Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Platonism in Metaphysics

1. This is the most standard way to define the terms ‘platonism’ and ‘abstract object’, but there are other definitions in the literature. E.g., some philosophers choose to define them in terms of non-spatiality but not non-temporality; and some would argue that on this definition, an abstract object could change its nature. Moreover, it is also worth noting that on some definitions of ‘physical object’, abstract objects could be physical; e.g., on one view, an object counts as a physical object just in case its existence is entailed by (true or accepted) physical theory; on this usage, abstract objects could be physical.

2. Frege (1892) argued for his view (very famously) by pointing out that if you didn't know that Ali was Clay, then you could believe one of these propositions without believing the other, and hence, that the two propositions could not be identical. (Obviously, Frege didn't use this example, since he was writing before Ali was born, but of course, the example we use to make the point is irrelevant.)

3. There are a couple of worries one might have about the exhaustiveness of the physical-mental-abstract taxonomy. First, one might think there is another category that this taxonomy overlooks, in particular, a category of social objects, or perhaps social constructions. It seems, though, that social objects would ultimately have to reduce to either physical, mental, or abstract objects. Second, one might wonder whether there is room in this taxonomy for things like the U.S. Constitution, which seems as though it should be something like an abstract object but which might not qualify as abstract, given the definition we are using here, because it seems to have temporal properties (e.g., it came into being at a certain point in time) and to have changed its nature. One solution here would be to alter the traditional definition of ‘abstract’ so that an object needn't be non-temporal to be abstract. Another solution would be to stick with the definition given above and maintain that (a) during our history, we have used the expression ‘U.S. Constitution’ to refer to different abstract objects at different times (e.g., we used to use it to refer to an entity that did not include the fourteenth amendment, but today, in ordinary cases, we use it to refer to an entity that does include that amendment); and (b) the various abstract objects here have always existed and never changed (although they haven't always been called the ‘U.S. Constitution’ by human beings).

4. Wyman is a fictitious Meinongian in Quine's paper, “On What There Is”.

5. One might think that something is missing from this new version of the One Over Many, for one might think that part of the problem is to account for how two different things could share a nature. But I think people like Devitt would say that if you can account for how object a is F and also for how b is F, then you have accounted for how a and b share a nature.

6. McX is another fictional character in Quine's paper.

7. It is worth pausing to note why this principle says only that we're committed by the singular terms in simple sentences and the existential quantifiers in existential sentences. The reason is that some singular terms and existential quantifiers are not ontologically committing. For instance, if I say ‘If Santa Claus really existed, he would be nice’, I have not committed to the existence of Santa Claus; and if I say ‘If there is a God, then there is a tooth fairy’, I have not committed to the existence of a God or a tooth fairy. This problem is avoided by concentrating on (a) singular terms within simple sentences, or atomic sentences, i.e., sentences of form ‘a is F’, ‘a is R-related to b’, ‘a, b, and c are S-related’, etc.; and (b) existential quantifiers in what I am calling existential sentences, i.e., sentences in which the existential quantifier is the main logical operator, i.e., sentences of the form ‘There is an object such that…’. Now, it would be wrong to say that these are the only sentences that are ontologically committing — e.g., we're committed by the singular term and existential quantifier in the sentence ‘Mars is a planet and there exist some teeth’, and this sentence doesn't fit into category (a) or (b) — but for present purposes, we can ignore such sentences and concentrate on sentences in categories (a) and (b).

8. Maddy did not take mathematical objects to exist outside of spacetime, so her view was not a version of platonism, as that view has been defined here. But I include her in this list, because on some definitions, she might count as a platonist, and she is often thought of as something like a platonist. In any event, we can say that her view has platonistic leanings, as is clear from the fact that it entails the existence of mathematical objects that are non-mental and, in some sense or other, non-physical (in particular, there is more to them than the physical stuff that makes up their members).

9. One might reply by saying that Jane is mistaken because her 4 is not of the culturally accepted type. But what is a type of mental object? It would not be an actual mental object in somebody's head. As we will see below, the standard view is that types, if there are such things, are abstract objects. Therefore, advocates of psychologism, who reject the existence of abstract objects, cannot appeal to types in an effort to account for mathematical error.

