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Nominalism in Metaphysics

First published Mon Feb 11, 2008

Nominalism comes in at least two varieties. In one of them it is the rejection of abstract objects; in the other it is the rejection of universals. Philosophers have often found it necessary to postulate either abstract objects or universals. And so Nominalism in one form or another has played a significant role in the metaphysical debate since at least the Middle Ages, when versions of the second variety of Nominalism were introduced. The two varieties of Nominalism are independent from each other and either can be consistently held without the other. However both varieties share some common motivations and arguments. This entry surveys nominalistic theories of both varieties.

1. What is Nominalism?

The word ‘Nominalism’, as used by contemporary philosophers in the Anglo-American tradition, is ambiguous. In one sense, its most traditional sense deriving from the Middle Ages, it implies the rejection of universals. In another, more modern but equally entrenched sense, it implies the rejection of abstract objects. To say that these are distinct senses of the word presupposes that universal and abstract object do not mean the same thing. And in fact they do not. For although different philosophers mean different things by universal, and likewise by abstract object, according to widespread usage a universal is something that can be instantiated by different entities and an abstract object is something that is neither spatial nor temporal.

Thus there are (at least) two kinds of Nominalism, one that maintains that there are no universals and one that maintains that there are no abstract objects.[1] Realism about universals is the doctrine that there are universals, and Platonism is the doctrine that there are abstract objects.

But Nominalism is not simply the rejection of universals or abstract objects. For if that were the case, a nihilist, someone who believed that there are no entities at all, would count as a nominalist. Similarly, someone who rejected universals or abstract objects but were agnostic about the existence of particulars or concrete objects would count as a nominalist. Given how the term ‘Nominalism’ is used in contemporary philosophy, such philosophers would not be nominalists. The word ‘Nominalism’ carries an implication that the corresponding doctrine asserts that everything is particular or concrete, and that this is not vacuously true.

Thus one kind of Nominalism asserts that there are particular objects and that everything is particular, and the other asserts that there are concrete objects and that everything is concrete.

As noted above, the two forms of nominalism are independent. The possibility of being a nominalist in one sense but not in the other has been exemplified in the history of philosophy. For instance, David Armstrong (1978; 1997) is a believer in universals, and so he is not a nominalist in the sense of rejecting universals, but he believes that everything that exists is spatiotemporal, and so he is a nominalist in the sense of rejecting abstract objects. And there are those who, like Quine at a certain point of his philosophical development (1964; 1981), accept sets or classes and so are not nominalists in the sense of rejecting abstract objects and yet reject universals and so are nominalists in the sense of rejecting universals.

Thus Nominalism, in both senses, is a kind of anti-realism. For one kind of Nominalism denies the existence, and therefore the reality, of universals and the other denies the existence, and therefore the reality, of abstract objects. But what does Nominalism claim with respect to the entities alleged by some to be universals or abstract objects, e.g. properties, numbers, propositions, possible worlds? Here there are two general options: (a) to deny the existence of the alleged entities in question, and (b) to accept the existence of these entities but to argue that they are particular or concrete.

Sometimes Nominalism is identified with those positions exemplifying strategy (a). But this seems to be based on the thought that what makes a position nominalist is the rejection of properties, numbers, propositions, etc. In this entry, however, I shall understand Nominalism in a broader way, namely as encompassing positions implementing strategies (a) or (b) above. For Nominalism has nothing against properties, numbers, propositions, possible worlds, etc., as such. What Nominalism finds uncongenial in entities like properties, numbers, possible worlds and propositions is that they are supposed to be universals or abstract objects.

Thus according to my usage in this entry, acceptance of the existence of properties, propositions, possible worlds and numbers is compatible with being a nominalist. What is required of nominalists who accept the existence of numbers, properties, possible worlds and propositions is that they think of them as particulars or concrete objects.[2]

2. Abstract objects and universals

2.1 Abstract Objects

What is an abstract object? There is no standard definition of the phrase. Perhaps the most common conception of abstract objects is that of non-spatiotemporal and causally inert objects. Often the requirement that abstract objects are causally inert is not an independent condition but is derived from the requirement that abstract objects are not spatiotemporal since it is assumed that only spatiotemporal entities can enter in causal relations.

But this conception of abstract objects has been criticised. Games and languages are supposedly abstract and yet they are temporal entities, since they come into being at a certain point in time, and some of them develop and change in time (Hale 1987, 49). Defining abstract objects simply as causally inert objects also presents problems (see, for example, the entry on abstract objects).

