# Plural Quantification

*First published Wed Oct 27, 2004; substantive revision Wed Feb 27, 2008*

Ordinary English contains two sorts of quantification over objects.
In addition to the usual *singular* quantification, as in

(1) There is an apple on the table

there is *plural* quantification, as in

(2) There are some apples on the table.

Ever since Frege, formal logic has favored the two singular quantifiers
∀*x* and ∃*x* over their plural counterparts
∀*xx* and ∃*xx* (to be read as *for any
things* *xx* and *there are some things*
*xx*). But in recent decades it has been argued that we have
good reason to admit among our primitive logical notions also the
plural quantifiers ∀*xx* and ∃*xx* (Boolos
1984 and 1985a).

More controversially, it has been argued that the resulting formal
system with plural as well as singular quantification qualifies as
‘pure logic’; in particular, that it is universally
applicable, ontologically innocent, and perfectly well understood. In
addition to being interesting in its own right, this thesis will, if
correct, make plural quantification available as an innocent but
extremely powerful tool in metaphysics and philosophical logic. For
instance, George Boolos has used plural quantification to interpret
monadic second-order
logic^{[1]}
and has argued on this basis that monadic
second-order logic qualifies as “pure logic.” Plural
quantification has also been used in attempts to defend logicist ideas,
to account for set theory, and to eliminate ontological commitments to
mathematical objects and complex objects.

- 1. The Languages and Theories of Plural Quantification
- 2. Plural Quantification vs. Second-Order Quantification
- 3. The Logicality Thesis
- 4. Applications of Plural Quantification
- 5. Ontological Innocence?
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. The Languages and Theories of Plural Quantification

The logical formalisms that have dominated in the analytic tradition
ever since Frege do not allow for plural quantification. In
introductory logic courses students are therefore typically taught to
paraphrase away plural locutions. For instance, they may be taught to
render ‘Alice and Bob are hungry’ as ‘Alice is hungry
& Bob is hungry’, and ‘There are some apples on the
table’, as ‘∃*x* ∃*y* (*x*
is an apple on the table & *y* is an apple on the table
& *x* ≠ *y*)’. However, not only are such
paraphrases often unnatural, but they may not even be available. One of
the most interesting examples of plural locutions which resist singular
paraphrase is the so-called Geach-Kaplan sentence:

(3) Some critics admire only one another

This sentence provably has no singular first-order paraphrase using
only the predicates occurring in the sentence
itself.^{[2]}

How are we to formalize such sentences? The traditional view, defended for instance by Quine, is that all paraphrases must be given in classical first-order logic, if necessary supplemented with set theory. In particular, Quine suggests that (3) should be formalized as

(3′) ∃S(∃u.u∈S& ∀u(u∈S→Cu) & ∀u∀v(u∈S&Auv→v∈S&u≠v))

(1973, 111 and 1982,
293).^{[3]}

In two important articles from the 1980s George Boolos challenges
this traditional view (Boolos 1984 and 1985a). He argues that it is
simply a prejudice to insist that the plural locutions of natural
language be paraphrased away. Instead he suggests that just as the
singular quantifiers ∀*x* and ∃*x* get their
legitimacy from the fact that they represent certain quantificational
devices in natural language, so do their plural counterparts
∀*xx* and ∃*xx*. For there can be no doubt
that in natural language we use and understand the expressions
‘for any things’ and ‘there are some
things’.^{[4]}
Since these quantifiers bind variables that take name (rather than
predicate) position, they are *first-order* quantifiers, albeit
*plural* ones.

### 1.1 Regimenting plural quantification

I will now describe a simple formal language which can be used to regiment plural quantification as it occurs in English and other natural languages.

The formal language L. Let the formal language L_{PFO}_{PFO}(forPlural First-Order) be as follows.

- L
_{PFO}has the following terms (for every natural numberi):

- singular variables
x_{i}- plural variables
xx_{i}- singular constants
a_{i}- plural constants
aa_{i}- L
_{PFO}has the following predicates:

- two dyadic logical predicates = and ≺ (to be thought of as
identityand the relationis one of)- non-logical predicates
R(for every adicity^{n}_{i}nand every natural numberi)- L
_{PFO}has the following formulas:

R(^{n}_{i}t_{1}, …,t) is a formula when_{n}Ris an^{n}_{i}n-adic predicate andtare singular terms_{j}t≺Tis a formula whentis a singular term andTa plural term- ¬φ and φ&ψ are formulas when φ and ψ are formulas
- ∃
v.φ and ∃vv.φ are formulas when φ is a formula andvis a singular variable andvva plural one- the other connectives are regarded as abbreviations in the usual way.

In L_{PFO} we can formalize a number
of English claims involving plurals. For instance, (2) can be
formalized as

(2′) ∃xx∀u(u≺xx→Au&Tu)

And the Geach-Kaplan sentence (3) can be formalized as

(3′′) ∃xx[∀u(u≺xx→Cu) & ∀u∀v(u≺xx&Auv→v≺xx&u≠v)].

However, the language L_{PFO} has one
severe limitation. We see this by distinguishing between two kinds of
plural predication. A predicate *P* taking plural arguments is
said to be *distributive* just in case it is analytic that:
*P* holds of some things *xx* if and only if *P*
holds of each *u* such that *u*≺
*xx*.^{[5]}
For instance, the predicate ‘is on the
table’ is distributive, since it is analytic that some things
*xx* are on the table just in case each of *xx* is on the
table. A predicate *P* that isn't distributive is said to be
*non-distributive*.^{[6]}
For instance, the predicate ‘form a
circle’ is non-distributive, since it is not analytic that
whenever some things *xx* form a circle, each of *xx*
forms a circle. Another example of non-distributive plural predication
is the second argument-place of the logical predicate
≺:
for it is not true (let alone analytic) that whenever
*u* is one of *xx*, *u* is one of each of
*xx*. It is therefore both natural and useful to consider a
slightly richer language:

