Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Constitutionalism

1. Unless otherwise indicated, the term "constitutional" (and its cognate terms "constitutionalism", "constitution", and so on) should henceforth be understood to carry this richer meaning.

2. Whether Locke and Hobbes are properly invoked in this way is perhaps open to question. There is reason to believe that Locke's argument defends political, as opposed to strictly legal, limitations upon the sovereign. It might be argued that effective political limitation requires legal limitation as well, but this does not seem strictly necessary. More on this later.

3. "For to be subject to laws is to be subject to the commonwealth — that is to the sovereign — that is, to himself, which is not subjection but freedom from the laws." (Leviathan, Ch. 29, 255)

4. What Parliament does "no authority upon Earth can undo." (Sir William Blackstone) Three points are worth stressing here. First, it is not at all clear that the British Parliament ever did possess the unlimited sovereignty ascribed to it by Blackstone. Although the United Kingdom has no written constitution of the kind one finds in the United States, legal scholars are generally in agreement that Britain has, for centuries, contained an "unwritten constitution" arising from a variety of sources, including long-standing principles of the common law and landmark judicial decisions concerning the appropriate limits of Parliament's legislative power. (See Section 4 below.) Second, the British constitution also includes a number of written documents adopted at various points in its political history, a primary example being Magna Carta (1215, A.D.). Third, it is arguable that the people of the United Kingdom, in virtue of their membership in the European Community and the fact that British Courts now enforce, as binding, Community law, have in fact relinquished their unlimited sovereignty. If the law of member states (e.g. France, Denmark, and the UK) must now be consistent with Community law, and the latter is immune from legislative change or repeal through legislative acts on the part of member governments, then it can be argued that the sovereignty of the member states within the European Community has been replaced by the sovereignty of "the people of Europe."

5. Leviathan, Part 1, Ch. 13. Although Hobbes's sovereign is constitutionally unlimited, Hobbes insisted that individuals retained the right to self-preservation. It would be incoherent, Hobbes thought, for individuals to give up that right the protection of which is the very reason people have for creating a sovereign power. Although individuals retain the right to self-preservation, it is also true that Hobbes' unlimited sovereign has the right to take anyone's life if, in the sovereign's judgment, this is necessary to preserve the well being of the commonwealth.

6. Constitutional conventions are explored in Sec. 6 below. Although entrenchment is an almost universal characteristic of modern constitutions, and although one could plausibly argue that it is practically desirable, it may not be absolutely necessary. Some constitutional norms are ordinary statutes amenable to introduction and change by ordinary legislative procedures. Indeed, some constitutions are almost wholly statutory, e.g., the 1848 Italian Constitution and the constitution of New Zealand.

7. Henceforth, and unless otherwise indicated, all uses of the word "constitution" (and cognate terms) should be understood as referring to constitutional law.

8. Hercules is first introduced by Dworkin in Ch. 4 of Taking Rights Seriously and reappears in subsequent writings, most notably, Law's Empire.

9. The most influential and possibly radical critical theories are associated with the "Critical Legal Studies Movement" and "feminist jurisprudence." But not all opponents of constitutionalism take these approaches. Jeremy Waldron, for example, is highly opposed to constitutional bills of rights and their interpretation and enforcement by judges. Though partly based on skepticism about the ability of either judges or the authors of bills of rights to emulate the moral insight of Hercules with any degree of success, Waldron's arguments largely hinge on the right of autonomous, sovereign individuals to participate in political decisions affecting their own lives. This is a right which is seriously compromised by the existence of judicially enforced bills of rights in what Waldron terms "the circumstances of politics." These circumstances include: radical and deep disagreements about the right and the good, combined with a common, felt need to coordinate on a common plan of action in dealing with matters of political significance (including rights). For Waldron's views see The Dignity of Legislation and Law and Disagreement. Even though Waldron is here presented as offering a "critical theory," it is important to realize that his is not a critical theory of the sort associated with CLA or radical feminism.

10. "I no longer believe that constitutional theory constrains, or is supposed to constrain judges. Rather…it serves primarily to provide a set of rhetorical devices that judges can deploy as they believe effective." (Mark Tushnet, "Constitutional Interpretation, Character and Experience," p. 759.)