Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Afterlife

1. This is so, even though the Buddhist “no-self doctrine” renders problematic the individual's survival from one lifetime to the next. Such survival is never denied outright; to do so would undermine the karma doctrine which is central to religious practice.

2. Marxist societies may constitute an exception to this, to the extent that they were successful in suppressing religious belief. On the other hand, the failure to offer religious consolation to individuals may partially account for the rapid collapse of Marxism for most people in those societies.

3. Over a period of time Theseus' ship had every one of its planks removed and replaced, so that none of the original wood remained. However, the original planks were kept, and eventually reassembled into a ship. The question, of course, is, Which is the “real” ship of Theseus?

4. “Materialism” will be used here to refer to the view that human beings are purely material creatures; the persons so identified do not in general hold that God is a material being.

5. An apparent exception is psychologist Susan Blackmore, who does discuss a number of cases involving apparent paranormal perception (Blackmore 1993, pp. 111-35). She seems to be genuinely curious about these cases, and acknowledges that if the claims made are correct her own naturalistic theory is inadequate. But her main concern throughout is to dismiss the claims, and she readily sets aside as “unconfirmed” cases in which naturalistic explanations do not seem to be possible. Gary Habermas has pointed out that a good bit of additional confirming evidence is in fact available (Habermas 1996, Moreland and Habermas 1998, pp. 206-10), but Blackmore has not returned to the topic or responded to the additional evidence.