The formal language L. The language_{PFO+}Lallows non-distributive plural predicates other than ≺. We do this by modifying the definition of L_{PFO+}_{PFO}so as to allow predicatesRthat take^{n}_{i}pluralarguments.^{[7]}

Should we also allow predicates with argument places that take both
*singular* and *plural* arguments? Lots of English
predicates work this way, for instance ‘ … is/are on the
table’. So if our primary interest was to analyze natural
language, we would probably have to allow such predicates. However, for
present purposes it is simpler not to allow such predicates. We will
anyway soon allow pluralities that consist of just one
thing.^{[8]}

For now, the formal languages L_{PFO}
and L_{PFO+} will be interpreted only by
means of a translation of them into ordinary English, augmented by
indices to facilitate cross-reference (Boolos 1984, 443-5 (1998a,
67-9); Rayo 2002, 458-9). (More serious semantic issues will be
addressed in Section 4, where our main question will be whether our
theories of plural quantification are ontologically committed to any
sort of “set-like” entities.) The two clauses of this
translation which are immediately concerned with plural terms are

(4)Tr(x≺_{i}xx) = it_{j}_{i}is one of them_{j}

(5)Tr(∃xx.φ) = there are some things_{j}_{j}such thatTr(φ)

The other clauses are obvious, for instance: *Tr*(φ &
ψ) = (*Tr*(φ) and *Tr*(ψ)). By induction on
the complexity of formulas one easily proves that this translation
allows us to interpret all sentences of L_{PFO} and L_{PFO+},
relying on our intuitive understanding of English.

### 1.2 The Theories PFO and PFO+

We will now describe a theory *PFO* of plural first-order
quantification based on the language L_{PFO}. Let's begin with an axiomatization of ordinary
first-order logic with identity. For our current purposes, it is
convenient to axiomatize this logic as a natural deduction system,
taking all tautologies as axioms and the familiar natural deduction
rules governing the singular quantifiers and the identity sign as rules
of inference. We then extend in the obvious way the natural deduction
rules for the singular quantifiers to the plural ones. Next we need
some axioms which for suitable formulas φ(*x*) allow us to
talk about the φs. In ordinary English the use of plural locutions
generally signals a concern with two or more objects. But the existence
of two or more objects may not be semantically required; for instance,
‘The students who register for this class will learn a lot’ seems capable of being true even if only one student
registers. It is therefore both reasonable and convenient to demand
only that there be at least one object satisfying φ(*x*).
(Most people who write on the subject make this concession.) This gives
rise to the *plural comprehension axioms*, which are the
instances of the schema

(Comp) ∃uφ(u) → ∃xx∀u(u≺xx↔ φ(u))

where φ is a formula in L_{PFO} that
contains ‘*u*’ and possibly other variables free but
contains no occurrence of ‘*xx*’. Since this assures
that all pluralities are non-empty, we may also adopt the axiom

(6) ∀xx∃u(u≺xx).

Let *PFO+* be the theory based on the language L_{PFO+} which arises in an analogous way, but which in
addition has the following axiom schema of extensionality:

(7) ∀xx∀yy[∀u(u≺xx↔u≺yy) → (φ(xx) ↔ φ(yy))]

This axiom schema ensures that all coextensive pluralities are indiscernible.

*Note on terminology*. For ease of communication we will use
the word ‘plurality’ without taking a stand on whether
there really exist such entities as pluralities. Statements involving
the word ‘plurality’ can always be rewritten more
longwindedly without use of that word. For instance, the above claim
that “all pluralities are non-empty” can be rewritten as
“whenever there are some things *xx*, there is something
*u* which is one of the things *xx*.” Where an
ontological claim *is* made, this will be signalled by instead
using the locution ‘plural entity’.

## 2. Plural Quantification vs. Second-Order Quantification

By ‘second-order logic’ we understand a logic that extends
ordinary first-order logic by allowing for quantification into
*predicate* position. For instance, from ‘*a* is an
apple’ we can in second-order logic infer
‘∃*F*.*Fa*’. But the plural logics
described above extend ordinary first-order logic in a different way,
namely by allowing quantification into *plural argument*
position. But predicates and plural noun phrases belong to different
syntactic and semantic categories. For instance, the former consists of
expressions that are unsaturated (in Frege's sense) — that is,
that contain gaps or argument places — whereas the latter
consists of expressions that are saturated (Higginbotham 1998, Section
7; Oliver and Smiley 2001; Rayo and Yablo 2001, Section X; Simons 1997;
Williamson 2003, Section IX; Yi 2005). Accordingly, second-order
quantification and plural quantification are generally regarded as
different forms of quantification. In this section I discuss some of
the differences and similarities.

### 2.1 Plural quantification and monadic second-order logic

(Readers less interested in technical issues may want to skim this
section.) Boolos observed that it is possible to interpret monadic
second-order logic in the theory
PFO.^{[9]}
Let *MSO* be some standard axiomatization
of (full impredicative) monadic second-order logic in some suitable
language *L _{MSO}* (Shapiro 1991,
ch. 3; Boolos

*et al*. 2002, ch. 22). Boolos first defines a translation

*Tr*′ that maps any formula of L

_{MSO}to some formula of L

_{PFO}. This definition, which proceeds by induction on the complexity of the formulas of L

_{MSO}, has as its only non-trivial clauses the following two, which are concerned with the second-order variables:

(8)Tr′(X) =_{j}x_{i}x≺_{i}xx_{j}(9)

Tr′(∃X.φ) = ∃_{j}xx._{j}Tr′(φ) vTr′(φ*)

where φ* is the result of substituting *x _{i}*
≠

*x*everywhere for

_{i}*X*. The idea behind these two clauses is to replace talk about concepts (or whatever entities one takes the monadic second-order variables to range over) with talk about the objects that fall under these concepts. Thus, instead of saying that

_{j}x_{i}*x*falls under the concept

_{i}*X*, we say that

_{j}*x*is one of

_{i}*xx*. The only difficulty is that some concepts have no instances, whereas all pluralities must encompass at least one thing. But the possibility that a concept be uninstantiated is accommodated by the second disjunct on the right-hand side of (9).

