hypothesis in one area (e.g., color) might bear on its status in other areas. But there is increasing evidence that the mind is, to at least some degree, modular, with different cognitive modules doing domain specific work (e.g., parsing syntax, recognizing faces) and processing different kinds of information in different kinds of ways. If this is right, there is less reason to expect that findings about the influence of language on one aspect of cognition will generalize to other aspects.

The Upshot

Only a handful of versions of the claim that linguistic feature X influences cognitive feature Y in way Z have ever been tested. Some can doubtless be ruled out on the basis of common sense knowledge or previous investigation. But many remain that have yet to be studied. Moreover, those that have been studied often have not been studied with the care they deserve. A few have, though, and we will now turn to them.

Example: Color Language and Color Cognition

Much of the most rigorous investigation of the linguistic relativity hypothesis involves color language and color cognition. In the 1950s and 60s, this was an area where linguistic relativity seemed quite plausible. On the one hand, there is nothing in the physics of light (e.g., in facts about surface spectral reflectances) that suggests drawing boundaries between colors at one place rather than another; in this sense our segmentations of the spectrum are arbitrary. On the one hand, it was well known that different languages had color terms that segmented the color spectrum at different places. So since nothing in the physics of color could determine how humans thought about color, it seemed natural to hypothesis that color cognition followed the grooves laid down by color language.

Color was also an auspicious object of study, because investigators could use Munsell color chips (a widely used, standardized set of chips of different colors) or similar stimulus materials with subjects in quite different locations, thus assuring that whatever differences they found in their dependent variables really did involve the same thing, color (as anchored in the chips), rather than something more nebulous.

Brent Berlin and Paul Kay's work (1969) on basic color terms did much to raise the quality of empirical work on the linguistic relativity hypothesis. And together with much subsequent work it strongly suggests that the strongest, across-the-board versions of the linguistic relativity hypothesis are false when it comes to color language and color cognition. We now know that colors may be a rather special case, however, for although there is nothing in the physics of color that suggests particular segmentations of the spectrum, the opponent-process theory of color vision, now well confirmed, tells us that there are neurophysiological facts about human beings that influence many of the ways in which we perceive colors. We don't know of anything comparable innate mechanisms that would channel thought about social traits or biological classification of diseases in similarly deep grooves. There may well be cross-cultural similarities in the ways human beings think about these things, but we can't conclude this from the work on color.

3. Innateness and Linguistic Universals

The linguist Noam Chomsky has argued for almost half a century that human beings could only learn natural languages if they had a good deal of innate linguistic equipment to guide their way. He has characterized this equipment in different ways over the years, but the abiding theme is that without it children could never get from the sparse set of utterances they hear to the rich linguistic ability they achieve.

3.1 Poverty of the Stimulus Arguments

In just a few years all normal children acquire the language that is spoken by their family and others around them. They acquire a very complex and virtually unbounded ability to distinguish sentences from non-sentences and to understand and utter a virtually unlimited number of sentences they have never thought of before. The child acquires this ability on the basis of the utterances she hears and the feedback (rarely in the form of corrections) she receives. The problem is that the child's data here are very unsystematic and sparse compared to the systematic and nearly unbounded linguistic competence the child quickly acquires.

Hence, the argument continues, the child needs help to get from this impoverished input to the rich output (the acquisition of a grammar of a complex natural language), and this help can only be provided by something innate that constrains and guides the child in her construction of the grammar. The point is quite general: if the input, or data stream, is exiguous then (barring incredible luck) it is only possible for someone to arrive at the right theory about the data if they have some built-in inductive biases, some predispositions to form one kind of theory rather than another. And since any child can learn any human language, the innate endowment must put constraints on which of the countless logically possible languages are humanly possible.

If the features of human languages are limited by such innate, language-acquisition mechanisms, there is less scope for the large differences among languages that the more extreme linguistic relativists have imagined. But might linguistic universals leave room for less extreme versions of linguistic relativism that are still interesting? That depends on what linguistic devices there are and on their relationships to other cognitive mechanisms.

