Functionalism in the philosophy of mind is the doctrine that what makes something a mental state of a particular type does not depend on its internal constitution, but rather on the way it functions, or the role it plays, in the system of which it is a part. This doctrine is rooted in Aristotle's conception of the soul, and has antecedents in Hobbes's conception of the mind as a “calculating machine”, but it has become fully articulated (and popularly endorsed) only in the last third of the 20th century. Though the term ‘functionalism’ is used to designate a variety of positions in a variety of other disciplines, including psychology, sociology, economics, and architecture, this entry focuses exclusively on functionalism as a philosophical thesis about the nature of mental states.
The following sections will trace the intellectual antecedents of contemporary functionalism, sketch the different types of functionalist theories, and discuss the most serious objections to them.
- 1. What is Functionalism?
- 2. Antecedents of Functionalism
- 3. Varieties of Functionalism
- 4. Constructing Plausible Functional Theories
- 5. Objections to Functionalism
- 6. The Future of Functionalism
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- Related Entries
Functionalism is the doctrine that what makes something a thought, desire, pain (or any other type of mental state) depends not on its internal constitution, but solely on its function, or the role it plays, in the cognitive system of which it is a part. More precisely, functionalist theories take the identity of a mental state to be determined by its causal relations to sensory stimulations, other mental states, and behavior.
For (an avowedly simplistic) example, a functionalist theory might characterize pain as a state that tends to be caused by bodily injury, to produce the belief that something is wrong with the body and the desire to be out of that state, to produce anxiety, and, in the absence of any stronger, conflicting desires, to cause wincing or moaning. According to this theory, all and only creatures with internal states that meet these conditions, or play these roles, are capable of being in pain.
Suppose that, in humans, there is some distinctive kind of neural activity (C-fiber stimulation, for example) that meets these conditions. If so, then according to this functionalist theory, humans can be in pain simply by undergoing C-fiber stimulation. But the theory permits creatures with very different physical constitutions to have mental states as well: if there are silicon-based states of hypothetical Martians or inorganic states of hypothetical androids that also meet these conditions, then these creatures, too, can be in pain. As functionalists often put it, pain can be realized by different types of physical states in different kinds of creatures, or multiply realized. (See entry on Multiple Realization.) Indeed, since descriptions that make explicit reference only to a state's causal relations with stimulations, behavior, and one another are what have come to be known as “topic-neutral” (Smart, 1959) — that is, as imposing no logical restrictions on the nature of the items that satisfy the descriptions — then it's also logically possible for non-physical states to play the relevant roles, and thus realize mental states, in some systems as well. So functionalism is compatible with the sort of dualism that takes mental states to cause, and be caused by, physical states.
Still, though functionalism is officially neutral between materialism and dualism, it has been particularly attractive to materialists, since many materialists believe (or argue; see Lewis, 1966) that it is overwhelmingly likely that any states capable of playing the roles in question will be physical states. If so, then functionalism can stand as a materialistic alternative to the Psycho-Physical Identity Thesis, the thesis that each type of mental state is identical with a particular type of neural state. This thesis, once considered the dominant materialistic theory of the mind, entails that no creatures with brains unlike ours can share our sensations, beliefs, and desires, no matter how similar their behavior and internal organization may be to our own. This is a consequence that many regard as implausible (but see Hill, 1991, for a spirited defense). Thus functionalism, with its claim that mental states can be multiply realized, is widely regarded as providing a more inclusive, less “(species-) chauvinistic” (Block, 1980) — and thus more plausible — theory that is (at least arguably) compatible with materialism.
Within this broad characterization of functionalism, however, a number of distinctions can be made. One of particular importance is the distinction between theories in which the functional characterizations of mental states purport to provide analyses of the meanings of our mental state terms, and theories that permit functional characterizations of mental states to appeal to information deriving from scientific experimentation (or speculation). (See Shoemaker, 1984c, and Rey, 1997, for further discussion and more fine-grained distinctions.) There are other important differences among functionalist theories as well. These (sometimes orthogonal) differences, and the motivations for them, can best be appreciated by examining the origins of functionalism and tracing its evolution in response both to explicit criticisms of the thesis and changing views about the nature of psychological explanation.
Although functionalism attained its greatest prominence as a theory of mental states in the last third of the 20th century, it has antecedents in both modern and ancient philosophy, as well as in early theories of computation and artificial intelligence.
The earliest view that can be considered an ancestor of functionalism is Aristotle's theory of the soul (350 BCE). In contrast to Plato's claim that the soul can exist apart from the body, Aristotle argued (De Anima Bk. II, Ch. 1) that the (human) soul is the form of a natural, organized human body — the set of powers or capacities that enable it to express its “essential whatness”, which for Aristotle is a matter of fulfilling the function or purpose that defines it as the kind of thing it is. Just as form of an axe is whatever enables it to cut, and the form of an eye is whatever enables it to see, the (human) soul is to be identified with whichever powers and capacities enable a natural, organized human body to fulfill its defining function, which, according to Aristotle, is to survive and flourish as a living, acting, perceiving, and reasoning being. So, Aristotle argues, the soul is inseparable from the body, and comprises whichever capacities are required for a body to live, perceive, reason, and act.