_{j}
By induction on derivations in MSO one easily proves that each
theorem of MSO is mapped to some theorem of PFO. Moreover, it is easy
to define a “reverse” translation that maps formulas of
L_{PFO} to formulas of L_{MSO} and to prove that this translation maps theorems
of the former to theorems of the latter. This shows that PFO and MSO
are equi-interpretable. A similar result can be proved about PFO+ and
an extension *MSO+* of MSO which allows predicates of
(first-level) concepts, provided MSO+ contains an axiom schema to the
effect that coextensive concepts are indiscernible.

It is important to be clear on what the equi-interpretability of PFO
and PFO+ with respectively MSO and MSO+ does and does not show. It
shows that these two pairs of theories are equivalent for most
technical purposes. But by itself it does not show anything about these
two pairs of theories' being equivalent in any of the more demanding
senses that philosophers often care about (such as having the same
epistemic status, ontological commitments, or degree of analyticity).
(For instance PFO is equi-interpretable with atomic extensional
mereology, which philosophers tend to find much more problematic than
PFO.) In order to show that the two pairs of theories are equivalent in
some philosophically important respect *F*, we would need to
show that the above translations preserve *F*-ness.

### 2.2 Relations

Although plural quantification provides a fairly natural
interpretation of quantification over (monadic) *concepts*, it
provides no natural interpretation of quantification over (polyadic)
*relations*.

This limitation can be overcome (at least for technical purposes) if
there is a pairing function on the relevant domain, that is, if there
is a function π such that π(*u*, *v*) =
π(*u*′, *v*′) just in case *u* =
*u*′ and *v* = *v*′. For then
quantification over dyadic relations can be represented by plural
quantification over ordered pairs. Moreover, by iterated applications
of the ordered pair function we can represent *n*-tuples and
thus also quantification over *n*-adic relations. The question
is how this pairing function is to be understood. One option is to
proceed as in mathematics and simply postulate the existence of a
pairing function as an abstract mathematical object. But this option
has the obvious disadvantage of stepping outside of what most people
are willing to call “pure logic.” A cleverer option,
explored in the Appendix to Lewis 1991 and in Hazen 1997 and 2000, is
to simulate talk about ordered pairs using only resources that arguably
are purely logical. It turns out that talk about ordered pairs can be
simulated in monadic *third-order* logic, given some plausible
extra assumptions. Monadic third-order logic can in turn be interpreted
either in a theory which combines plural quantification with mereology
(Lewis 1991, Ch. 3; Burgess and Rosen 1997, II.C.1) or in terms of
higher-level plural quantification (Section 2.4).

### 2.3 Modal contexts

Another way in which plural quantification and second-order
quantification come apart emerges in modal contexts. It is often a
contingent matter whether an object falls under a concept. Although I
am wearing shoes, I might not have done so. So there is a concept
*F* under which I fall but might not have fallen. In contrast,
it seems that being one of some objects is never contingent. Consider
the people *aa* who are all and only the people currently
wearing shoes. Then not only am I one of these people, but this seems
to hold of necessity. Removing me from this plurality of people would
just result in a different plurality. For the plurality *aa* to
be the plurality it is, it must include precisely the objects that it
in fact includes. So in any world in which the objects *aa*
exist at all, I must be one of them. True, I might not have been
wearing shoes. But even so I would have been one of *aa*, only
then *aa* would not have been all and only the people wearing
shoes. Plural names and variables thus seem to be rigid in a way that
is analogous to the familiar rigidity of singular names and variables:
in any world in which a plural term denotes at all, it denotes the same
objects. In particular it seems that pluralities are subject to the
following two principles:

(10)u≺xx→ □(u≺xx)

(11) ¬(u≺xx) → □¬(u≺xx)

(These principles are defended in Rumfitt 2005, Section VII and Williamson 2003, 456-457. They are assumed and put to philosophical use in Bricker 1989, 386-390 and Forbes 1989, 93-102.)

### 2.4 Higher levels of plural quantification?

One way of going beyond PFO+ would be by allowing quantification
into predicate positions, including those of predicates taking plural
arguments. Doing so would result in an extension which stands to PFO+
as ordinary (singular) second-order logic stands to ordinary (singular)
first-order logic. Such extensions will not be considered here: for
whether they are legitimate, and if so what axioms they may support,
has less to do with plurals and plural quantification than it does with
predication and quantification over the semantic values of
predicates.^{[10]}

What *is* relevant for present purposes is whether there is
some form of “super-plural” quantification that stands to
ordinary plural quantification as ordinary plural quantification stands
to singular quantification. If so, let's call this
*second-level* plural quantification. More generally, we may
attempt to introduce plural quantification of any finite level. This
would result in a theory which for technical purposes is just like a
simple type theory (Hazen 1997, 247; Linnebo 2003, Section IV; Rayo
2006).

It is fairly straightforward to develop formal languages and
theories of higher-level plural quantification (Rayo 2006). For
instance, we can introduce variables of the form *xxx* to be
thought of as ranging over second-level pluralities and the relation
*xx*
≺_{2} *xxx* to
be understood in analogy with the relation *x*
≺
*xx*. But can these formal theories of
higher-level plural quantification be justified by considerations
similar to those that justify the theories PFO and PFO+?

Boolos and many other philosophers deny that higher-level plural
quantification can be thus justified. Two kinds of arguments are given
for this view. Firstly, it is argued that a plurality is always a
plurality of *things*. But since plural quantification is
ontologically innocent, there are no such things as pluralities. There
is thus nothing that can be collected into a second-level plurality
(McKay 2006, 46-53 and 137-139). Secondly, ordinary plural
quantification is justified by the fact that it captures certain
quantificational devices of English and other natural languages. But
English and other natural languages contain no higher-level plural
quantification (Lewis 1990, 70-71; Uzquiano 2004).