3.2 Modularity

From the perspective of nativist accounts of language, many of the questions about linguistic relativity boil down to questions about the informational encapsulation of mental modules. To say that a module is encapsulated means that other parts of the mind cannot influence its inner workings (though they can supply it with inputs and use its outputs). What are the implications of this for the linguistic relativist's claim that a person's language can exert a dramatic influence on his perception and thought?

The answer may be different for perception, on the one hand, and the higher mental processes, on the other. For example Jerry Fodor (1984) argues that there is a module (or modules) for visual perception and that information from other parts of the mind cannot influence it in the way that many psychologists have supposed. For example, even though I know that the two lines in the Müller-Lyer illusion

missing text, please inform
Müller-Lyer Illusion

are the same length, I cannot help seeing the line on the left as longer than the line on the right. I know the lengths are the same, but my visual module (or models) does not. It is encapsulated; this information can't get through to it, so it can't influence how I see the figure. If this is so, then linguistic information could not penetrate any vision modules, and so versions of linguistic relativism which hold (as most do) that our language can influence how we see things is wrong.

By contrast, Fodor holds that there is no special module for higher mental processes and, indeed, that we are a long way from having any account of how thinking and reasoning work (e.g., 2000). If this is right, then for all we know now, some aspects of linguistic relativism could be right. The workings of various linguistic modules might influence thought in interesting ways.

It bears stressing that many of the issues involving cognitive architecture are vigorously contested. Among other things, not all champions of modules see them as Fodor does. According to them what is special about visual modules may just be that they process visual information, not that they lack access to other kinds of information (indeed, top-down aspects of perception suggest that they often do have such access). If this is so, there is more room for language to influence perception and other cognitive processes than there is if modules are tightly insulated.

The dust here hasn't begun to settle, but one general moral is clear. If at least moderately strong nativist and modular views of the mind are on the right track--and there is now certainly some reason to think that they are--then many of the empirical issues about linguistic relativity will translate into issues concerning the ways in which various modules can influence one another.

4. Morals for other Independent Variables: Modularity and Encapsulation

We have gone into detail about the linguistic relativity hypothesis, because the main lessons here carry over to the study of the impact of other variables, e.g., culture, on cognition. Some of these emerged above; others are obvious once they are noted. They are

  1. Questions about the impact of a variable on cognition are empirical and causal questions.
  2. Such questions can only be answered with care once we specify which aspects of an independent variable, say culture, influence which aspects of thought and what form that influence takes.
  3. Such hypotheses can vary greatly in specificity, strength, and scope.
  4. Testing a specific version of the hypothesis requires a combination of skills, including those of a good ethnographer, linguist, and experimental psychologist.
  5. A comparison of more than two cultures is needed to draw any firm conclusions.
  6. The truth of specific hypotheses may turn on issues involving the modularity of mind and the degree of modular encapsulation.
  7. If the mind is highly modular, finding an influence of one aspect of language or culture of some aspect of cognition may tell us little about the influence of other aspects of language or culture on cognition.

These lessons are easier with some variables than with others. It is probably easiest with some aspects of language, because a good deal is now known about many of the languages of the world. It will often be more difficult in the case of culture, where things are more difficult to pin down than they are in the case of language. And it will be virtually impossible when history is the relevant variable; here much more speculative interpretations of historical documents may be the best we can do. But the basic point remains. Relativistic claims are empirical causal claims and they can only be settled by empirical evidence.

It is not always easy to strike the proper balance when thinking about empirical work on these matters. On the one hand it is useful to cultivate an “it-can't-be-that-simple” reflex for use when reading an isolated study or two. But on the other hand empirical investigation is the only thing that can answer many of the difficult questions about the complex, entangled processes of language, culture, and thought.

Return to Relativism: §1: A Framework for Relativism
Return to Relativism: §2: Dependent Variables: What is Relative?
Return to Relativism: §3: Independent Variables: Relative to What?
Return to Relativism: §4: Arguments For Relativism
Return to Relativism: §5: Arguments Against Relativism
Return to Relativism: Table of Contents