A second, relatively early, ancestor of contemporary functionalism is Hobbes's (1651) account of reasoning as a kind of computation that proceeds by mechanistic principles comparable to the rules of arithmetic. Reasoning, he argues, is “nothing but reckoning, that is adding and subtracting, of the consequences of general names agreed upon for the marking and signifying of our thoughts.” (Leviathan, Ch. 5) In addition, Hobbes suggests that reasoning — along with imagining, sensing, and deliberating about action, all of which proceed according to mechanistic principles — can be performed by systems of various physical types. As he puts it in his Introduction to Leviathan, where he likens a commonwealth to an individual human, “why may we not say that all automata (engines that move themselves by springs and wheels…) have an artificial life? For what is the heart but a spring; and the nerves but so many strings, and the joints but so many wheels…”. It was not until the middle of the 20th century, however, that it became common to speculate that thinking may be nothing more than rule-governed computation that can be carried out by creatures of various physical types.
In a seminal paper (Turing, 1950), A.M. Turing proposed that the question, “Can machines think?” can be replaced by the question, “Is it theoretically possible for a finite state digital computer, provided with a large but finite table of instructions, or program, to provide responses to questions that would fool an unknowing interrogator into thinking it is a human being?” Now, in deference to its author, this question is most often expressed as “Is it theoretically possible for a finite state digital computer (appropriately programmed) to pass the Turing Test?” (See Turing Test entry)
In arguing that this question is a legitimate replacement for the original (and speculating that its answer is “yes”), Turing identifies thoughts with states of a system defined solely by their roles in producing further internal states and verbal outputs, a view that has much in common with contemporary functionalist theories. Indeed, Turing's work was explicitly invoked by many theorists during the beginning stages of 20th century functionalism, and was the avowed inspiration for a class of theories, the “machine state” theories most firmly associated with Hilary Putnam (1960, 1967), that had an important role in the early development of the doctrine.
Other important recent antecedents of functionalism are the behaviorist theories that emerged in the early-to-mid twentieth century. These include both the empirical psychological theories associated primarily with Watson and Skinner, and the “logical” or “analytical” behaviorism of philosophers such as Malcolm (1968) and Ryle (1949) (and, arguably, Wittgenstein, 1953). Though functionalism is significantly different from behaviorism in that the latter attempts to explain behavior without any reference whatsoever to mental states and processes, the development of two important strains of functionalism, “psychofunctionalism” and “analytical” functionalism, can both be profitably viewed as attempts to rectify the difficulties, respectively, of empirical and logical behaviorism, while retaining certain important insights of those theories.
As an empirical psychological theory, behaviorism holds that the behavior of humans (and other animals) can be explained by appealing solely to behavioral dispositions, that is, to the lawlike tendencies of organisms to behave in certain ways, given certain environmental stimulations. Behavioral dispositions, unlike thoughts, feelings, and other internal states that can be directly observed only by introspection, are objectively observable and are indisputably part of the natural world. Thus they seemed to be fit entities to figure centrally in the emerging science of psychology. Also, behaviorist theories promised to avoid a potential regress that appeared to threaten psychological explanations invoking internal representations, namely, that to specify how such representations produce the behaviors in question, one must appeal to an internal intelligent agent (a “homunculus”) who interprets the representations, and whose skills themselves would have to be explained.
The promise of behaviorism lay in its conviction that there could be a science of human behavior as objective and explanatory as other “higher-level” sciences such as chemistry and biology. Behaviorism indeed had some early successes, especially in the domain of animal learning, and its principles are still used, at least for heuristic purposes, in various areas of psychology. But as many psychologists (and others, e.g. Chomsky 1959) have argued, the successes of behaviorism seem to depend upon the experimenters' implicit control of certain variables which, when made explicit, involve ineliminable reference to organisms' other mental states. For example, rats are typically placed into an experimental situation at a certain fraction of their normal body weight — and thus can be assumed to feel hunger and to want the food rewards contingent upon behaving in certain ways. Similarly, it is assumed that humans, in analogous experimental situations, want to cooperate with the experimenters, and understand and know how to follow the instructions. It seemed to the critics of behaviorism, therefore, that theories that explicitly appeal to an organism's beliefs, desires, and other mental states, as well as to stimulations and behavior, would provide a fuller and more accurate account of why organisms behave as they do. They could do so, moreover, without compromising the objectivity of psychology as long as the mental states to which these theories appeal are introduced as states that together play a role in the production of behavior, rather than states identifiable solely by introspection. Thus work was begun on a range of “cognitive” psychological theories which reflected these presumptions, and an important strain of contemporary functionalism, “psycho-functionalism” (Fodor, 1968, Block and Fodor, 1972) can be seen a philosophical endorsement of these new cognitive theories of mind.
Logical behaviorism, in contrast to behaviorism as a psychological theory, is a thesis about the meanings of our mental state terms or concepts. According to logical behaviorism, all statements about mental states and processes are equivalent in meaning to statements about behavioral dispositions. So, for (again, an overly simplified) example, “Henry has a toothache” would be equivalent in meaning to a statement such as “Henry is disposed (all things being equal) to cry out or moan and to rub his jaw”. And “Amelia is thirsty” would be equivalent to a statement such as “If Amelia is offered some water, she will be disposed (all things being equal) to drink it.” These candidate translations, like all behavioristic statements, eschew reference to any internal states of the organism, and thus do not threaten to denote, or otherwise induce commitment to, properties or processes (directly) observable only by introspection. In addition, logical behaviorists argued that if statements about mental states were equivalent in meaning to statements about behavioral dispositions, there could be an unproblematic account of how mental state terms could be applied both to oneself and others, and how they could be taught and learned.
