Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Causation and Manipulability

1. As Pearl readily acknowledges, his work draws on a long tradition in econometrics of interpreting equations that express causal claims as claims about the outcomes of hypothetical experiments—see, e.g., Haavelmo, 1944.

2. For a related distinction, see Hitchcock, 2001.

3. See Hitchcock, 2007 for details.

4. More accurately, the interventionist account of type causation diverges from what seems to be the natural way of extending Lewis' theory to such causes. Consider a simple example discussed in Woodward, forthcoming. C is a deterministic direct (type) cause of E but also deterministically causes E indirectly by means of n causal routes that go through C1,…, Cn. Consider the counterfactual (1) “If C1,…, Cn had not occurred, E would not have occurred”. As explained above, any counterfactual theory will need to employ such counterfactuals to capture the notion of direct cause or causation along a route. On the interventionist account of the relationship between causal claims and counterfactuals, (1) is false, since under the assumption of the antecedent of (1), C will still occur and will cause E. Intuitively, this the correct assessment of (1). Under Lewis' theory, we have a choice between two different possible worlds that realize the antecedent of (1). In the first C occurs and each of the n links between C and C1,…, Cn are broken. This requires n distinct miracles. In the second world, C fails to occur and hence C1,…, Cn also fail to occur. This second world has less perfect match with the actual world than the first world, but involves only one miracle. At least for large n, Lewis' similarity ordering tells us that this second world is closer to the actual world. Thus (1) comes out true.

5. Norton (2007) provides one statement of the dominant view. In contrast, Frisch (2005) argues for an interpretation of classical electrodynamics that relies on “rich causal assumptions”, understood in explicitly interventionist terms. Frisch's position thus represents a third alternative to the two possibilities distinguished above.

6. Yet another possible position would be to hold that causal claims play a central role in fundamental physics but that for the reasons described above, interventionist accounts fail to capture this role. However interventionist accounts are successful at elucidating causal claims in the special sciences. On this view, causal claims in fundamental physics would need to be given some other, non-interventionist elucidation.

7. The most promising current attempt to characterize laws of nature in non-modal or non-counterfactual terms is the Mill-Ramsey-Lewis theory (Lewis, 1973). For criticisms see Woodward, 2003 and Maudlin, 2007. It is also worth emphasizing that even if it is not possible to provide reductivist truth conditions for (14.1), it might still be argued that an account in terms of underlying laws and mechanisms provides a better treatment of the content of causal claims like “G causes recovery from disease D” then an account that appeals to interventionist counterfactuals like (14.1). This raises general issues about the adequacy of law-based and mechanism based account of causation that are beyond the scope of this entry.