Both arguments are controversial. Concerning the first, it is not clear why ontology should be relevant to the legitimacy of higher-level plurals quantification. It should be sufficient that the base-level objects can be organized in certain complex ways. For instance, the second-level plurality based on Cheerios organized as oo oo oo should be no more ontologically problematic than the first-level plurality based on the same objects organized as oooooo, although the former has an additional level of structure or articulation (Linnebo 2003, 87-8).

The second of the above two arguments is also problematic. To begin
with, the claim that there are no higher-level plural locutions in
natural language is almost certainly false. In Icelandic, for instance,
the number words have plural forms which count, not individual objects,
but *pluralities* of objects that form natural groups. Here is
an example:

einn skór means one shoe einir skór means one pair of shoes tvennir skór means two pairs of shoes

This allows us to talk about pairs of shoes as a second-level
plurality rather than as a first-level plurality of objects such as
*pairs*. For an English example, consider a video game in which
any number *n* of teams can compete in an *n*-way
competition. Then the following sentence seems to involve a superplural
term:

(12) These people, those people, and these other people compete against each other. (Linnebo and Nicolas 2008)

(See also Oliver and Smiley 2004, 654-656 and 2005, 1063.)

Moreover, the very idea that the legitimacy of higher-level plural
quantification is decided by the existence or non-existence of
higher-level plural locutions in English and other natural languages
is problematic (Hazen 1993, 138 and 1997, 247; Linnebo 2003, 87; Rayo
2006). What really matters is presumably whether we can iterate the
principles and considerations on which our understanding of ordinary
first-level plural quantification is based: if we can, then
higher-level plural quantification will be justified in much the same
way as ordinary first-level plural quantification; and if not, then
not. Thus, even if there were no higher-level plural locutions in
natural languages, this would at best provide some weak *prima
facie* evidence that no such iteration is possible. And this
*prima facie* evidence could be defeated by pointing to
independent reasons why higher-level plural locutions are scarce in
natural languages. One such independent reason may simply be that
ordinary speakers aren't very concerned about their ontological
commitments and thus find it more convenient to express facts
involving second-level pluralities by positing objects to represent
the first-level pluralities (for instance by talking about two
*pairs* of shoes) rather than by keeping track of additional
grammatical device for second-level plurals (as in the above example
from Icelandic).

## 3. The Logicality Thesis

It is often claimed that the theories PFO and PFO+ qualify as
“pure logic.” We will refer to this (admittedly vague)
claim as *the Logicality Thesis*. Since the corresponding
languages are interpreted by the translation *Tr* into ordinary
English, this is a claim about the logicality of certain axioms and
inferences rules of ordinary
English.^{[11]}

Even before the Logicality Thesis is made more precise, it is possible to assess its plausibility for at least some of the axioms and inference rules of PFO and PFO+. First there are the tautologies and the inference rules governing identity and the singular quantifiers. There is broad consensus that these qualify as logical. Next there are the inference rules governing the plural quantifiers. Since these rules are completely analogous to the rules governing the singular quantifiers, it can hardly be denied that they too qualify as logical. Then there are the extensionality axioms and the axiom that all pluralities are non-empty. These axioms are unproblematic because they can plausibly be taken to be analytic. What remains are the plural comprehension axioms, where things are much less clear. For these axioms have no obvious singular counterparts, and their syntactical form indicates that they make existential claims. So it is not obvious that these axioms can be taken to be purely logical.

This is not to say that it has not *struck* people as obvious
that the plural comprehension axioms are purely logical. For instance,
Boolos asserts without argument that the translation of each plural
comprehension axiom into English “expresses a *logical*
truth if any sentence of English does” (Boolos 1985b, 342 (1998a,
167); his emphasis). And Keith Hossack first argues that the plural
comprehension axioms are ontologically innocent, whence he concludes
— with no further argument or explanation — that “the
axioms of plural logic are genuine logical truths” (Hossack 2000,
422).

In order to assess the Logicality Thesis in a more principled way, more will have to be said about what it might mean for a theory to be “purely logical.” So I will now survey some of the features commonly thought to play a role in such a definition. Although people are free to use the word ‘logic’ as they please, it is important to get clear on what different usages entail; in particular, theories that qualify as purely logical are often assumed to enjoy a variety of desirable philosophical properties such as epistemic and ontological innocence. In the next section, where various applications of plural quantification will be discussed, I will carefully note which strains of the notion of logicality our theories PFO and PFO+ must possess for the various applications of them to succeed.

Perhaps the least controversial candidate for a defining feature of
logic is its *absolute generality*. A logical principle is valid
in any kind of discourse, no matter what kind of objects this discourse
is concerned with. For instance, modus ponens is valid not only in
physics and mathematics but in religion and in the analysis of works of
fiction. Frege captures the idea nicely when he says that a logical
principle is valid in “the widest domain of all; […] not
only the actual, not only the intuitable, but everything
thinkable” (Frege 1884, 21). Thus, whereas the principles of
physics are valid only in the actual world and in worlds that are
nomologically similar to it, the principles of logic govern everything
*thinkable*. If one of these principles is denied,
“complete confusion ensues” (*ibid*.).

Another feature widely believed to be defining of logic is its
*formality*: the truth of a principle of logic is guaranteed by
the *form* of thought and/or language and does not in any way
depend upon its *matter*. What this feature amounts to will
obviously depend on how the distinction between form and matter is
understood. The most popular explication of the distinction between
form and matter derives from the widely shared view that no objects
exist by conceptual necessity (Field 1993; Yablo 2000). On this view it
is natural to regard anything having to do with the existence of
objects and with their particular characteristics as belonging to the
matter of thought rather than to its form. This gives rise to two
features that are often regarded as defining of logic. Firstly, logic
has to be *ontologically innocent*; that is, a principle of
logic cannot introduce any new ontological commitments (Boolos 1997;
Field 1984). Secondly, the basic notions of logic must not discriminate
between different objects but must treat them all alike. This latter
idea is often spelled out as the requirement that logical notions must
be invariant under permutations of the domain of objects (Tarski
1986).