However, as many philosophers have pointed out (Chisholm, 1957; Geach, 1957), logical behaviorism provides an implausible account of the meanings of our mental state terms, since, intuitively, a subject can have the mental states in question without the relevant behavioral dispositions — and vice versa. For example, Gene may believe that it's going to rain even if he's not disposed to wear a raincoat and take an umbrella when leaving the house (or to perform any other cluster of rain-avoiding behaviors), if Gene doesn't mind, or actively enjoys, getting wet. And subjects with the requisite motivation can suppress their tendencies to pain behavior even in the presence of excruciating pain, while skilled actors can perfect the lawlike disposition to produce pain behavior under certain conditions, even if they don't actually feel pain. (Putnam, 1965) The problem, these philosophers argued, is that no mental state, by itself, can be plausibly assumed to give rise to any particular behavior unless one also assumes that the subject possesses additional mental states of various types. And so, it seemed, it was not in fact possible to give meaning-preserving translations of statements invoking pains, beliefs, and desires in purely behavioristic terms. Nonetheless, the idea that the meanings of mental state terms and concepts show an essential tie between mental states and their typical behavioral expressions is retained, and elaborated, in contemporary “analytic” functionalist theories.
As suggested earlier, it is helpful to think of functionalist theories as belonging to one of three major strains — “machine functionalism”, “psychofunctionalism” and “analytic functionalism” — and to see them as emerging, respectively, from early AI theories, empirical behaviorism, and logical behaviorism. It's important to recognize, however, that there is at least some overlap in the bloodlines of these different strains of functionalism, and also that there are functionalist theories, both earlier and more recent, that fall somewhere in between. For example, Wilfrid Sellars's (1956) account of mental states as “theoretical entities” is widely regarded as an important early version of functionalism, but it takes the proper characterization of thoughts and experiences to depend partially on their role in providing a scientific explanation of behavior, and partly on what he calls the “logic”, or the a priori interrelations, of the relevant concepts. Still, it is instructive to give separate treatment to the three major strains of the doctrine, as long as these caveats are kept in mind.
The early functionalist theories of Putnam (1960, 1967) can be seen as a response to the difficulties facing behaviorism as a scientific psychological theory, and as an endorsement of the (new) computational theories of mind which were becoming increasingly significant rivals to it. According to Putnam's machine state functionalism, any creature with a mind can be regarded as a Turing machine (an idealized finite state digital computer), whose operation can be fully specified by a set of instructions (a “machine table” or program) each having the form:
If the machine is in state Si, and receives input Ij, it will go into state Sk and produce output Ol (for a finite number of states, inputs and outputs).
A machine table of this sort describes the operation of a deterministic automaton, but most machine state functionalists (e.g. Putnam 1967) take the proper model for the mind to be that of a probabilistic automaton: one in which the program specifies, for each state and set of inputs, the probability with which the machine will enter some subsequent state and produce some particular output.
On either model, however, the mental states of a creature are to be identified with such “machine table states” (S1,…,Sn). These states are not mere behavioral dispositions, since they are specified in terms of their relations not only to inputs and outputs, but also to the state of the machine at the time. For example, if believing it will rain is regarded as a machine state, it will not be regarded as a disposition to take one's umbrella after looking at the weather report, but rather as a disposition to take one's umbrella if one looks at the weather report and is in the state of wanting to stay dry. So machine state functionalism can avoid what many have thought to be a fatal difficulty for behaviorism. In addition, machines of this sort provide at least a simple model of how internal states whose effects on output occur by means of mechanical processes can be viewed as representations (though the question of what, exactly, they represent has been an ongoing topic of discussion (see sections 4.4-5). Finally, machine table states are not tied to any particular physical (or other) realization; the same program, after all, can be run on different sorts of computer hardware.
It's easy to see, therefore, why Turing machines provided a fruitful model for early functionalist theories. But because machine table states are total states of a system, the early functionalist equation of mental states with machine table states faded in importance as a model for the functional characterization of the complex of distinct internal states that can be simultaneously realized in a human (or other) subject (Block and Fodor, 1972; Putnam, 1973). Nonetheless, the idea that internal states can be fully described in terms of their relations to input, output, and one another, and can figure in lawlike descriptions, and predictions, of a system's output, was a rich and important idea that is retained by contemporary functionalist theories.
A second strain of functionalism, psycho-functionalism, derives primarily from reflection upon the goals and methodology of “cognitive” psychological theories. In contrast to the behaviorists' insistence that the laws of psychology appeal only to behavioral dispositions, cognitive psychologists argue that the best empirical theories of behavior take it to be the result of a complex of mental states and processes, introduced and individuated in terms of the roles they play in producing the behavior to be explained. For example (Fodor's, in his 1968, Ch. 3), a psychologist may begin to construct a theory of memory by postulating the existence of “memory trace” decay, a process whose occurrence or absence is responsible for effects such as memory loss and retention, and which is affected by stress or emotion in certain distinctive ways.
On a theory of this sort, what makes some neural process an instance of memory trace decay is a matter of how it functions, or the role it plays, in a cognitive system; its neural or chemical properties are relevant only insofar as they enable that process to do what trace decay is hypothesized to do. And similarly for all mental states and processes invoked by cognitive psychological theories. Cognitive psychology, that is, is intended by its proponents to be a “higher-level” science like biology: just as, in biology, physically disparate entities can all be hearts as long as they function to circulate blood in a living organism, and physically disparate entities can all be eyes as long as they enable an organism to see, disparate physical structures or processes can be instances of memory trace decay — or more familiar phenomena such as thoughts, sensations, and desires — as long as they play the roles described by the relevant cognitive theory.
