Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to The Normativity of Meaning and Content

1. The relations between these notions are themselves a matter of debate. We assume that not every truth about a certain matter X that is metaphysically necessary, in the sense of being true in every (accessible) possible world, is essential to X. Along with most participants in the debate, we also take it that that which is conceptually necessary is metaphysically necessary, but not necessarily vice versa. Thus, those who argue that it is a conceptual truth that meaning is normative usually think that it is sufficient to show that meaning is essentially normative. But not everyone agrees. Wedgwood (2009, 424), for instance, argues that the claim that normativity is built into our concept of meaning/content could be true even if the corresponding metaphysical claim was false.

2. The neutral claim might also be true without either norms or meaning/content being prior to the other: If something else, X, is such that there is both meaning/content and the norms in question are in force because X is the case. In this case, however, it is arguably X that is essential to meaning/content, and not the norms.

3. Glüer&Wikforss (2009a) carves out (part of) the same terrain in a slightly different, purely systematic way, treating CE and CD normativism as mutually exclusive claims implying opposite directions of metaphysical determination. The current, wider use of ‘ME/CE normativity’ allows for the combination of ME/CE and MD/CD normativism and is entirely due to the actual shape of the debate to be outlined in this article.

4. Soames (1997), for instance, distinguishes between determination by relations of necessary consequence and by relations of a priori consequence. He argues that the argument Kripke's skeptic provides against determinate meaning facts suffers from equivocation between these two readings of determination (Soames 1997, 222ff, esp. 232).

5. Such principles can be of different kinds. For instance, they can be more or less holistic. According to a holistic determination principle for linguistic meaning the meanings of all the expressions of a language are determined together and by the whole of what is in SB (cf. Pagin 1997). They can determine a single correct mapping, or effect rankings between different mappings according to some standard of “best fit” (for instance, being most “charitable” (Davidson 1973) or providing the best teleo-biological explanation (Millikan 1990, Neander 1995, Dretske 1986), thus potentially leaving an opening for indeterminacy (i.e. the possibitity of more than one equally good “best”mapping).

6. This is not completely uncontroversial. For a discussion of some related issues, see Gibbard 1994. Wedgwood (2009, 425) voices some doubts. Jackson (2000) argues that non-cognitivism cannot be combined with the claim that belief is subject to constraints of rationality, where ‘rational’ is understood as a normative term.

7. Cf. von Wright 1963, 14; Schnädelbach 1990, 83ff. In the German tradition, there is the distinction between Tun-Sollen and Sein-Sollen; see, for instance, Nicolai Hartmann's Ethik (1925). See also G.E. Moore, “The Nature of Moral Philosophy”, in his Philosophical Studies (1922).

8. However, ME normativity need not be construed prescriptively. We return to this briefly below.

9. Presumably, the notion of application can be extended to other terms in a suitable way, so as to allow the normativity thesis to apply to all meaningful expressions.

10. This discussion is also inspired by passages in the Wittgensteinian discussion of a pure sense-datum language in Philosophical Investigations, paragraphs 243–271. Here, Wittgenstein argues that such a language is not possible because there would be no distinction between what seems right to the speaker and what is right.

11. An alternative reading of the notion of use in accordance with meaning is ‘transtemporal’, and turns on the idea that there has to be consistency over time. For instance, McGinn suggests that incorrect use amounts to ‘using the same expression with a different meaning from that originally intended’ (1984: 60). One might try to motivate the requirement on consistency over time by appealing to considerations having to do with the determination of meaning; if so, the resulting ME normativity derives from MD normativity. For a criticism of this transtemporal construal see Boghossian 1989b.

12. This suggests a wide scope reading of the deontic operator. It should be noted, though, that since Millar replaces ‘ought’ with ‘is committed’, on his construal of ME normativity the relevant normative consequences are not prescriptive.

13. Hattiangadi (2007: 194–195) also suggests that the proposal of Lance & O'Leary Hawthorne leads to a regress if construed as the thesis that the prescriptive meaning sentences serve to determine meaning.

14. According to some, this is the conclusion Kripke himself draws when presenting his skeptical solution to the skeptical paradox (Wilson 2006: 161–163). Kripke suggests that we should reject the search for meaning facts and consider the conditions under which meaning statements are properly assertible (Kripke 1982: 69–79). However, as noted above, the anti-realist theory of meaning entails substantial metaphysical claims about meaning, and this theory is no less in conflict with the skeptical conclusion that there are no meaning facts than is the classical realist theory (Boghossian 1989a: 522–527, Wright 1984: 769–770).

15. One reason the prescriptive construal has played a central role derives from the assumed connection between normativism and anti-naturalism. It is the allegedly prescriptive character of meaning that is said to pose an insurmountable obstacle to naturalist accounts of meaning (see section 4 below). However, to the extent that normativism poses a challenge to naturalist accounts of meaning, it might also be that the axiological construal of ME normativism poses such a challenge.

16. Assume that meaning is ME normative, i.e. that an expression e's having meaning M entails a set of normative consequences N, and that for each Mi, there is precisely one distinctive set Ni such that, necessarily, ei has Mi iff Ni. Does this mean that MD normativism is true? Not necessarily; in this case, there is an equivalence relation between Mi and Ni, which of course is a determination relation, but for all we know so far, it may be of the merely mathematical kind. To get MD normativism, the claim that determination by norms is metaphysically ‘responsible for’, or constitutive of, meaning needs to be added: It is because of the norms that expressions have meaning, not vice versa. Mathematical determination can be two-ways but metaphysical determination is one way only.

17. Jackman argues that the Davidsonian principle of charity is a normative principle of meaning and content determination. Whether Davidson espoused normativism about meaning/content is a matter of dispute, however (see section 2.2.2 below).