10. This might be a bit quick. Advocates of psychologism are not committed to denying the existence of abstract objects; they could say that while there are (or may be) such objects, it doesn't matter, because our mathematical theories aren't about such things; but I think it is fair to say that usually, the acceptance of psychologism is accompanied by a disbelief in abstract objects. Likewise, while fictionalists have to admit that arithmetical thought goes on in humans, they might want to deny that this involves the existence of ideas in the head. But on the other hand, one might use expressions like ‘ideas in the head’ to talk about whatever is going on in our heads when we think of numbers, or perhaps better, when we have number thoughts.

11. Of course, some things are supposed to exist only in our heads, e.g., beliefs; thus, to say that a belief exists only in someone's head is not to say that it doesn't exist. But for things that aren't supposed to exist only in our heads — objective things like buildings and numbers — to say that they exist only in our heads is equivalent to saying that they don't exist.

12. One might doubt that this paraphrase is really nominalistic; for it seems to commit to things like sentences and mathematical theories, and one might argue that these things are best interpreted as abstract objects.

13. Some paraphrase nominalists (e.g., Chihara 1990) maintain that it doesn't matter what we really mean. But it's hard to see what could motivate the paraphrase views if they don't capture what we really mean — especially given the viability of the fictionalist alternative to be discussed in a moment.

14. In addition to fictionalism, there is a second (much more radical) way to claim that our mathematical theories are not true: one could endorse a non-cognitivist view of mathematics, claiming that sentences like ‘3 is prime’ don't really say anything at all and, hence, aren't the sorts of things that have truth values. One such view is game formalism, which holds that mathematics is a game of symbol manipulation and that, e.g., ‘3 is prime’ is a one of the “legal results” of the game of arithmetic. This view was defended by Heine and Thomae and attacked vigorously by Frege (see Frege 1893-1903, sections 88-131). One might also interpret Wittgenstein's (1956) philosophy of mathematics as non-cognitivist, although this is controversial. The question of how to interpret Wittgenstein's view is very difficult, and we will not pursue it here.

15. It might seem odd that Quine would offer an argument for platonism, because so far, we have encountered him as a nominalist. It would be easy to explain this by saying that Quine's view on the topic of abstract objects changed during the course of his career, and that sometimes he was a platonist and sometimes he was a nominalist. There is some truth to this, but I think it is more accurate to say that (a) in the final analysis, Quine was a platonist, but (b) he was tortured by this: he didn't want to believe in abstract objects, but he didn't see how to get around the present argument.

16. See, however, Shapiro (1983a) for one objection; and for a response, see Field (1989, essay 4).

17. Sometimes, the word ‘means’ seems to express a relation between expressions. For instance, we might say that ‘Ralph has a sister’ means ‘Ralph has a female sibling’. Thus, one might object to the claim that a sentence can't mean itself by claiming that if one sentence can mean another sentence, then it ought to make sense to say that a sentence can mean itself — e.g., that ‘Ralph has a sister’ means ‘Ralph has a sister’. But it seems that the sentence “‘Ralph has a sister’ means ‘Ralph has a female sibling’” is best interpreted as saying that ‘Ralph has a sister’ means the same thing that ‘Ralph has a female sibling’ means — i.e., that these two sentences have the same meaning, or in other words, express the same proposition. For to repeat the point made in the text, if all there was to say about sentence meaning was that sentences mean themselves, where this didn't involve anything extra-linguistic, like a proposition, then sentences wouldn't say anything about the world.