Psycho-functionalism, therefore, can be seen as straightforwardly adopting the methodology of cognitive psychology in its characterization of mental states and processes as entities defined by their role in a cognitive psychological theory. All versions of functionalism, however, can be regarded as characterizing mental states in terms of their roles in some psychological theory or other. (A more formal account of this will be given in Section 4.1 below.) What is distinctive about psycho-functionalism is its claim that mental states and processes are just those entities, with just those properties, postulated by the best scientific explanation of human behavior. This means, first, that the form of the theory can diverge from the “machine table” specifications of machine state functionalism. It also means that the information used in the functional characterization of mental states and processes needn't be restricted to what is considered common knowledge or common sense, but can include information available only by careful laboratory observation and experimentation. For example, a psychofunctional theory might be able to distinguish phenomena such as depression from sadness or listlessness even though the distinctive causes and effects of these syndromes are difficult to untangle solely by consulting intuitions or appealing to common sense. And psychofunctional theories will not include characterizations of mental states for which there is no scientific evidence, such as buyer's regret or hysteria, even if the existence and efficacy of such states is something that common sense affirms.
This may seem to be an unmitigated advantage, since psycho-functional theories can avail themselves of all the tools of inquiry available to scientific psychology, and will presumably make all, and only, the distinctions that are scientifically sound. This methodology, however, leaves psycho-functionalism open to the charge that it, like the Psycho-Physical Identity Thesis, may be overly “chauvinistic” (Block, 1980), since creatures whose internal states share the rough, but not fine-grained, causal patterns of ours wouldn't count as sharing our mental states. Many psycho-functionalists may not regard this as an unhappy consequence, and argue that it's appropriate to treat only those who are psychologically similar as having the same mental states. But there is a more serious worry about the thesis, namely, that if the laws of the best empirical psychological theories diverge from even the broad contours of our “folk psychology” — that is, our common sense beliefs about the causal roles of our thoughts, sensations, and perceptions — it will be hard to take psycho-functional theories as providing an account of our mental states (Loar, 1981). Many theorists, however (Horgan and Woodward 1985), argue that it's likely that future psychological theories will be recognizably close to “folk psychology”, though this question has been the subject of debate (Churchland, 1981).
But there is another important strain of functionalism, “analytic” functionalism, that takes there to be reason to restrict the defining theory not just to generalizations sufficiently close to those that “the folk” take to hold between mental states, environmental stimulations, and behavior, but rather to a priori information about these relations. (See Smart (1959), Armstrong (1968), Shoemaker (1984a,b,c), Lewis (1972).) This is because, for analytic functionalists, there are equally important goals that require strictly a priori characterizations of mental states.
Like the logical behaviorism from which it emerged, the goal of analytic functionalism is to provide “topic-neutral” translations, or analyses, of our ordinary mental state terms or concepts. Analytic functionalism, of course, has richer resources than logical behaviorism for such translations, since it permits reference to the causal relations that a mental state has to stimulations, behavior, and other mental states. Thus the statement “Blanca wants some coffee” need not be rendered, as logical behaviorism requires, in terms such as “Blanca is disposed to order coffee when it is offered”, but rather as “Blanca is disposed to order coffee when it is offered, if she has no stronger desire to avoid coffee”. But this requires any functional “theory” acceptable to analytic functionalists to include only generalizations about mental states, their environmental causes, and their joint effects on behavior that are so widely known and “platitudinous” as to count as analyzing our ordinary concepts of the mental states in question.
A good way to see why analytic functionalists insist that functional characterizations provide meaning analyses is to revisit a debate that occurred in the early days of the Psycho-Physical Identity Theory, the thesis that each type of mental state can be identified with some type of brain state or neural activity. For example, early identity theorists (Smart, 1962; Place, 1956) argued that it makes perfect sense (and may well be true) to identify pain with C-fiber stimulation. The terms ‘pain’ and ‘C-fiber stimulation’, they acknowledged, do not have the same meaning, but nonetheless they can denote the same state; the fact that an identity statement is not a priori, they argued, does not mean that it is not true. And just because I need not consult some sort of brain scanner when reporting that I'm in pain doesn't mean that the pain I report is not a neural state that a brain scanner could (in principle) detect.
An important — and enduring — objection to this argument, however, was raised early on by Max Black (reported in Smart, 1962). Black argued, following Frege (1892), that the only way that terms with different meanings can denote the same state is to express different properties, or “modes of presentation” of that state. But this implies, he argued, that if terms like ‘pain’, ‘thought’ and ‘desire’ are not equivalent in meaning to any physicalistic descriptions, they can denote physical states only by expressing irreducibly mental properties of them. Thus, even if ‘pain’ and ‘C-fiber stimulation’ pick out a single type of neural state, this state must have two types of properties, physical and mental, by means of which the identification can be made. This argument has come to be known as the “Distinct Property Argument”, and is taken by its proponents to undermine a thorough-going materialistic theory of the mind. (See White, 1986, 2002, for more recent versions of this argument.)
The appeal of meaning-preserving functional characterizations, therefore, is that in providing topic-neutral equivalents of our mental state terms and concepts, they blunt the anti-materialistic force of the Distinct Property Argument. True enough, analytic functionalists can acknowledge, terms like ‘pain’, ‘thought’, and ‘desire’ are not equivalent to any descriptions expressed in the language of physics, chemistry, or neurophysiology. But if there are functional descriptions that preserve the meanings of these terms, then a creature's mental states can be identified simply by determining whether that creature has internal states and processes that can play the relevant functional roles. And since the capacity to play these roles is merely a matter of having certain causal relations to stimulations, behavior, and one another, the possession of these properties is compatible with a materialistic theory of the mind.