There have been other proposals as to how to characterise abstract objects. One approach defines abstract objects as those the understanding of whose names involves a recognition that the named object is in the range of a certain functional expression (Dummett 1973, 485). It has also been thought that an abstract object is one that fails to exemplify existence (Zalta 1983, 12), or an object that could exist but does not (Zalta 1983, 60, 96). On another conception of abstract objects these are objects that cannot exist separately from other entities (Lowe 1995, 514).[3] (For a discussion of the various ways of characterising the abstract/concrete distinction see Burgess and Rosen 1997, 13-25)

There are thus several alternative conceptions of abstract objects. But in what follows I shall take abstract objects to be those that are non-spatiotemporal and causally inert. This is because what motivates Nominalism (in one of its senses) is basically the rejection of non-spatiotemporal and causally inert objects. That is, the nominalist sees trouble with abstract objects simply because he sees trouble with non-spatiotemporal, causally inert objects. That this is so can be seen from the fact that nominalist theories are often motivated by empiricist or naturalist views, which find no place for non-spatiotemporal, causally inert objects.[4] Thus, for example, one of the main problems with mathematical objects — a subclass of abstract objects — from a nominalist point of view is that it is not easy to see how we can come to have knowledge or form reliable beliefs about them and refer to them, since there are no causal relations between them and us. But this presupposes that what makes abstract objects problematic is their causal inertness. And the source of their causal inertness might be their lack of spatiotemporality.

The characterisation of abstract objects as non-spatiotemporal and causally inert objects might be thought unsatisfactory to the extent that it tells us only what they are not, but not what they are. But this is not a problem for the nominalist. The business of the nominalist is to reject such objects, not to characterise them in a positive way. And for the purposes of rejecting abstract objects, their characterisation as non-spatiotemporal, causally inert objects is a reasonably clear characterisation (at least as clear as the notions of spatiotemporal object, causation, causal power, and related ones are).

Historically the distinction between abstract and concrete objects has been thought of as exclusive and exhaustive. But the exhaustiveness of the distinction has recently been questioned. Linsky and Zalta argue that while abstract objects are necessarily abstract, there are objects which are not concrete but could have been concrete. These objects are non-concrete in virtue of being non-spatiotemporal and causally inert but they are not abstract since they could have been concrete (Linsky and Zalta 1994). Since Nominalism rejects abstract objects because of their non-spatiotemporality and their causal inertness, Nominalism also rejects non-concrete objects.

2.2 Universals

The nominalist about universals rejects universals — but what are they? The distinction between particulars and universals is usually taken to be both exhaustive and exclusive, but whether there is such a distinction is controversial.[5] The distinction can be drawn in terms of a relation of instantiation: we can say that something is a universal if and only if it can be instantiated by more than one entity (whether it can be instantiated by particulars or universals) — otherwise it is a particular. Thus while both particulars and universals can instantiate entities, only universals can be instantiated. If whiteness is a universal then every white thing is an instance of it. But the things that are white, e.g. Socrates, cannot have any instances.[6]

Realists about universals typically think that properties (e.g. whiteness), relations (e.g. betweenness), and kinds (e.g. gold) are universals. Where do universals exist? Do they exist in the things that instantiate them? Or do they exist outside them? To maintain the second option is to maintain an ante rem realism about universals. If universals exist outside their instances then it is plausible to suppose that they exist outside space and time. If so, assuming their consequent causal inertness, universals are abstract objects. To maintain that universals exist in their instances is to maintain an in re realism about universals. If universals exist in their instances, and their instances exist in space or time, then it is plausible to think that universals exist in space or time, in which case they are concrete. In this case universals can be multiply located, i.e. they can occupy more than one place at the same time, for in re universals are wholly located at each place they occupy (thus if there is whiteness in re, then such a thing can be six meters apart from itself).

Thus, both on ante rem and in re realism about universals, universals enjoy a relation with space very different from that apparently enjoyed by ordinary objects of experience like houses, horses and men. For such particulars are located in space and time and cannot be located in more than one place at the same time. But universals are either not located in space or else they can occupy more than one place at the same time.

3. Arguments against abstract objects and universals

Are there general arguments against abstract objects? There are some, although it must be said that some of the most famous deniers of abstract objects have not always based their rejection on arguments. This is the case, for instance, of Goodman and Quine who, in their Steps toward a Constructive Nominalism, base their rejection of mathematical abstract objects on a basic intuition (1947, 105).

One argument against postulating abstract objects is based on Ockham's razor. According to this principle one should not multiply entities or kinds of entities unnecessarily. Thus if one can show that certain concrete objects can perform the theoretical roles usually associated with abstract objects, one should refrain from postulating abstract objects. The effectiveness of this kind of appeal to Ockham's razor is, of course, conditional upon our having been shown that concrete objects can play the theoretical roles associated with abstract objects. But if every theoretical role played by abstracta can be played by concreta and vice versa, then one needs a further reason why one should postulate concreta only rather than abstracta only. Sometimes the only evidence for the existence of the abstracta in question is that they perform the theoretical role in question. In that case one can use the principle that one should not postulate ad hoc entities or kinds of entities unnecessarily (Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002, 210–16). That is, one should not postulate, if possible, entities for which there is no independent evidence, i.e. entities for the existence of which the only evidence available is that they satisfactorily perform a certain theoretical role.