A third feature which is often regarded as defining of logic is its
(alleged) *cognitive primacy*. Primitive logical notions must be
completely understood, and our understanding of them must be direct in
the sense that it doesn't depend on or involve an understanding of
notions that must be classified as extra-logical. Assume, for instance,
that certain set theoretic principles must be regarded as
extra-logical. Then our understanding of the primitive logical notions
cannot depend on or involve any of these principles.

## 4. Applications of Plural Quantification

I will now outline some applications of the theories PFO and PFO+. In the previous section three strains of the notion of logicality were disentangled. Special attention will be paid to the question which of these three strains PFO and PFO+ must possess for the applications to succeed. (The reader may want to skip the discussion of applications in which he or she isn't interested.)

### 4.1 Establishing the Logicality of Monadic Second-Order Logic

As we saw in Section 2.1 Boolos defined an interpretation of the theory MSO of monadic second-order logic in the theory PFO of plural quantification. He sought to use this translation to establish the logicality of MSO. Doing so will require two steps. The first step is to argue that PFO is pure logic, that is, to establish the full Logicality Thesis (however exactly it is interpreted). The second step is to argue that the interpretation of MSO in PFO preserves logicality.

Some of the challenges facing the first step will be examined in Section 5. The second step too should not be underestimated. Perhaps the greatest worry here is that Boolos's translation renders expressions from one category (that of monadic predicates) in terms of expressions from another category (that of plural noun phrases). For instance, ‘… is an apple’ is rendered as ‘the apples’. But these categories are very different (Section 2).

However, since the thesis that MSO is pure logic is very abstract, much of its cash value will lie in its applications. And given the equi-interpretability of MSO and PFO, it is likely that many applications of the logicality of the former can be served equally well by the logicality of the latter. This reduces somewhat the importance of carrying out the second step.

### 4.2 Logicism

Both Fregean and post-Fregean logicism make essential use of
second-order quantification. Frege defined the various objects of pure
mathematics as extensions of concepts, and his famous Basic Law V
stated that two concepts *F* and *G* have the same
extension just in case they are co-extensive:

(V)û.Fu=û.Gu↔ ∀u(Fu↔Gu)

But as is well known, Russell's paradox shows that the second-order theory with (V) as an axiom is inconsistent.

Philosophers have attempted to rescue some ideas of Fregean logicism
by using axioms weaker than (V). One of the most important such
attempts is Bob Hale and Crispin Wright's *neo-logicism*, which
gives up Frege's theory of extensions but holds on to the central idea
of his definition of cardinal numbers, namely that the number of
*F*s is identical to the number of *G*s just in case the
*F*s and the *G*s can be one-to-one correlated. This has
become known as *Hume's Principle*, and can be formalized as

(HP)Nu.Fu=Nu.Gu↔F≈G

where *F*≈*G* says there is a relation that
one-to-one correlates the *F*s and the *G*s. The
second-order theory with (HP) as an axiom is consistent and allows us
to derive all of ordinary (second-order Peano-Dedekind) arithmetic,
using some very natural definitions (see the entry on
Frege's Logic, Theorem, and Foundations for Arithmetic).

Even more modest is Boolos's *sub-logicism*, which rejects
the idea (endorsed by both logicists and neo-logicists) that there are
logical objects, but insists that Frege's definition of the
*ancestral* of a relation can be used to show, as against Kant,
that at least some non-trivial mathematics is analytic (Boolos 1985b).
Recall that a relation *R* stands to its ancestral *R**
as the relation *is a parent of* stands to *is an ancestor
of*. (More precisely, *R** holds between two objects
*x* and *y* just in case *x* and *y* are
connected through a finite sequence of objects each of which bears
*R* to its successor.) Frege gives a second-order definition of
the ancestral relation *R** by laying down that *x* and
*y* are related by *R** just in case *y* has every
property that is had by *x*'s *R*-successors and
inherited under the *R*-relation:

(DefR*)xR*y↔ ∀F[∀u(xRu→Fu) & ∀u(Fu&uRv→Fv) →Fy]

Using this definition, Frege 1879 proves some non-trivial
mathematical truths, such as that the ancestral *R** is
transitive and that, for any functional relation *R*, the
*R*-ancestors of any object are *R**-comparable (that is,
he proved: Functional(*R*) & *xR*y* &
*xR*z* → *yR*z* ∨ *zR*y*).

It has been suggested that PFO be used to accommodate the
post-Fregean logicists' need for second-order quantification. Since the
ancestral of a dyadic predicate can be defined using only monadic
second-order quantification, PFO does indeed serve the logical needs of
Boolos's
sub-logicism.^{[12]}
But since the neo-logicist definition of
*F*≈*G* uses *dyadic* second-order logic,
PFO alone does not have sufficient expressive power to accommodate the
needs of neo-logicism. The neo-logicist may attempt to solve this
problem by regarding equinumerosity as a primitive logical quantifier
or by simulating dyadic second-order quantification in some suitable
extension of PFO, as discussed in Section
2.2.^{[13]}

Which strains of the Logicality Thesis are needed for these applications to succeed? Since these logicists attempt to show that parts of mathematics are analytic (or at least knowable a priori), this would require that PFO be analytic (or at least knowable a priori), which in turn is likely to require that PFO enjoy some form of cognitive primacy. Moreover, PFO would have to be either ontologically innocent or committed only to entities whose existence is conceptually necessary (or at least establishable a priori).

### 4.3 Set Theory

Another application of the Logicality Thesis is concerned with set theory. One may for a variety of reasons want to talk about and quantify over collections of sets (Linnebo 2003, 80-81). For instance, one may want to assert

(13) There are some sets which are all and only the non-self-membered sets.

If we formalize this as

(13′) ∃R∀x(Rx↔x∉x),

how is the quantifier ∃*R* to be understood? It clearly
cannot be taken to range over all sets, as this would lead straight to
Russell's paradox: (13′) would then assert the existence of the
Russell-set. Three other responses are prominent in the literature.