A major question, of course, is whether a theory that limits itself to a priori information about the causal relations between stimulations, mental states and behavior can make the right distinctions among mental states. The relative strengths and weaknesses of analytic and psycho-functionalism will be discussed further in later sections. First, however, there is another important distinction between kinds of functional theory — one that crosscuts the distinctions described so far — that is important to note. This is the distinction between functional specifications and Functional State Identity Theories.
To see the difference between these types of theories, consider the (avowedly simplistic) example of a functional theory of pain introduced in the first section:
Pain is the state that tends to be caused by bodily injury, to produce the belief that something is wrong with the body and the desire to be out of that state, to produce anxiety, and, in the absence of any stronger, conflicting desires, to cause wincing or moaning.
As noted earlier, if in humans this functional role is played by C-fiber stimulation, then, according to this functionalist theory, humans can be in pain simply by undergoing C-fiber stimulation. But there is a further question to be answered, namely, what is the property of pain itself? Is it the (second-order relational) property of being in some state or other that plays the “pain role” in the theory, or the C-fiber stimulation that actually plays this role?
A Functional State Identity Theory (FSIT) would identify pain (or, more naturally, the property of having a pain or being in pain) with the second-order relational property. Other theorists, however, take a functional theory merely to provide definite descriptions of whichever first-order physical (or other) properties satisfy the functional characterizations and for those properties themselves to be the pains, beliefs, and desires. On this view, if the property that occupies the functional role of pain in human beings is C-fiber stimulation, then pain (or at least pain-in-humans) would be C-fiber stimulation (rather than the property of having some first-order state that plays the relevant role). Views of this sort have come to be known as “functional specification” theories, since mental states, though identified with particular physical properties, are specified in terms of their functional roles. Such views could equally well be considered to be versions of the psycho-physical identity thesis, but they are most often discussed along with FSIT's, since both consider it essential to be able to characterize mental states in functional terms. (This is not to suggest that there is a difference in kind between higher-order “role” properties and the lower-order “realizations” of those roles, since it may be that, relative to even lower-level descriptions, those realizations can be characterized as functional states themselves (Lycan (1987)).
It's clear why psycho-physical identity theorists worried about the Distinct Property argument (see section 3.3) would adopt a functional specification theory, in hopes that functional specification could provide topic-neutral translations of mental state terms and concepts. Indeed, the earliest versions of analytic functionalism (Smart, 1959, Armstrong, 1968) were functional specification theories rather than FSIT's. But some psychofunctionalists also prefer functional specification theories to FSIT's, since they appear to offer a more straightforward account of the causal relations between stimulations, mental states, and behavior. Taking mental states to be the first order state-types which, in each species, satisfy the functional definitions makes it possible to say, literally, that pain (given the presence, or absence, of certain other mental states) causes wincing, whereas on the view that pain is a second-order property partially defined by its tendency to produce wincing, one can say only that wincing is a manifestation of pain.
On the other hand, taking mental states to be the second-order properties expressed by the functional definitions permits us, literally, to count as having the same mental states as creatures who realize the functional definitions in different ways, and on this view mental state terms can be rigid designators (Kripke, 1972), denoting the same items — those second-order properties — in all possible worlds. Functional specification theories and FSITs appear, that is, to have different strengths and weaknesses: straightforwardness of causal explanation versus universality of application (Block, 1980).
Evaluating the significance of these differences, however, is a complicated matter. Even though, on the functional specification view, one can't state that all individuals in a state that plays the functional role of pain are literally in the same mental state, one can attribute to all of them the closely related second-order property (call it “being in a state of pain”) possessed by all and only individuals with first-order state types that satisfy the functional definition. This may be generalization enough. And the straightforward ‘pain causes wincing’ that is possible on the functional specification view can be replaced, on the FSIT, by a locution such as ‘wincing occurs because of pain’, which may provide sufficient explanation of the relation between mental state and behavior. (See Mumford (1998) for a general discussion of the conditions under which dispositions can be said to cause manifestations, or be caused by the environmental stimuli in terms of which they are defined.)
This issue leads to some difficult questions about what exactly is required for a mental property to have causal efficacy, since there are problems in accounting for “mental causation” whether mental states are taken to be identical to, realized by, or supervenient on, physical properties. But though this topic is briefly revisited in Section 6, a full discussion of these questions is beyond the scope of this entry. (See Mental Causation entry; also Kim, 2002.)
So far, the discussion of how to provide functional characterizations of individual mental states has been vague, and the examples avowedly simplistic. Is it possible to do better, and, if so, which version of functionalism is likely to have the greatest success? These questions will be the focus of this section, and separate treatment will be given to intentional states, such as thoughts, beliefs, and desires, which purport to represent the world in various ways, and experiential states, such as perceptions and bodily sensations, which have a distinctive qualitative character or “feel” (though these groups may not be mutually exclusive).
First, however, it is important to get more precise about how exactly functional definition is supposed to work. This can be done by focusing on a general method for providing functional definitions introduced by David Lewis (1972; building on an idea of Frank Ramsey's), and which has become standard practice for functionalists of all varieties.
The key feature of this now-canonical method is to treat mental states and processes as being implicitly defined by the Ramsey sentence of one or another psychological theory — common sense, scientific, or something in between. (Analogous steps, of course, can be taken to produce the Ramsey-sentence of any theory, psychological or otherwise). For (a still simplistic) example, consider the sort of generalizations about pain introduced before: pain tends to be caused by bodily injury; pain tends to produce the belief that something is wrong with the body and the desire to be out of that state; pain tends to produce anxiety; pain tends to produce wincing or moaning.