Another common and widely discussed argument against abstract objects is an epistemological argument. The argument is grounded in the thought that given that abstract objects are causally inert, it is difficult to understand how we can have knowledge or reliable belief about them. Sometimes a similar argument is advanced according to which the problem with Platonism is that, given the causal inertness of abstract objects, it cannot explain how linguistic or mental reference to abstract objects is possible (see Benacerraf 1973 and Field 1989, 25–7). Admittedly these arguments do not conclusively establish Nominalism but, if they work, they show an explanatory lacuna in Platonism. The challenge for the Platonist is to explain how knowledge of and reference to abstract objects is possible. Most of the debate with respect to this argument has concentrated on the particular application of the argument to the case of mathematical objects (for more on this debate see the entry on Platonism in metaphysics and Burgess and Rosen 1997, pp. 35–60)

Another, now less common, argument against Platonism, is that its ontology is unintelligible. Sometimes the unintelligibility of abstract objects is linked to their lack of clear and intelligible conditions of identity. But it is not the abstractness of abstract objects what makes them lack clear identity conditions, since some abstract objects, like sets, have clear and intelligible conditions of identity. But the identity conditions for sets are intelligible only if the notion of a set is intelligible. Some, like Goodman, are apparently unable to understand how different entities can be composed out of the same ultimate constituents. But, again, it is not in virtue of being abstract, i.e. non-spatiotemporal and causally inert, that sets violate Goodman's principle on composition. For there could be simple abstract objects.

Many of these arguments and motivations for the rejection of abstract objects are also arguments and motivations for rejecting non-spatiotemporal ante rem universals. But Ockham's razor can also be used against universals conceived of as spatiotemporal entities, provided it can be shown that particulars can play the theoretical roles normally assigned to in re universals. For even if they are spatiotemporal, universals are nevertheless a distinctive kind of entity.

There are other more specific arguments against universals. One is that postulating such things leads to a vicious infinite regress. For suppose there are universals, both monadic and relational, and that when an entity instantiates a universal, or a group of entities instantiate a relational universal, they are linked by an instantiation relation. Suppose now that a instantiates the universal F. Since there are many things that instantiate many universals, it is plausible to suppose that instantiation is a relational universal. But if instantiation is a relational universal, when a instantiates F, a, F and the instantiation relation are linked by an instantiation relation. Call this instantiation relation i2 (and suppose it, as is plausible, to be distinct from the instantiation relation (i1) that links a and F). Then since i2 is also a universal, it looks as if a, F, i1 and i2 will have to be linked by another instantiation relation i3, and so on ad infinitum. (This argument has its source in Bradley 1893, 27–8.)

Whether this regress shows some sort of incoherence in realism about universals or is merely uneconomical is a debatable issue. The realist about universals can, however, maintain that the regress is illusory, for instance by maintaining that although particulars instantiate universals, this involves no relation between them (Armstrong 1997, 118).[7]

Other arguments against universals are based on the principles that there cannot be necessary connections between wholly distinct existences and that no two things can be composed of exactly the same parts.[8] Consider the universal methane. A molecule instantiates methane if and only if it consists of four hydrogen atoms bonded to a single carbon atom. Thus, necessarily, methane is instantiated only if carbon is instantiated. But this seems to be a necessary connection between two wholly distinct entities, the universals methane and carbon. One answer here is that methane and carbon are not wholly distinct universals since the universal carbon is a component or a part of the universal methane, the other parts being the universal hydrogen and the relational universal bonded. The problem here is that a molecule instantiates butane if and only if it consists of a chain of four carbon atoms, with the adjacent ones bonded, and the end carbon atoms are bonded to three hydrogen atoms each, while the middle carbon atoms are bonded to two hydrogen atoms each (thus the formula for butane is CH3-CH2-CH2-CH3). So, if butane is not to be necessarily connected to wholly distinct universals, one should say that carbon, hydrogen and bonded are the parts of butane. But then methane and butane are composed of exactly the same parts. So it looks as if structural universals (i.e. universals like methane and butane, such that whatever instantiates them must consist of parts instantiating certain universals and standing in certain relations to each other) offend either against the principle that there are no necessary connections between wholly distinct existence or the principle that no two entities can be composed of exactly the same parts (see Lewis 1986b for further discussion).