The first response is that ∃*R* ranges over
*classes* but that some classes are too large (or otherwise
unsuited) to be sets. In particular, (13) asserts the existence of the
Russell-class, which isn't a set. This response has been found
problematic because it postulates the existence of different kinds of
“set-like” entities (Boolos 1984, 442 (1998a, 66) and
1998b, 35). It has also been objected that this response only postpones
the problem posed by (13). For it would also be true that

(14) There are some classes which are all and only the non-self-membered classes.

What kind of entity would this collection of classes be? A super-class? If so, we will be forced to postulate higher and higher levels of classes. Lewis (1991, 68) argues that Russell's paradox is still inescapable because, when we consider all set-like entities, we realize that the following is true:

(15) There are some set-like things which are all and only the non-self-membered set-like things.

However, Hazen (1993, 141-2) has pointed out that Lewis's
objection violates essential type-restrictions. Classes of different levels belong to different logical types, just as concepts of different levels do. So Lewis's attempt to talk about all set-like entities in one fell swoop involves an attempt to quantify across different logical types. But this violates type restrictions in the same way as an attempt to quantify simultaneously over objects and concepts of all different levels. Although we can
quantify over *each* level of classes, we can never quantify
over *all levels simultaneously*.

The second response is that (13) asserts the existence of a set
*R*, but that *R* isn't in the range of the quantifier
∀*x*. This prevents us from instantiating the quantifier
∀*x* with respect to *R*, which means that we
cannot draw the fatal conclusion that *R* is a member of itself
just in case it isn't. However, this response entails that the
quantifier ∀*x* cannot be chosen to range over absolutely
all sets; for if it could be so chosen, we would not be able deny that
*R* is in this range of quantification. This means that the
universe of sets has a certain *inexhaustibility*: whenever we
have formed a conception of quantification over some range of sets, we
can define a set which isn't in this range (Dummett 1981, ch. 15 and
1991, ch. 24; Glanzberg 2004; Parsons 1977). However, this response has
been criticized for being, at best hard to state, and at worst
self-refuting (Boolos 1998b, 30; Lewis 1991, 68; Williamson 2003,
Section V). (See also Rayo and Uzquiano 2006 for a number of essays
discussing whether absolutely general quantification is possible.)

Because of the difficulties involved in the first two responses, a
third response has become popular in recent years (Boolos 1984 and
1985a; Burgess 2004; Cartwright 2001; Rayo and Uzquiano 1999; Uzquiano
2003). This is that the quantifier ∃*R* is a plural
quantifier (and would thus be better written as ∃*rr*) and
that plural quantification is ontologically innocent. (13) does
therefore not assert the existence of any “set-like” entity
over and above the sets in the range of the quantifier
∀*x*. But as we will see in Section 5, the claim about
ontological innocence is controversial.

### 4.4 Mathematical Nominalism

Some of the most popular applications of the plural quantification are concerned with ontological economy. The idea is to pay the ontological price of a mere first-order theory and then use plural quantification to get for free (a theory with the force of) the corresponding monadic second-order theory. That would obviously be an ontological bargain. Applications of this sort fall into two main classes, which will be discussed in this sub-section and the next.

One class of applications of plural quantification aim to make
ontological bargains in the philosophy of mathematics. In particular, a
number of philosophers have attempted to use plural quantification as
an ingredient of nominalistic interpretations of mathematics. A nice
example is Geoffrey Hellman's modal nominalism, according to which
mathematical statements committed to the existence of abstract objects
are to be eliminated in favor of statements about the *possible*
existence of concrete objects. For instance, instead of claiming, as
the platonist does, that there exists an infinite collection of
abstract objects satisfying the axioms of Peano arithmetic (namely the
natural numbers), Hellman claims that there *could exist* an
infinite collection of concrete objects related so as to satisfy these
axioms (Hellman 1989 and 1996). However, even this modal claim appears
to talk about *collections* of concrete objects and
*relations* on these objects. To forestall the objection that
this smuggles in through the back door abstract objects such as sets,
Hellman needs some alternative, nominalistically acceptable
interpretation of this talk about collections and relations. Plural
quantification may offer such an interpretation.

For this application of plural quantification to work, PFO must be
applicable to all kinds of concrete objects, and it must be
ontologically innocent, or at least not committed to any entities that
share those features of abstract objects that are found to be
nominalistically objectionable. Moreover, in order to simulate
quantification over relations, we will need not just PFO but a theory
more like monadic *third-order* logic (Sections 2.2 and
2.4).

### 4.5 Eliminating Complex Objects

Another class of applications attempt to eliminate the commitments
of science and common sense to (some or all) complex objects. For
instance, instead of employing usual singular quantification over
tables and chairs, it is proposed that we use plural quantification
over mereological atoms arranged tablewise or chairwise (Dorr and Rosen
2002; Hossack 2000; van Inwagen 1990). For instance, instead of saying
that there is a chair in one's office, one should say that there are
some atoms in one's office arranged chairwise. In this way one appears
to avoid committing oneself to the existence of a chair. Note that such
analyses require PFO+, not just PFO, since the new predicates
‘are arranged *F*-wise’ are non-distributive.

Let's set aside purely metaphysical worries about such analyses as
irrelevant to our present concern. What *we* would like to know
is what demands these analyses put on the theory PFO+, in particular,
which strains of the Logicality Thesis are needed. The most obvious
demands are that PFO+ be applicable to all kinds of simple objects and
that it be ontologically innocent, or at least not committed to complex
objects of the sort to be eliminated.

A less obvious demand has to do with the need to analyze ordinary plural quantification over complex objects, for instance

(16) There are some chairs arranged in a circle.

We have already “used up” ordinary plural quantification and predication to eliminate apparent commitment to individual chairs (Uzquiano 2004). So in order to analyze (16), we will need something like “super-plural” quantification — quantification that stands to ordinary plural quantification as ordinary plural quantification stands to singular — and corresponding non-distributive predication. The legitimacy of such linguistic resources was discussed in Section 2.4.