To construct the Ramsey-sentence of this “theory”, the first step is to conjoin these generalizations, then replace all names of different types of mental states with different variables, and then existentially quantify those variables, as follows:
∃x∃y∃z∃w( x tends to be caused by bodily injury & x tends to produce states y, z, and w & x tends to produce wincing or moaning).
Such a statement is free of any mental state terms. It includes quantifiers that range over mental states, terms that denote stimulations and behavior, and terms that attribute various causal relations to them. It can thus be regarded as providing implicit definitions of the mental state terms of the theory. An individual will have those mental states just in case it possesses a family of first-order states that interact in the ways specified by the theory. (Though functionalists of course acknowledge that the first-order states that satisfy the functional definitions may vary from species to species — or even from individual to individual — they specify that, for each individual, the functional definitions be uniquely satisfied.)
A helpful way to think of the Ramsey sentence of a psychological theory is to regard it as defining a system's mental states “all at once” as states that interact with stimulations in various ways to produce behavior (Lewis, 1972; also see Field (1980) for a more technical elaboration of Lewis's method, and an account of some crucial differences between this kind of characterization and the one Lewis initially proposed.) This makes clear that, in the classic formulations of functional theories, a given mental state is intended to be characterized in terms of its relations to stimulations, behavior, and all the other states invoked by the theory in question. But herein lies a difficulty that presents a challenge to any version of functionalism.
The difficulty is that the characterization of mental states in (all the versions of) functionalism so far presented is holistic. According to functionalism, mental states are to be characterized in terms of their roles in a psychological theory, but psychological theories, whether common sense or scientific, incorporate information about a large number and variety of mental states. Thus if pain is interdefined with certain highly articulated beliefs and desires, then animals who don't have internal states that play the roles of our articulated beliefs and desires can't share our pains, and humans without the capacity to feel pain can't share certain (or perhaps any) of our beliefs and desires. In addition, differences in the ways people reason, the ways their beliefs are fixed, or the ways their desires affect their beliefs — due either to cultural or individual idiosyncracies — might make it impossible for them to share the same mental states. These are regarded as serious worries for all versions of functionalism (see Stich, 1983, Putnam, 1988).
Some functionalists, however (e.g. Shoemaker, 1984c), have suggested that if a creature has states that approximately realize our functional theories, or realize some more specific defining subset of the theory particularly relevant to the specification of those states, then they can qualify as being mental states of the same types as our own. The problem, of course, is to specify more precisely what it is to be an approximate realization of a theory, or what exactly a “defining” subset of a theory is intended to include, and these are not easy questions. (They have particular bite, moreover, for analytic functionalist theories, since specifying what belongs inside and outside the “defining” subset of a functional characterization raises the question of what are the conceptually essential, and what the merely collateral, features of a mental state, and thus raise serious questions about the feasibility of (something like) an analytic-synthetic distinction. (Quine, 1953, Rey, 1997)).
In addition to these general worries arising from the holism of Ramsey-style functional characterizations, there are particular questions that arise for the projects of giving functional characterizations of experiential and intentional states. These questions will be addressed in the following three sections.
The key strategy in the most successful treatments of perceptual experiences and bodily sensations (Shoemaker, 1984a Clark, 1993; adumbrated in Sellars, 1956) is to individuate experiences of various general types (color experiences, experiences of sounds, feelings of temperature) in part by appeal to their positions in the “quality spaces” associated with the relevant sense modalities — that is, the (perhaps multidimensional) matrices determined by judgments about the relative similarities and differences among the experiences in question. So, for example, the experience of a very reddish-orange could be (partially) characterized as the state produced by the viewing of a color swatch within some particular range, which tends to produce the judgment or belief that the state just experienced is more similar to the experience of red than of orange. (Analogous characterizations, of course, will have to be given of these other color experiences.) The judgments or beliefs in question will themselves be (partially) characterized in terms of their tendencies to produce sorting or categorization behavior of certain specified kinds.
This strategy may seem fatal to analytic functionalism, which restricts itself to the use of a a priori information to distinguish among mental states, since it's not clear that the information needed to distinguish among experiences such as color perceptions will result from conceptual analysis of our mental state terms or concepts. However, this problem may not be as dire as it seems. For example, if sensations and perceptual experiences are characterized in terms of their places in a “quality space” determined by a person's pre-theoretical judgments of similarity and dissimilarity (and perhaps also in terms of their tendencies to produce various emotional effects), then these characterizations may qualify as a priori, even though they would have to be elicited by a kind of “Socratic questioning”.
There are limits to this strategy, however (see Section 5.1 on the “inverted spectrum” problem), which seem to leave two options for analytic functionalists: fight — that is, deny that it's coherent to suppose that there are the distinctions that the critics suggest, or switch — that is, embrace another version of functionalism in which the characterizations of mental states, though not conceptual truths, can provide information rich enough to individuate the states in question. To switch, however, would be to give up the benefits (if any; again see Section 5.1) of a theory that offers meaning-preserving translations of our mental state terms.
There has been significant skepticism, however, about whether any functionalist theory — analytic or scientific — can capture what seem to be the intrinsic characters of experiential states such as color perceptions, pains, and other bodily sensations; these questions will be addressed in section 5.1 below.