This, in itself, is not an argument against universals per se but only against structural universals. Even so, if a theory of universals must postulate states of affairs, as Armstrong thinks it must, then the argument can be made to work against universals in general. For the state of affairs that Rab (where R is any non-symmetrical relation) necessitates that b exists, which seems to be a necessary connection between wholly distinct existences. And saying that a, b and R are parts of the states of affairs that Rab is trouble if one thinks that no two entities can be composed of exactly the same parts, for the distinct state of affairs that Rba would also be composed of a, b and R. There are two things the defender of universals can do: (a) to accept simple, non-structural universals but reject both structural universals and states of affairs; (b) to accept that some entities can be composed of exactly the same parts (provided they are related in different ways). (b) seems to be more popular among realists about universals. (See Armstrong 1986, Forrest 1986b and Armstrong 1997, 31–38 for further discussion).

4. Varieties of Nominalism

4.1 Nominalism about universals

Given that nominalists about universals believe only in particulars, there are two strategies that they might implement regarding the question of the alleged existence of allegedly universal entities like properties and relations. One strategy is to reject the existence of such entities. Another strategy is to accept that such entities exist but to deny that they are universals. Both strategies have been implemented in the history of philosophy. One way to implement these strategies is to provide nominalistically acceptable paraphrases or analyses of sentences that appear (a) to be true and (b) imply the existence of universals. Another way, more fashionable nowadays, is to give a nominalistic account of the truthmakers for sentences that are apparently made true by universals.

What follows is a brief review of the main nominalistic positions of this sort, and of some of the problems they face. For the sake of brevity I shall illustrate the positions only with respect to properties. The extension to kinds and relations is straightforward and only occasionally do I say what a certain theory says about relations.

Properties are entities that are meant to play different theoretical roles. For instance, one role they are meant to play is that of being the semantic values of predicates. Another role is that of accounting for similarity and the causal powers of things. But there is no reason why these different roles should be played by one and the same kind of entity. When philosophers nowadays discuss the issue of universals they normally think of properties as entities that account for the similarity and causal powers of things. Properties in this sense are sometimes called sparse properties, as opposed to abundant properties (the distinction between sparse and abundant properties comes from Lewis 1983). Sparse properties are those which would be sufficient to account for the similarity and causal powers of things, and to characterise them completely and without redundancy. In what follows it is assumed, for the sake of example, that properties like being square and being scarlet count as sparse.

The question that realists and nominalists about universals try to answer is: what makes F-things F (where “F” is a sparse property predicate)? For instance, what makes a square thing square? For the realist about universals if something is square, this is in virtue of the thing instantiating the universal squareness. In general, for the realist about universals, things have the sparse properties they do in virtue of instantiating universals.

How do nominalists answer this question? A popular nominalist theory of properties is so-called Trope Theory, which has been held by Donald Williams (1953) and Keith Campbell (1990), among others. Trope theory does not reject the existence of properties, but takes properties to be certain entities usually called ‘tropes’. Tropes are particulars, in the same sense in which individual people and individual apples are particulars. Thus when there is a scarlet apple the scarletness of the apple is not a universal but a particular scarletness, the scarletness of this apple, which exists exactly where and when this apple is scarlet.[9] Such a particular scarletness is a trope. The apple is scarlet not in virtue of instantiating a universal but in virtue of possessing a scarlet trope.

But what makes scarlet tropes scarlet tropes? One possible answer here is that scarlet tropes are scarlet tropes because they resemble each other, where resemblance is not explained in terms of instantiating some same universal. Of course crimson tropes also resemble each other. What makes a trope scarlet is that it resembles these tropes (the scarlet ones) as opposed to resembling those ones (the crimson ones).

Another answer would be that scarlet tropes form a primitive natural class. But whether or not what makes scarlet tropes scarlet tropes is that they resemble each other, scarlet tropes do resemble each other. And the fact that they do posits an important problem. This is the problem of the resemblance regress. Suppose that a, b and c are scarlet apples. If so, each one has its own scarlet trope: call them sa, sb, and sc. Since sa, sb, and sc are scarlet tropes, every two of them resemble each other. But then there are three resemblance tropes as well: the resemblance between sa and sb, the resemblance between sa and sc, and the resemblance between sb and sc. But these resemblance tropes, since they are resemblance tropes, resemble each other. So there are ‘second-order’ resemblance tropes: the resemblance between the resemblance between sa and sb and the resemblance between sa and sc, the resemblance between the resemblance between sa and sb and the resemblance between sb and sc, and the resemblance between the resemblance between sa and sc and the resemblance between sb and sc. But these ‘second-order’ resemblance tropes resemble each other. So there are ‘third-order’ resemblance tropes, and so on ad infinitum.

There are some ways out for the trope theorist. One solution is to argue that the regress is not vicious at all and that at most it represents an increment in the number of entities (not kinds of entities) postulated by the theory. Another solution is to deny the existence of resemblance tropes and make do only with resembling tropes (for further discussion see Daly 1997 and Maurin 2002, 96–115).