18. Another question about determination by normative facts arises from the commonly held view that normative facts themselves supervene upon non-normative facts. This might suggest that ultimately there is no real metaphysical difference between what we might call normative and non-normative determination. Greenberg 2005 suggests, by giving examples, that there nevertheless is a distinction between levels of metaphysical determination that are truly “constitutive” of a phenomenon and those that are not. But even though a distinction between what is essential and what is (merely) necessary (in the ‘metaphysical’ sense of true in all (accessible) possible worlds) seems plausible at one and the same level of determination, it is less clear that there is a corresponding distinction operating between levels. The level at which we give an account of a phenomenon might depend not so much on whether there is an underlying level of determination but, among other things, on whether there is reduction from one level to the next, as well as on the kind of account we are interested in. Moreover, it would seem to be a metaphysically interesting fact distinctive of a class of phenomena that there is a level of determination in their metaphysical ancestry that involves normative facts.

19. It is not immediately clear that (MD) could be strengthened into a bi-conditional, at least if such a bi-conditional is supposed to provide an analysis of ‘e means M’; for this, we would need to ensure that R is of the right kind, for instance, that it is a semantic, not a pragmatic rule, and that its being in force determines M, and not some other, or no, meaning. It might not be possible to do this in an informative way, however; for some arguments to this effect, see Pagin (1987, 88–139).

20. To illustrate: According to Davidson, meaning supervenes upon non-semantic, non-normative dispositions to hold (uninterpreted) sentences true. This is a form of non-reductive naturalism. The principle by which meaning so supervenes is the principle of charity. Prima facie, there is nothing incoherent about interpreting this, or any other principle with the same function, as in some sense normative.

21. Boghossian (2003: 39) withdraws his earlier claim that meaning is essentially normative, suggesting that the ‘the linguistic version of the normativity thesis, in contrast with its mentalistic version, has no plausibility whatever…’. But see Boghossian (2008) where he argues that there is a sense in which meaning is normative (as noted in section 2.2.1 above).

22. Again, it is not immediately clear that (C) could be strengthened into a bi-conditional, at least if such a bi-conditional is supposed to provide an analysis of M has content p. Such an analysis would have to specify the rule or norm in question without using the concept of content. It is not clear, for instance, that the rules of rational reasoning – which many think are promising candidates here – themselves can be specified without using the concept of content.

23. Alex Byrne calls this the “pleonastic sense of ‘concept’” (Byrne 2005). Note the contrast with the meaning of linguistic expressions that this notion of concept induces: On this notion of concept, the connection between a concept and ‘its meaning’ or ‘its content’ is not arbitrary, or even contingent; quite the contrary, a concept would naturally seem to be a meaning or a content; the meaning or content of the corresponding linguistic expression. There is here, thus, no route to normativism via arbitrariness; rather, the idea of norms governing the ‘use’ of concepts seems to derive from the idea of essential relations, such as inferential relations, between contents.

24. In the case of belief there is also the general question of whether beliefs are voluntary in the first place (Alston 1988, Shah & Velleman 2005, Williams 1973). If not, the idea that belief is intrinsically prescriptive stands in prima facie conflict with the principle that ‘ought’ implies ‘can’. In this respect both (NB1) and (NB2) are, prima facie, more problematic than (ME1), since the application of expressions is something that is clearly within the voluntary control of S.

25. Another proposal is that the norm of belief is made conditional on S considering whether p: ‘If S considers whether p, then S ought to believe p iff p is true’ (Wedgwood 2002: 273). This proposal is criticized in Bykvist & Hattianagadi 2007: 281.

26. For a general discussion of this idea, and its Aristotelian background, see Korsgaard 1996. See also Rödl 2003 for an application to intentional states.

27. Another option would be to regard the norms in question as merely axiological. Thus, it could be claimed that it is essential to belief, and constitutive of content, that true, or knowledgeable, or rational belief is intrinsically valuable (Karlander 2008). If this is meant to be a conceptual a priori truth, it certainly is controversial, however.

28. So is (NB2), of course, and the same questions concerning guidance can be raised with respect to it.

29. It has also been argued that the problem concerning guidance is solved if (NB1) is supplemented with the subjective norms of rationality: (NB1) guides, but via these further norms (Boghossian 2003: 39, Gibbard 2005: 343, Shah 2003: 471, Wedgwood 2002: 282). See section 3.2 below.

30. Note, also, that the argument presupposes that conceptual necessity implies metaphysical necessity. Otherwise it might be asked why the alleged conceptual links between the concepts of content and belief should entail that what is essential to belief is also essential to content.

31. For a related argument for the normativity of content see Greenberg (2007).

32. Cf. Willamson 2000, 238ff.

33. Therefore, he argues, there is nothing problematic about the prima facie weird consequence of objective epistemic normativity that every non-normative fact whatsoever analytically entails a normative fact: You objectively ought to believe that p iff p.

34. There is controversy about the extent to which these integrate with one another, controversy, that is, about the question as to whether epistemic value is just one value among others determining the rationality of actions and beliefs alike. Gibbard (2005), for instance, holds that it is, while writers such as Owens (2003) and Shah &Velleman (2005) insist that the rationality of belief is solely determined by epistemic value.

35. It is instructive to compare the contemporary debate between naturalists and normativists about meaning, content, the propositional attitudes, or the intentional in general with that between psychologists and (neo-Kantian) normativists regarding the ‘laws’ of logic around the turn of the previous century. It is recorded in quite some detail in Husserl's Prolegomena (1913). Husserl here came to adopt a third position according to which these laws are neither prescriptions nor psychological laws, but what he called “ideal”. He greatly influenced Frege in this.