On the other hand, intentional states such as beliefs, thoughts, and desires (sometimes called “propositional attitudes”) are often taken to be easier to specify in functional terms (but not always: see Searle, 1992, G. Strawson, 1994, who suggest that intentional states have qualitative character as well). It's not hard to see how to begin: beliefs are (among other things) states produced in certain ways by sense-perception or inference from other beliefs, and which tend to interact with certain desires to produce behavior; desires are states with certain causal or counterfactual relations to the system's goals and needs, and which tend to interact with certain beliefs to produce behavior. But more must be said about what makes a state a particular belief or desire, for example, the belief — or desire — that it will snow tomorrow. Most functional theories describe such states as different relations (or “attitudes”) toward the same state of affairs or proposition (and to describe the belief that it will snow tomorrow and the belief that it will rain tomorrow as the same attitude toward different propositions). This permits differences and similarities in the contents of intentional states to be construed as differences and similarities in the propositions to which these states are related. But what makes a mental state a relation to, or attitude toward, some proposition P? And can these relations be captured solely by appeal to the functional roles of the states in question?
The development of conceptual role semantics may seem to provide an answer to these questions: what it is for Julian to believe that P is for Julian to be in a state that has causal and counterfactual relations to other beliefs and desires that mirror certain inferential, evidential, and practical (action-directed) relations among propositions with those formal structures (Field, 1980; Loar, 1981; Block, 1986). This proposal raises a number of important questions. One is whether states capable of entering into such interrelations can (must?) be construed as comprising, or including elements of, a “language of thought” (Fodor, 1975; Harman, 1973; Field, 1980; Loar, 1981). Another is whether idiosyncracies in the inferential or practical proclivities of different individuals make for differences in (or incommensurabilities between) their intentional states. (This question springs from a more general worry about the holism of functional specification, which was discussed more generally in Section 4.2.)
Yet another challenge for functionalism are the widespread intuitions that support “externalism”, the thesis that what mental states represent, or are about, cannot be characterized without appeal to certain features of the environments in which those individuals are embedded. Thus, if one individual's environment differs from another's, they may count as having different intentional states, even though they reason in the same ways, and have exactly the same “take” on those environments from their own points of view.
The “Twin Earth” scenarios introduced by Putnam (1975) are often invoked to support an externalist individuation of beliefs about natural kinds such as water, gold, or tigers. Twin Earth, as Putnam presents it, is a (hypothetical) planet on which things look, taste, smell and feel exactly the way they do on Earth, but which have different underlying microscopic structures; for example, the stuff that fills the streams and comes out of the faucets, though it looks and tastes like water, has molecular structure XYZ rather than H2O. Many theorists find it intuitive to think that we thereby mean something different by our term ‘water’ than our Twin Earth counterparts mean by theirs, and thus that the beliefs we describe as beliefs about water are different from those that our Twin Earth counterparts would describe in the same way. Similar conclusions, they contend, can be drawn for all cases of belief (and other intentional states) regarding natural kinds.
The same problem, moreover, appears to arise for other sorts of belief as well. Tyler Burge (1979) presents cases in which it seems intuitive that a person, Oscar, and his functionally equivalent counterpart have different beliefs about various syndromes (such as arthritis) and artifacts (such as sofas) because the usage of these terms by their linguistic communities differ. For example, in Oscar's community, the term ‘arthritis’ is used as we use it, whereas in his counterpart's community ‘arthritis’ denotes inflammation of the joints and also various maladies of the thigh. Burge's contention is that even if Oscar and his counterpart both complain about the ‘arthritis’ in their thighs and make exactly the same inferences involving ‘arthritis’, they mean different things by their terms and must be regarded as having different beliefs. If these cases are convincing, then there are differences among types of intentional states that can only be captured by characterizations of these states that make reference to the practices of an individual's linguistic community. These, along with the Twin Earth cases, suggest that if functionalist theories cannot make reference to an individual's environment, then capturing the representational content of (at least some) intentional states is beyond the scope of functionalism. (See Section 4.5 for further discussion, and Searle, 1980, for related arguments against “computational” theories of intentional states.)
On the other hand, the externalist individuation of intentional states may fail to capture some important psychological commonalities between ourselves and our counterparts that are relevant to the explanation of behavior. If my Twin Earth counterpart and I have both come in from a long hike, declare that we're thirsty, say “I want some water” and head to the kitchen, it seems that our behavior can be explained by citing a common desire and belief. Some theorists, therefore, have suggested that functional theories should attempt merely to capture what has been called the “narrow content” of beliefs and desires — that is, whichever representational features individuals share with their various Twin Earth counterparts. There is no consensus, however, about just how functionalist theories should treat these “narrow” representational features (Block, 1986; Loar, 1987), and some philosophers have expressed skepticism about whether such features should be construed as representations at all (Fodor, 1994; also see entry on Narrow Content). Even if a generally acceptable account of narrow representational content can be developed, however, if the intuitions inspired by “Twin Earth” scenarios remain stable, then one must conclude that the full representational content of intentional states (and qualitative states, if they too have representational content) cannot be captured by “narrow” functional characterizations alone.
Considerations about whether certain sorts of beliefs are to be externally individuated raise the related question about how best to characterize the stimulations and behaviors that serve as inputs and outputs to a system. Should they be construed as events involving objects in a system's environment (such as fire trucks, water and lemons), or rather as events in that system's sensory and motor systems? Theories of the first type are often called “long-arm” functional theories (Block, 1990), since they characterize inputs and outputs — and consequently the states they are produced by and produce — by reaching out into the world. Adopting a “long-arm” theory would prevent our Twin Earth counterparts from sharing our beliefs and desires, and may thus honor intuitions that support an externalist individuation of intentional states (though further questions may remain about what Quine has called the “inscrutability of reference”; see Putnam, 1988).