There are other forms of nominalism about universals, two of which are Predicate Nominalism and Concept Nominalism. The realist about universals admits that the predicate ‘scarlet’ applies to a scarlet thing. But he says that the predicate ‘scarlet’ applies to it in virtue of its being scarlet, which is nothing else than its instantiating the universal scarletness. Similarly he says that the thing in question falls under the concept scarlet in virtue of being scarlet, which is nothing else than the thing instantiating the universal scarletness. But for Predicate Nominalism there is nothing like scarletness. According to this theory a thing is scarlet in virtue of the fact that the predicate ‘scarlet’ applies to it. Similarly, according to Concept Nominalism (or Conceptualism), there is nothing like scarletness and a thing is scarlet in virtue of its falling under the concept scarlet.[10] These two views entail that if there were no speakers or thinkers, things would not be scarlet. If only because of this many would feel inclined towards another view, called Ostrich Nominalism.[11] This view, held by Quine, among others, maintains that there is nothing in virtue of which our thing is scarlet: it just is scarlet (Devitt 1980, 97). But many think that being scarlet cannot be a metaphysically ultimate fact, but that there must be something in virtue of which scarlet things are scarlet.

Another theory is Mereological Nominalism, according to which the property of being scarlet is the aggregate of scarlet things, and for which something is scarlet in virtue of being a part of the aggregate of scarlet things.[12] An aggregate, or mereological sum, is a particular. But the theory faces a difficulty with so-called extensive properties like mass and shape. Not every part of the aggregate of square things is square since, for instance, not every sum of squares is itself square, and not every part of a square is itself square. So it is false that square things are square in virtue of being parts of the aggregate of square things.

A better theory in the same spirit is Class Nominalism, a version of which was maintained by Lewis (1983). Whether abstract or not, classes are particular on this view.[13] According to Class Nominalism properties are classes of things, and so the property of being scarlet is the class of all and only scarlet things.[14]

One problem with this theory is that no two classes can have the same members, while it does not seem that properties with the same instances need be the same. So there is no guarantee that the identification of properties with classes is correct. And even if correct, the identification is clearly not necessarily correct. Furthermore, if every F is a G and vice versa, the theory forces us to say that what makes something F is the same as what makes it G. But while every F might be a G and vice versa, it does not follow that what makes things F is the same as what makes them G.

One solution to this is to embrace a version of Modal Realism, for instance David Lewis', according to which other possible worlds exist and contain things of the same kinds as the things in the actual world (see Lewis 1986a). Then properties get identified with classes whose members need not belong to the same possible world. Thus the property of scarlet things is the class of things that are scarlet in any possible world.[15] And even if every actual F is a G and vice versa, since not every possible F is a G or vice versa, what makes something F, namely belonging to the class of actual and possible Fs, is not the same as what makes it G. The theory denies that there are and there could be necessarily coextensive properties.

A final version of Nominalism is Resemblance Nominalism. According to this theory, it is not that scarlet things resemble one another because they are scarlet, but what makes them scarlet is that they resemble one another. Thus what makes something scarlet is that it resembles the scarlet things. Similarly, what makes square things square is that they resemble one another, and so what makes something square is that it resembles the square things. Resemblance is fundamental and primitive and so either there are no properties or the properties of a thing depend on what things it resembles.

Thus on one version of the theory a property like being scarlet is a certain class whose members satisfy certain definite resemblance conditions. On another version of the theory there are no properties, but what makes scarlet things scarlet is that they satisfy certain resemblance conditions.

What are these resemblance conditions? Sometimes the resemblance conditions include some that must be satisfied, not by the things in question (e.g. not by the scarlet things) but by things suitably related to them. For instance, in the version of Resemblance Nominalism developed in Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002, what makes scarlet things scarlet is that they resemble each other, that there is a degree of resemblance d such that no two scarlet things, and no two nth-order pairs (two-membered unordered classes) whose ur-elements are scarlet things, resemble each other to a degree less than d, and that the class of scarlet things is or fails to be included in certain other classes defined in terms of resemblance conditions like the ones just mentioned (see Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002, 156–98 for details). Of course the crimson things also resemble each other and they also meet the other conditions having to do with resemblance degrees and their class being or failing to be included in certain other classes. But this does not mean that what makes something scarlet is what makes something crimson: what makes a scarlet thing scarlet is that it resembles these things (i.e. the scarlet ones), which happen to satisfy the stated conditions having to do with resemblance degrees and their class being or failing to be included in certain other classes while what makes a crimson thing crimson is that it resembles those things (i.e. the crimson ones), which also happen to satisfy the stated conditions having to do with resemblance degrees and their class being or failing to be included in certain other classes.

The resemblance nominalist ontology is an ontology of resembling particulars like horses, atoms, houses, stars, men (and classes). But the resemblance nominalist does not reify resemblance. Thus that a and b resemble each other does not require that there are three entities there: a, b and a third, relational entity that is their resemblance. The only entities involved in that situation are a and b.

