Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Supplement to The Problem of Evil

The Validity of the Argument

That the argument is deductively valid can be seen as follows. First, let us introduce the following abbreviations:

The argument just set out can then be formulated as follows:

(1) x[State(x) ∧ (Dying(x) ∨ Suffering(x)) ∧ Bad(x) ∧
y(Omnipotent(y) → HasPowerToPreventWithout(y,x))]
(2) x[State(x) → ∀z¬PreventsExistence(z,x)]
(3) xy[(Bad(x) ∧ HasPowerToPreventWithout(y,x) ∧ ¬PreventsExistence(y,x))   →
¬(Omniscient(y) ∧ MorallyPerfect(y))]

Therefore, from (1), (2), and (3),

(4) x¬[Omnipotent(x) ∧ Omniscient(x) ∧ MorallyPerfect(x)]
(5) x[God(x) → (Omnipotent(x) ∧ Omniscient(x) ∧ MorallyPerfect(x))]


(6) ¬∃x(God(x))

The premises here are (1), (2), (3), and (5), and they can be shown to entail the conclusion, (6), as follows.

The Inference from (1), (2), and (3) to (4)

(i) State(A) ∧ (Dying(A) ∨ Suffering(A)) ∧ Bad(A) ∧ ∀y(Omnipotent(y) → HasPowerToPreventWithout(y,A)) From (1), via EE (Existential Elimination).
(ii) z¬PreventsExistence(z,A) From (2) and 1st conjunct of (i) by UE and MP.
(iii) Omnipotent(G) Assumption for conditional proof ("G" arbitrary)
(iv) HasPowerToPreventWithout(G,A) From 4th conjunct of (i), by instantiating "G" and using MP
(v) ¬PreventsExistence(G,A) From (ii), by UE.
(vi) Bad(A) ∧ HasPowerToPreventWithout(G,A) ∧ ¬PreventsExistence(G,A)) Conjoin 3rd conjunct of (i) with (iv) and (v).
(vii) ¬(Omniscient(y) ∧ MorallyPerfect(G)) From (3) and (6), by UE and MP.
(viii) Omnipotent(G) → ¬(Omniscient(G) ∧ MorallyPerfect(G)) Conditional Proof, (iii) -- (vii).
(ix) ¬(Omnipotent(G) ∧ Omniscient(G) ∧ MorallyPerfect(G)) From (viii), by the equivalence of A→B with ¬(A∧¬B), double negation elimination, and associativity of conjunctions.
(x) x¬(Omnipotent(x) ∧ Omniscient(x) ∧ MorallyPerfect(x)) From (ix), via UI (Universal Introduction), since ‘G’ was arbitrary.

The Inference from (4) and (5) to (6)

(i) ¬[Omnipotent(G) ∧ Omniscient(G) ∧ MorallyPerfect(G)] From (4), via universal insantiation, and where ‘G’ is arbitrary.
(ii) God(G) → (Omnipotent(G) ∧ Omniscient(G) ∧ MorallyPerfect(G)) From (5) by universal instantiation.
(iii) ¬God(G) From (i) and (ii) by modus tollens
(iv) x¬(God(x) From (iii) by universal generalization, since ‘G’ was arbitrary.
(v) ¬∃x(God(x)) From (iv), by interdefinability of quantifiers.

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