18. It needs to be kept in mind here that in formulating this argument for the existence of propositions, platonists do not commit to the view that all ‘that’-clauses are singular terms that denote propositions. Consider, e.g., the sentence ‘Ralph fears that the killer is coming’. One might very well doubt that this sentence says that Ralph fears a proposition; after all, since propositions are abstract objects, they are causally inert, and so they are not very scary — for instance, they can't shoot people. One might take this as evidence that the ‘that’-clause in the above sentence (that is, in ‘Ralph fears that the killer is coming’) does not denote (or purport to denote) a proposition, and indeed, one might take it as evidence that this ‘that’-clause isn't a singular term at all. There are a number of ways that platonists could try to respond to this: they might try to argue that despite appearances, the above ‘that’-clause does denote a proposition; or they might admit that it doesn't denote a proposition (they might even admit that it's not a singular term at all) and then argue that this doesn't undermine the claim that the ‘that’-clauses in belief ascriptions denote propositions. We won't pursue the question of how platonists ought to respond to challenges of this kind.

19. It should be noted that there is a second, deeply related, argument for the existence of propositions. In a nutshell, the argument is this: sentence tokens have meanings, and these meanings are compositionally determined by the meanings of the parts of the sentences (i.e., by the meanings of the words appearing in the sentences); therefore, there must be such things as compositional sentence meanings; but for reasons similar to the ones we have been rehearsing here in connection with the objects of belief, these meanings could not be physical or mental objects; they could only be abstract objects — in particular, they could only be objects of the sort that we've been calling propositions. (Unlike the argument in the text, however, it should be noted that this argument is an argument for the existence of propositions of a certain, specific kind, namely, Fregean propositions; see section 1 above for more on the various kinds of propositions.)

20. There is another sort of nominalist view that platonists of this sort would have to refute, namely, trope theory. (This view goes back at least to William of Ockham, but some people attribute this view, and not immanent realism, to Aristotle; others have attributed the view to Locke, Berkeley, and Hume; in any event, the view has been endorsed more recently by Stout (1914), Williams (1953), and Campbell (1990).) Trope theory holds that, e.g., red things are red because they have red tropes existing in them, where a trope is something like a particular aspect of a thing. Thus, trope theory is a bit like immanent realism, except that tropes are particulars. So whereas immanent realists maintain that red things are red because redness exists in them, trope theorists maintain that red things are red because red tropes exist in them; but the difference is that immanent realists maintain that one and the same thing (redness) exists in all red things, whereas trope theorists maintain that each red thing has its own trope. (Note that trope theory counts as a nominalist view (i.e., an anti-realist view) about properties, but that this is solely because properties are defined as universals. In a broader sense, trope theory is every bit as realist as immanent realism is, because tropes are just as real, according to trope theory, as properties are according to immanent realism, or for that matter, platonism.)

21. One might try to push the regress argument against platonists here, but it's not clear that it would succeed. If platonists say that a stands in the exemplification relation to Fness, one might ask: “How are a and Fness related to the exemplification relation?” But it's not clear that platonists can't just say that they exemplify it. There are worries that one might have about this view, but I won't pursue this here.

22. Platonists about properties who don't claim that properties are components of propositions could also try to argue that immanent realism is false because there are uninstantiated properties. They might do this by arguing for the (literal) truth of sentences like ‘The property of being a four-hundred-story building is not instantiated, but it might have been’. But one might think it would be harder to argue for the literal truth of sentences like this than sentences like ‘Johnny believes that there is a four-hundred-story building in Sally's backyard’.

23. Frege's view entailed that for every predicate, there is a concept and an extension of that concept, and as Russell pointed out in a letter to Frege, this leads to contradiction. Contemporary Fregeans, such as Boolos (1986-87), Wright (1983), and Anderson and Zalta (2004), have found ways to avoid the contradiction.

24. It might seem that if stories are best thought of as abstract objects, then fictionalism about things like mathematical objects and propositions is not a genuinely nominalistic view, because fictionalism seems to commit to the truth of sentences like “‘3 is prime’ is true in the story of mathematics.” But fictionalists can avoid this worry by taking a fictionalistic attitude about stories, or fictions. It might seem that this would lead them into an unacceptable regress, but it does not; for a discussion of this issue, see Balaguer (1998, chapter 1, section 2.2).

25. This interpretation of Gödel is a bit controversial. Evidence for it comes not just from his (1964), but also from his (1951). See Balaguer (1998, section 4.2) for a discussion.