Like Class Nominalism, Resemblance Nominalism faces the problem about the identity of coextensive properties, and the solution is the same, namely to adopt some version of Modal Realism according to which merely possible particulars are as real as actual ones. Thus (part of) what makes a certain apple scarlet is that it resembles all scarlet things, including merely possible scarlet things.

Russell (1912, 96–7) and others think that Resemblance Nominalism faces the resemblance regress. But this regress presupposes that resemblances are entities that can resemble one another. Since Resemblance Nominalism does not reify resemblances, the regress does not arise (see Rodriguez-Pereyra 2002, 105–23 for further discussion).

Which one of these theories is the best has to be decided by comparing how they score with respect to certain theoretical virtues, like accommodating firm and stable intuitions and common sense opinions, avoiding the unnecessary multiplication of entities, reducing the number of undefined primitive concepts, etc.

4.2 Nominalism about abstract objects

4.2.1 Nominalism about propositions

Most theories of propositions take them to be abstract or imply that they are. One can divide theories of propositions into those that take them to be structured entities and those that take them to be unstructured entities. Each conception comprises a family of theories.

The most popular conceptions of unstructured propositions are those that take them to be either sets of possible worlds or functions from possible worlds to truth-values (Lewis 1986a, 53; Stalnaker 1987, 2). On these theories a proposition is the set of possible worlds in which it is true, or a function that has the value True when it takes as argument a world where the proposition is true and has the value False when it takes as argument a world where the proposition is false.

But sets are, prima facie, abstract objects. So it looks as if those who take propositions to be sets of possible worlds should count as platonists about propositions. But some people, like Lewis (1986a, 83) and Maddy (1990, 59), believe that sets of spatiotemporally located members are spatiotemporally located where and when their members are, in which case sets of spatiotemporally located members are concrete.[16] But since it lacks any members, the empty set is not spatiotemporally located. And since there are necessarily false propositions, that is, propositions that are true in no possible world, it is plausible, on this conception of propositions, to identify these propositions with the empty set. So some propositions (at least one) seem to be abstract objects. And functions also seem to be abstract objects. And the truth values True and False seem to be abstract objects as well. So these accounts of propositions as sets of possible worlds or functions from possible worlds to truth values, if they are to be nominalistic accounts of propositions, require some consistent and plausible nominalistic account of pure sets, functions and truth values as concrete objects.

There are other theories of propositions that take them to be unstructured entities. George Bealer has a conception of unstructured propositions according to which they are sui generis irreducible intensional entities. His propositions can exist even if the objects they are about do not exist and they can be actual even if the objects they are about are not actual (Bealer 2006, 232–4). Such propositions are abstract objects.

Among conceptions of propositions as structured entities one can distinguish, roughly, between Russellian and Fregean versions. Both the Russellian and the Fregean conceptions of propositions are families of theories. In general Fregean theories will take a proposition to be a complex entity with a particular structure whose constituents are senses. But senses are abstract objects. And if, as seems plausible, a complex entity whose constituents are abstract objects must be an abstract object itself (how could an object be in space or time when its constituents exist neither in space nor time?), then, on this account, propositions are abstract objects.

According to the Russellian conception of propositions, a proposition is a complex entity with a particular structure whose constituents are particulars and/or properties and/or relations.[17] Are propositions of this sort abstract objects? If all the particulars are concrete then perhaps propositions are concrete objects, even if properties and relations are abstract. For one may say that propositions are where and when the particulars which are their constituents are. But this sounds arbitrary. Why not say that propositions are where their constituent properties and relations are, that is, nowhere? In any case, that particulars (and even properties and relations) are concrete does not immediately settle the matter whether propositions in the sense of complexes of particulars and properties and/or relations are abstract objects. For what kind of complex entities are propositions? Sometimes they are considered to be ordered sets. If this is what propositions are, then the nominalist needs a satisfactory nominalistic account of ordered sets. If propositions are another kind of complex entity, then the nominalist about propositions must make sure that objects of that kind are concrete.

One nominalist option is to show that the roles associated with propositions (e.g. being truth-bearers and objects of propositional attitudes) are actually played by concrete objects. One common thought here is to propose that sentences play the roles associated by propositions. This strategy is exemplified by Quine. In Word and Object he proposes eternal sentences as truth-bearers (Quine 1960, 208). Eternal sentences are better as truth-bearers than other sentences in being true or false independently of time, place, speaker and the like. But they are as bad as other sentences in admitting of variation in truth value from one language to another (Quine 1969, 142).[18] But note that from the point of view of a nominalist about abstract objects, there is a much worse problem with eternal sentences, namely that they may be abstract objects. They may be abstract objects because they are sentence types, and a type may be an abstract object, for instance if one takes them to be sets or abstract universals (admittedly one might attempt to take them to be non-abstract universals).

