Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Max Horkheimer

1. The claim that Horkheimer developed the theoretical orientation of the Frankfurt School does not mean that he is responsible for the philosophical and theoretical orientations of all of the Institute's individual members. Such a strong claim would be false; for example, it is clear that figures such as Theodor Adorno and Herbert Marcuse independently developed their own philosophical perspectives (though it is also uncontroversial to hold that those various figures influenced one another). Also, the claim should not be understood as entailing that all of the collaborative studies produced by the Institute live up to the methodological standards described in Horkheimer's early works. There is good reason to think that this is not the case, for example see Wiggerschaus 1994, pp. 149-156 on the difficulties the Institute had with integrating empirical and philosophical elements in the Studies on Authority and the Family. The relevant point here is just that one can reconstruct out of Horkheimer's early works a kind of program that was supposed to have oriented the overall work of the Institute, and which did broadly guide its work in the early period.

2. The German word that is translated as “compassion” is “Mitleid,” which could alternately be translated as “pity,” “sympathy,” or “mercy.” “Mitleid” is often rendered as “pity” in translations of Horkheimer's works; see, for example, Horkheimer 1947a, especially throughout Excursus II. “Pity” is also sometimes used in secondary discussions of Horkheimer's thought (see for example Stirk 1992). “Compassion,” rather than “pity,” is being used here for three reasons. First, it is in keeping with the translation of “Materialism and Morality” being referred to in §2.1. But “compassion” is perhaps also preferable because it is a common term to use in English discussions of the kind of moral sentiment Horkheimer is discussing. Also “pity” often carries, in everyday English, a negative connotation that is not intended in Horkheimer's thought.

3. It must be noted, though, that the object of critique in each case is a bit different. In “Notes on Science and the Crisis,” for example, it is clearly the sciences themselves that are being critiqued. When “positivism” is being critiqued, though, it is a philosophical theory--a theory about the sciences--rather than scientific practice itself that is under attack. In many cases, this distinction is not clearly drawn, perhaps because it is taken for granted that the sciences actually behave a manner that is consonant with the positivist conception. It is also worth noting that Horkheimer was perhaps not entirely fair in his assessment of logical positivism; see, for example, O'Neill and Uebel 2004.

4. The the exact division of labor in the authorship of Dialectic of Enlightenment is a matter of some scholarly dispute. For their own part, the two authors attest that they wrote the entire work in a fully collaborative fashion; a preface to a reissued edition notes that “no one who was not involved in the writing could easily understand to what extent we both feel responsible for every sentence” (Horkheimer 1947a, p. xi). The editor's afterword to the 2002 English edition of the work stresses that this claim was not made solely for “external considerations,” and cites as evidence a letter from Adorno to Horkheimer which notes that “every sentence belongs to us both” (Schmid Noerr 2002, pp. 219-220). But it can be argued on various bases that the authorship of different parts can be divided. For example, the fact that some draft chapters appear in the collected papers of one of the authors but not the other might suggest divided authorship (much more information on this point can be found in Schmid Noerr 2002). Also, one might point to supposed internal stylistic differences; this is notably argued by Jürgen Habermas. Habermas further claims that Adorno's wife confirmed to him the view, “which is at any rate obvious to careful readers,” that the first chapter (“The Concept of Enlightenment”) and Excursus II (on de Sade) were primarily Horkheimer's work, while other parts (most notably the chapter on the culture industry) were written by Adorno (Habermas 1993, 57). Of course, there is no necessary contradiction between the notion that the authorship was collaborative and the possibility that one of the authors initially drafted a particular part.

5. Per the critique of the emphasis on usefulness, American pragmatism receives harsh criticism in Eclipse of Reason (especially pp. 29-39). It is outside the scope of this entry to fully discuss Horkheimer's views on pragmatism. It has been forcefully argued that Horkheimer misconstrued the thought of the classical pragmatists; see, for instance, Joas 1993 (especially chapters 3 and 4). Joas is extremely critical of Horkheimer and the Frankfurt School more generally. Joas argues, among other things, that Horkheimer largely relied on Scheler's (also, in Joas's view, mistaken) interpretation of the pragmatists, but the footnotes and quotes in Eclipse suggest that Horkheimer did a fair amount of work with the primary texts. Nonetheless, Joas is surely right to argue that Horkheimer was not the best interpreter of the pragmatists. Pragmatism and critical theory are not, one must add, necessarily at odds; see, for example, the essays in Aboulafia 2002.