## Notes to Interpretations of Probability

1. Compare: apart from the assignment of ‘true’ to tautologies and ‘false’ to contradictions, deductive logic is silent regarding the assignment of truth values.

2. It turns out that the axiomatization that Salmon gives (p. 59) is inconsistent, and thus that by his lights no interpretation could be admissible. His axiom A2 states:

If “Ais a subclass ofB,P(A,B) = 1” (read this as “the probability ofB, givenA, equals 1”).

Let *I* be the empty class; then for all *B*,
*P*(*I*, *B*) = 1. But his A3 states:

IfBandCare mutually exclusiveP(A,B∪C) =P(A,B) +P(A,C).

Then for any *X*, *P*(*I*, *X* ∪
−*X*) = *P*(*I*, *X*) +
*P*(*I*, −*X*) = 1 + 1 = 2, which
contradicts his normalization axiom A1. Carnap (1950, 341) notes a
similar inconsistency in Jeffreys' (1939) axiomatization. This problem
is easily remedied -- simply add the qualification in A2 that
*A* is non-empty -- but it is instructive. It suggests that we
ought not take the admissibility criterion too seriously. After all,
Salmon's subsequent discussion of the merits and demerits of the
various interpretations, as judged by the ascertainability and
applicability criteria, still stands, and that is where the real
interest lies.

3.
For example, we might specify that our family consists of
distributions over the non-negative integers with a given mean,
*m*. Then it turns out that the maximum entropy distribution
exists, and is geometric:

However, not just any further constraint will solve the problem. If instead our family consists of distributions over the positive integers with finite mean, then once more there is no distribution that achieves maximum entropy. (Intuitively, the larger the mean, the more diffuse we can make the distribution, and there is no bound on the mean.)

4.
Indeed, according to the requirement of regularity (to be discussed
further in §3.5), one should not be certain of anything stronger
than *T*, on pain of irrationality!

5. The reference class problem is analogous to the “total evidence” problem for Carnap, discussed above. Intuitively, the right reference class is determined by all the evidence relevant to my longevity, and it is unclear what is and is not relevant evidence without appeal to probabilities.

6. There are subtleties that I cannot go into here, including the notion of admissibility, the relativity of chances to times, and Lewis' (1994b) revised version of the Principle.

7.
It should be noted that Gillies argues that Humphries' paradox does
*not* force non-Kolmogorovian propensities on us.

8. I am grateful to Aidan Lyon for this point.

9.
Some authors simply *define* ‘coherence’ as
conformity to the probability calculus.

10.
Still, according to some, the fair price of a bet on *E*
measures the wrong quantity: not your probability that *E* will
be the case, but rather your probability that *E* will be the
case *and* that the prize will be paid, which may be rather
less -- for example, if *E* is unverifiable. Perhaps we should
say that betting behavior can be used only to measure probabilities of
propositions of the form ‘*E* and it is verified that
*E*’. For typical bets, the distinction between
‘*E*’ and ‘*E* and it is verified that
*E*’ will not matter. But if *E* is unverifiable,
then a bet on it cannot be used to elicit the agent's probability for
it. In that case we should think of this objection as showing that the
betting interpretation is incomplete.

11. Note, however, that some authors find calibration a poor measure for evaluating degrees of belief. One probability function can be better calibrated than another even though the latter uniformly assigns higher probabilities to truths and lower probabilities to falsehoods -- see Joyce (1998).