The alternative is to take concrete token sentences (utterances or written inscriptions) as the objects that play the roles normally associated with propositions. One problem here is that only a finite number of sentences ever get uttered. And so some find it difficult to make sense of general logical laws, e. g. the law that any two falsehoods form a false disjunction, since the disjunction may not get uttered or written (Quine 1969, 143). (One possible solution might be to reformulate the law so as to say that if the disjunction of P and Q exists, it is false if and only if P and Q are false).

In this area, as in many others, a nominalist strategy is to supply a nominalistically acceptable paraphrase of sentences that appear to posit abstract entities. That is, there are certain sentences that seem to be true and whose truth seems to entail that there are propositions. The nominalist can then paraphrase those sentences into others which allegedly mean the same and whose truth seems to entail only the existence of, say, token sentences. For example, ‘Seneca said that man is a rational animal’ is true and seems to entail that there is a proposition, namely what Seneca said. But according to Scheffler's inscriptionalism, on which that-clauses are treated as single predicates of concrete inscriptions, to say that Seneca said that man is a rational animal is simply to say that Seneca produced a that-man-is-a-rational-animal inscription (Scheffler 1954, 84).

So we have a sentence whose truth apparently entails the existence of propositions and an alleged paraphrase that apparently entails the existence of concrete inscriptions only. Assuming that they do have the same meaning (in which case both sentences entail exactly the same), why think that the apparent ontological commitments (i.e. those entities the truth of a sentence appears to entail) of the nominalistic paraphrase are the real ontological commitments of both the paraphrase and the original sentence? The fact that the original sentence and its paraphrase are semantically equivalent does not give any reason to think that the real ontological commitments of both are the apparent ontological commitments of the paraphrase rather than those of the original sentence. (This point has its source in Alston 1958, 9–10). What the nominalist must do is to argue that the paraphrase reveals and makes apparent the real meaning of the original sentence, so that the apparent commitments of the paraphrase are the real commitments of both paraphrase and original sentence.

Another nominalist option is to deny that there are propositions and any entities that play their theoretical roles. If so, apparently true sentences that entail the existence of propositions are false. Thus this kind of Nominalism about propositions is a sort of fictionalism, called semantic fictionalism (Balaguer 1998).[19] Thus a sentence like ‘Nestor believed that the gods do not give men all things at the same time’ is not true on this account because (a) ‘that’-clauses (like ‘that the gods do not give men all things at the same time’) are referential singular terms, (b) if anything is the referent of ‘that the gods do not give men all things at the same time’, this is a proposition, and (c) there are no propositions. Thus talk about propositions is a fiction, since there aren't any, but it is a useful fiction since it is a descriptive aid that allows us to make it easier to say what we want to say about the world and it allows us to represent the structure of certain parts of the world — for instance the logico-linguistic structure of propositions can be used to represent the empirical structure of belief states (Balaguer 1998, 817–18).

4.2.2 Nominalism about possible worlds

The word ‘Nominalism’ is not very often used to refer to any stance with respect to possible worlds. But since some philosophers take possible worlds to be abstract objects, a nominalist about possible worlds will be, for the purposes of this section, someone who thinks that possible worlds are not abstract objects, and this will include those who believe that there are no possible worlds (but not those who simply do not believe that they exist).[20]

The question about the nature of possible worlds is a hotly debated topic. Some, for instance Plantinga, think that possible worlds are states of affairs that are both possible and maximal. A maximal state of affairs is one that includes or precludes every state of affairs. According to Plantinga possible states of affairs can obtain and can fail to obtain. Some obtain at some possible worlds, others obtain at some other possible worlds. Every world obtains at itself. But there is only one world that obtains simpliciter. This is the actual world. But although the other worlds do not obtain at the actual world, they exist in the actual world. States of affairs, and therefore possible worlds, are thought of as abstract objects by Plantinga (2003, 107).

For Stalnaker possible worlds are ways the world might have been and such ways are properties (2003, 7). All these ways the world might have been actually exist but only one of them is instantiated — the way the world actually is. He naturally takes these properties to be abstract objects (2003, 32).[21] A view like this has been further developed by Peter Forrest, who proposes certain properties that he calls natures (certain conjunctions of natural non-relational properties) to play the role played by possible worlds. These natures are, for the most part, uninstantiated properties (1986a, 15). It is natural to think that they are abstract objects.[22]

Another option is to take possible worlds as maximally consistent sets of propositions. R. M. Adams (1974) sketched such a theory. If propositions are abstract objects, then on this theory possible worlds are abstract objects. But there are other options open. Adams suggests that someone might, à la Leibniz, take propositions to be thoughts in the mind of God. But if so, and if God is in time and therefore concrete, then presumably his thoughts also are. And if we assume that sets of spatiotemporally located entities are spatiotemporally located (because they are wherever and whenever their members are), then sets of concrete objects are concrete. Thus sets of thoughts of a concrete deity are concrete.