## 5. Ontological Innocence?

The traditional view in analytic philosophy has been that all plural
locutions should be paraphrased away, if need be, by quantifying over
sets (Section 1). George Boolos and others objected that it is both
unnatural and unnecessary to eliminate plural locutions. This led to
the theories PFO and PFO+. Proponents of plural quantification claim
that these theories allow plural locutions to be formalized in a way
that is fundamentally different from the old set-theoretic paraphrases.
In particular, they claim that these theories are ontologically
innocent in the sense that they introduce no new ontological
commitments to sets or any other kind of “set-like”
entities over and above the individual objects that compose the
pluralities in question. Let's call this latter claim *Ontological
Innocence*.

Other philosophers question Ontological Innocence. For instance, Michael Resnik expresses misgivings about the alleged ontological innocence of the plural formalization (3′′) of the Geach-Kaplan sentence (3). For when (3′′) is translated into English as instructed, it reads:

(3′′′) There are some critics such that any one of them admires another critic only if the latter is one of them distinct from the former.

But (3′′′), Resnik says, “seems to me to refer to collections quite explicitly. How else are we to understand the phrase ‘one of them’ other than as referring to some collection and as saying that the referent of ‘one’ belongs to it?” (Resnik 1988, 77). Related worries have been expressed in Hazen 1993, Linnebo 2003, Parsons 1990, and Rouilhan 2002; see also Shapiro 1993.

I will now discuss three arguments in favor of Ontological Innocence.

### 5.1 The set theoretic argument

The first argument begins by asking us to consider the claim

(17) There are some sets which are all and only the non-self-membered sets.

and admit that it is true. It continues by arguing that, if plural expressions were committed to collections or any other “set-like” objects, then the truth of (17) would lead straight to Russell's paradox. This is sometimes thought to be a knock-down argument in favor of Ontological Innocence (Boolos 1984, 440-443 (1998a, 64-67); Lewis 1991, 65-69; McKay 2006, 31-32). But in fact it is less conclusive than it appears. For as we saw in Section 4.3, Russell's paradox will follow only if two alternative views are ruled out. Since these views cannot be dismissed out of hand, much work remains before this argument can be said to be conclusive.

### 5.2 The incorrect predication argument

The second argument is nicely encapsulated by Boolos's remark that
“It is haywire to think that when you have some Cheerios, you are
eating a *set*” (1984, 448-9 (1998a, 72)). What Boolos is
suggesting here is that analyses which deny Ontological Innocence are
likely to get the subject of plural predications wrong.

The obvious response is to interpret plural predicates in a way
which ensures that what we eat are *the elements* of a set and
not the set itself. Consider the sentence:

(18) George Boolos ate some Cheerios for breakfast on January 1, 1985.

When the direct object of the verb ‘ate’ is plural, we can
for instance interpret the verb by means of the relation *x
ate-the-elements-of y*.

It will be objected that this response makes the verb
‘ate’ ambiguous in an implausible way (Oliver and Smiley
2001). For when the verb has a direct object that is singular, it will
presumably be interpreted by means of the ordinary relation *x ate
y*. But there is fairly strong evidence that the verb
‘ate’ isn't ambiguous in this way. For instance, one effect
of an ambiguity is to disallow certain kinds of ellipsis. An example is
the ambiguity of ‘make’ in ‘make breakfast’ and
‘make up one's mind’, which disallows the following
ellipsis:

(*19) Boolos made breakfast, but his guest, only up his mind.

So if ‘ate’ was ambiguous in the way just described, the following ellipsis would be disallowed as well, which it isn't:

(20) Boolos ate some Cheerios, but his guest, only a candy bar.

However, it is far from clear that the above response to Boolos's
argument needs to be committed to any such problematic ambiguities. We
can for instance let *all* predicates take plural entities as
their arguments. The verb ‘ate’ will then always receive as
its interpretation the relation *the-elements-of x
ate-the-elements-of y*, thus removing any ambiguity. Whether or not
this response is ultimately acceptable, it shows that the argument in
question remains inconclusive.

### 5.3 The direct argument

Perhaps the most popular argument for Ontological Innocence is the one to which I now turn. In its simplest form, this argument is based on our intuitions about ontological commitments. When you assert (18), you don't have the feeling that you are committing yourself ontologically to a collection or to any other kind of “set-like” object. Nor do you have any such feeling when you assert the Geach-Kaplan sentence or any other translation of a sentence of PFO or PFO+ into English. Or so the argument goes.

In this simple form the argument is vulnerable to the objection that people's intuitions provide a poor basis for settling theoretical disputes about ontological commitments. We have seen that there are competent speakers of English, such as Michael Resnik, who don't share these intuitions. Moreover, as Davidson's popular analysis of action sentences in terms of events makes clear, ordinary people's intuitions about ontological commitments cannot always be trusted (Davidson 1967). For instance, someone may sincerely assert that John walked slowly, without being aware that he has committed himself to the existence of an event (namely a walking which was by John and which was slow).

Although this objection has force, the argument can be sharpened by undertaking a more careful study of what forms of existential generalization are warranted on a sentence containing plural expressions (Boolos 1984, 447 (1998a, 70); McKay 2006, ch. 2; Yi 2002, 7-15 and 2005, 469-472). For instance, we may ask whether the following can be inferred from (18):

(21) There is an object such that Boolos ate all of its elements (or constituents) for breakfast on January 1, 1985.

This inference would no doubt be quite peculiar. This provides evidence that (18) isn't committed to any kind of “set-like” entity.

However, this evidence is not incontestable. For there are analogous inferences that seem quite natural. For instance, from

(22) Some students surrounded the building.

most speakers of English would be perfectly happy to infer that

(23) A group of students surrounded the building.

So perhaps the peculiarity of the inference from (18) to (21) is a pragmatic rather than a semantic phenomenon. Perhaps it has to do with the fact that it is less natural to regard some Cheerios as a set (or some other sort of plural entity) than it is to regard some students as a group.

