Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Libertarianism

1. Because libertarianism is a theory of the duties that we owe each other, we here focus on the interpersonal notion of ownership. The comprehensive (interpersonal and impersonal) notion also includes that absence of any impersonal restrictions on the use of the entity or on the transfer of the rights.

2. Kirzner (1978) also argues against any fair share condition. He does so, however, on the ground that those who discover a resource are actually creating it and that creators are entitled to their creations. I believe that this argument fails, but cannot here argue the point.

3. Nozick (1974) sometimes interprets the proviso as requiring only that the system of private property make no one worse off than a system of common use (where everyone is free to use what they want). This appeal to systems, however, is inappropriate for libertarian theory. The focus must be on the specific act in question.

4. Simmons (1992, 1993) defends a position roughly of this sort—although his position is not strictly libertarian in a few respects.

5. Steiner (1994) argues that germ-line genetic information is a natural resource and appeals to this as a way of compensating for unequal internal endowments. I am not, however, convinced by his arguments.

6. Van Parijs (1995) is in the same spirit as equal opportunity left-libertarianism—although with significant twists on gifts and job rents.

7. Nozick (1974) presents a highly hypothetical, and highly controversial, scenario describing how one could come to have such an enforceable obligation to pay for basic police services.