Another option would be to take possible worlds as sets of spacetime points and think of each such set as representing the possibility that all and only the points in it are occupied (the view is proposed as an illustration in Cresswell 1972, 136).[23] This assumes, as Cresswell notes, that all properties of things are determined by the properties of certain basic entities whose properties can all be expressed in terms of the spacetime they occupy. If sets of spacetime points can be seen as concrete then this might be a way of taking possible worlds as concrete. This view derives from certain passages by Quine, where he develops the idea that every distribution of space points could be taken as a possible world momentary state (1969, 148). But to avoid certain difficulties (some having to do with ontological economy, others having to do with the notion of a point and the relativity of position), Quine proposes to bypass spacetime points and takes possible worlds as certain sets of number quadruples (Quine 1969, 151). To be nominalistically acceptable this account of possible worlds would need to be accompanied by a nominalistically acceptable treatment of sets and numbers.

All the previously mentioned accounts of possible worlds are actualist in the sense that they take actual existence and existence simpliciter to coincide. One of the most developed nominalisitic accounts of possible worlds, that of David Lewis, is not actualist but possibilist: according to Lewis to exist simpliciter is one thing and to be actual is another. For Lewis ‘actual’ is an indexical predicate so that from the point of view of each world only that world is actual and none of the others are. Thus unlike Plantinga, Adams, and Stalnaker, Lewis does not take every possible world to exist actually.

For Lewis possible worlds are maximal sums of spatiotemporally related objects. A sum of spatiotemporally related objects is maximal if and only if nothing that is not part of the sum is spatiotemporally related to any part of the sum in question. Since sums of spatiotemporally related objects are sums of concrete objects, and sums of concrete objects are concrete objects, Lewisian possible worlds are concrete objects.[24][25]

Another nominalistic theory about possible worlds has been developed by David Armstrong. Armstrong has an actualist combinatorialist theory of possibility, according to which what is possible is determined by appropriate combinations of actual elements (particulars and universals). The basic notion in Armstrong's theory of possibility and possible worlds is that of an atomic state of affairs. A state of affairs brings together a particular and a universal (if the universal is a property), or some particulars and a universal (if the universal is a relation).[26]

These elements (particulars and universals) define a range of combinations, some of them actualised, some not. These combinations must respect the form of states of affairs (thus Aristotle's being wise is an actualised combination, Aristotle's being a general is an unactualised combination, and wisdom's being Aristotle does not respect the form of states of affairs and so does not fall in the range of combinations defined by particulars and universals). The possible atomic states of affairs are the combinations of particulars and universals which respect the form of states of affairs. The merely possible atomic states of affairs are the recombinations of particulars and universals, i.e. those combinations which do not actually occur, like Aristotle's being a general.[27] Possible worlds are, for Armstrong, conjunctions of possible atomic states of affairs (1989, 47, 48).[28]

Armstrong's combinatorialism is actualist in the sense that everything that exists actually exists. But he does not identify his merely possible states of affairs and merely possible worlds with actually existing entities. So merely possible states of affairs and worlds do not actually exist and, therefore, given Armstrong's actualism, do not exist at all (Armstrong 1989, 49).

In believing that possible worlds do not exist, Armstrong is a kind of fictionalist about possible worlds, and so he calls himself (1989, 49). But if one believes that possible worlds do not exist, and so one is a fictionalist about possible worlds in this sense, one can also be a fictionalist about possible worlds in a different sense, namely the sense of so-called modal fictionalism. According to modal fictionalism sentences with an apparent quantification over possible worlds must be understood as quantification within the scope of a story prefix (Rosen 1990, 332). Let PW be a theory that postulates possible worlds. ‘According to PW’ is then a story prefix.[29] Thus the modal fictionalist says that when he utters ‘There is a possible world where there are blue swans’ what he is really saying is that according to PW there is a world where there are blue swans (Rosen 1990, 332). But since quantification within a story prefix is not existentially committing, the modal fictionalist can utter things like ‘Since there might have been blue swans, there is a possible world where there are blue swans’ without committing himself to possible worlds.[30]

Now, from the point of view of a nominalist, adoption of modal fictionalism must be coupled with some sort of nominalistically acceptable account of stories, or theories, or representations in general. For accepting something like ‘According to PW there are worlds where there are blue swans’ seems to commit one to PW, and PW is a theory, and so one seems thereby committed to theories. But theories seem to be abstract objects. So the fictionalist nominalist needs a nominalist account of theories. If, for instance, theories are sets of propositions, a nominalist account of sets and propositions would do as a nominalistic account of theories.[31]


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abstract objects | Platonism: in metaphysics | properties | propositions | simplicity | tropes | universals: the medieval problem of