However, let's assume that the defenders of the Direct Argument are
right that (18) does not entail (21). What would follow? It would
follow that (18) does not incur any additional ontological commitments
*of the sort that can be incurred by singular first-order
quantifiers*. But this conclusion falls short of the argument's
desired conclusion that (18) does not incur any additional ontological
commitments *of any sort*. In order to get from the actual
conclusion to the desired one, we would in addition have to assume that
all ontological commitments are of the sort incurred by singular
first-order quantifiers. But there is an influential philosophical
tradition that denies this assumption and instead holds that all kinds of
quantifiers incur ontological commitments, not just singular
first-order
ones.^{[14]}
The most famous exponent of this tradition is
Frege, who claims that second-order quantifiers are committed to
concepts, just as singular first-order quantifiers are committed to
objects. This tradition ties the notion of ontological commitment very
closely to that of a semantic value. This will be the topic of the next
and final subsection.

### 5.4 Semantic values and ontological commitments

In semantics it is widely assumed that each component of a complex
expression makes some definite contribution to the meaning of the
complex expression. This contribution is known as the *semantic
value* of the component expression and will be symbolized by
enclosing the expression in square brackets. It is also assumed that
the meaning of the complex expression is functionally determined by
the semantic values of the component expressions and their syntactic
mode of composition. This assumption is known as
*compositionality*.

According to Frege, the semantic value of a sentence is just its
truth-value, and the semantic value of a proper name is its referent
(that is, the object to which it refers). Once we have fixed the
semantic values assigned to sentences and proper names, it is easy to
determine what kinds of semantic value to assign to expressions of
other syntactic categories. For instance, the semantic value of a
monadic predicate will have to be a function from objects to
truth-values. Frege calls such functions *concepts*.

As an example, let's consider the simple subject-predicate sentence

(24) Socrates is mortal.

The logical form of (24) is **M**(**s**),
where **M** is the predicate ‘is mortal’ and
**s** is the singular term ‘Socrates’. In
accordance with the previous paragraph, the semantic values are as
follows:

(25) [s] = Socrates

(26) [M] = the functionffrom objects to truth-values such thatf(x) is the true ifxis mortal andf(x) is the false otherwise

The truth-value of (24) is thus determined as

(27) [(24)] = [M(s)] = [M] ([s]) =f(Socrates) = the true (if Socrates is mortal) or the false (otherwise).

Frege took the connection between semantic values and ontological
commitments to be a very close one. For on the above analysis, (24)
supports two kinds of existential generalizations: not just to
∃*x*.**M**(*x*) (which is true just in
case there exists some object which is mortal) but also to
∃*F.F*(*s*) (which is true just in case there
exists some concept under which Socrates falls). According to Frege,
this shows that sentences such as (24) are ontologically committed not
just to an object but also to a concept.

What matters for present purposes is not the truth or falsity of Frege's claim about concepts but whether a cogent argument of this sort can be developed for plural expressions. To investigate this, let's consider a simple non-distributive plural predication such as

(28) These apples form a circle.

The logical form of (28) appears to be
**C**(**aa**), where **C** is
the predicate ‘form a circle’ and **aa** is
the plural term ‘these apples’. (If you think complex
plural demonstrative have internal semantic structure, use instead some
plural name stipulated to refer directly to the apples in question.)
The natural view will then be as follows.

(29) [aa] =a_{1}and … anda(where the_{n}aare all and only the apples demonstrated)_{i}

(30) [C] = the functiongfrom pluralities to truth-values such thatg(xx) is the true ifxxform a circle andg(xx) is the false otherwise

The truth-value of (28) will then be determined as

(31) [(28)] = [C(aa)] = [C] ([aa]) =g(a_{1}and … anda) = the true (if_{n}a_{1}and … andaform a circle) or the false (otherwise)_{n}

which is what one would expect, given the syntactic similarity between (24) and (28).

Assume that this analysis is correct and that each plural term thus has some objects as its semantic value, just as each singular term has one object as its semantic value. What will this mean for the question of Ontological Innocence? According to the Fregean tradition, which connects the notion of ontological commitment to that of a semantic value, this will mean that plural expressions incur commitment to plural entities, much as predicates incur commitment to concepts. For to say that a sentence incurs a commitment to a plural entity is just to say that the truth of the sentence requires there to be some semantic value of the sort appropriate to plural expressions. However, this line of reasoning will be resisted by other philosophers, who believe that the notion of ontological commitment should be tied (at most) to singular first-order variables.

How can this disagreement be adjudicated? On the one hand, it may
count in favor of the Fregean tradition that their view is highly
systematic. There may be something *ad hoc* about the idea that
some sorts of semantic value give rise to ontological commitments while
other sorts don't. On the other hand, it may count in favor of the
alternative view that it does better justice to many people's strongly
felt intuition that plural locutions are ontologically innocent.

Another possibility is that the whole controversy is ultimately just
a pseudo-disagreement (Linnebo 2003; Parsons 1990; Rayo 2007; Shapiro
1993). If both parties agree that plural expressions have semantic
values, and if both agree that commitments to *objects* are
incurred only by singular first-order terms and variables, then perhaps
it does not matter whether other sorts of terms and variables should be
regarded as introducing their own distinctive kinds of ontological
commitment. Some philosophers speak about a theory's *ideological
commitments* and not just about its ontological commitments. By
this is meant the logical and conceptual resources that the theory
employs. Perhaps philosophers would be well advised to focus more on
the metaphysical and epistemological questions raised by a theory's
ideological commitments and worry less about whether these ideological
commitments should be also regarded as introducing a distinctive kind
of ontological commitment. After all, the notion of an ontological
commitment is a theoretical one, not one that has any sharp content
outside of philosophy. So perhaps we should regard the notion more as a
means to the end of providing good philosophical explanations and less
as a goal in itself.

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## Other Internet Resources

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## Related Entries

Frege, Gottlob | Frege, Gottlob: logic, theorem, and foundations for arithmetic | generalized quantifiers | logic and ontology | mereology | neologicism | Russell's paradox | set theory

### Acknowledgments

Thanks to Allen Hazen, Frode Kjosavik, Tom McKay, David Nicolas, Agustín Rayo, and Gabriel Uzquiano for discussions and written comments on earlier drafts.