If functional characterizations of intentional states are intended to capture their “narrow contents”, however, then the inputs and outputs of the system will have to be specified in a way that permits individuals in different environments to be in the same intentional state. On this view inputs and outputs may be better characterized as activity in specific sensory receptors and motor neurons. But this (“short-arm”) option also restricts the range of individuals that can share our beliefs and desires, since creatures with different neural structures will be prevented from sharing our mental states, even if they share all our behavioral and inferential dispositions. (In addition, this option would not be open to analytic functionalist theories, since generalizations that link mental states to neurally specified inputs and outputs would not, presumably, have the status of conceptual truths.)
Perhaps there is a way to specify sensory stimulations that abstracts from the specifics of human neural structure enough to include any possible creature that intuitively seems to share our mental states, but is sufficiently concrete to rule out entities that are clearly not cognitive systems (such as the economy of Bolivia; see Block (1980)). If there is no such formulation, however, then functionalists will either have to dispel intuitions to the effect that certain systems can't have beliefs and desires, or concede that their theories may be more “chauvinistic” than initially hoped.
Clearly, the issues here mirror the issues regarding the individuation of intentional states discussed in the previous section. More work is needed to develop the “long-arm” and “short-arm” alternatives, and to assess the merits and deficiencies of both.
The previous sections were by and large devoted to the presentation of the different varieties of functionalism and the evaluation of their relative strengths and weaknesses. There have been many objections to functionalism, however, that apply to all versions of the doctrine. Some of these have already been presented in some detail, in particular, the worry about the holism of standard functional characterizations (discussed in section 4.2), and the worry (discussed in sections 4.4. and 4.5) about whether any functional theory can capture the representational content of intentional states. But there are other important objections to functionalism in general that will be addressed in detail here.
Even for those generally sympathetic to functionalism, there is one category of mental states that seems particularly resistant to functional characterization. Functionalist theories of all varieties — whether analytic or empirical, FSIT or functional specification — attempt to characterize mental states exclusively in relational, specifically causal, terms. A common and persistent objection, however, is that no such characterizations can capture the qualitative character, or “qualia”, of experiential states such as perceptions, emotions, and bodily sensations, since they would leave out certain of their essential properties, namely, “what it's like” (Nagel, 1975) to have them. The next three sections will present the most serious worries about the ability of functionalist theories to give an adequate characterization of these states. (These worries, of course, will extend to intentional states, if, as some philosophers have argued (Searle, 1992, G. Strawson, 1986), “what it's like” to have them is among their essential properties as well. See also entry on Mental Representation.)
The first to be considered are the “absent” and “inverted” qualia objections most closely associated with Ned Block (1980b; see also Block and Fodor, 1972). The “inverted qualia” objection to functionalism maintains that there could be an individual who (for example) satisfies the functional definition of our experience of red, but is experiencing green instead. It is a descendant of the claim, discussed by philosophers from Locke to Wittgenstein, that there could be an individual with an “inverted spectrum” who is behaviorally indistinguishable from someone with normal color vision; both objections trade on the contention that purely relational characterizations cannot make distinctions among distinct experiences with isomorphic causal patterns. (Even if inverted qualia are not really a possibility for human beings, given certain asymmetries in our “quality space” for color, and differences in the relations of color experiences to other mental states such as emotions (Hardin, 1988), it seems possible that there are creatures with perfectly symmetrical color quality spaces for whom a purely functional characterization of color experience would fail.)
A related objection, the “absent qualia” objection, maintains that there could be creatures functionally equivalent to normal humans whose mental states have no qualitative character at all. In his well-known “Chinese nation” thought-experiment, Block (1980b) imagines that the population of China (chosen because its size approximates the number of neurons in a typical human brain) is recruited to duplicate his functional organization for a period of time, receiving the equivalent of sensory input from an artificial body and passing messages back and forth via satellite. Block argues that such a “homunculi-headed” system — or “Blockhead”, as it has come to be called — would not have mental states with any qualitative character (other than the qualia possessed by the individuals themselves), and thus that states functionally equivalent to sensations or perceptions may lack their characteristic “feels”. Conversely, it has also been argued that functional role is not necessary for qualitative character: for example, the argument goes, people may have mild, but distinctive, twinges that have no typical causes or characteristic effects.
All these objections maintain that it is possible for there to be creatures with the functional organization of normal humans, but without any, or the right sort, of qualia (or vice versa). In response, some theorists (Dennett, 1978; Levin, 1985; Van Gulick, 1989) dispute the claim that such creatures are possible. They argue that the scenarios sketched to provide evidence of absent or inverted qualia are clear-cut counterexamples only to crude examples of functional definitions, and that attention to the subtleties of more sophisticated characterizations will undermine the intuition that functional duplicates of ourselves with absent or inverted qualia are possible (or, conversely, that there are qualitative states without distinctive functional roles). The plausibility of this line of defense is often questioned, however, since there is tension between the goal of increasing the sophistication (and thus the individuative powers) of the functional definitions, and the goal of keeping these definitions within the bounds of the a priori, which would be required for the claim that it is inconceivable for there to be creatures with absent or inverted qualia (but see the discussion in Section 4.3).
Another line of response, initially advanced by Sydney Shoemaker (1994b), attributes a different sort of incoherence to the “absent qualia” scenarios. Shoemaker argues that although functional duplicates of ourselves with inverted qualia may be possible, duplicates with absent qualia are not, since their possibility leads to untenable skepticism about the qualitative character of one's own mental states. This argument has been challenged (Block, 1980b; see also Shoemaker's response in 1994d), but successful or not, it raises questions about the nature of introspection and the conditions under which, if functionalism is true, we can have knowledge of our own mental states. These questions are discussed further in section 6.
The “inverted” and “absent” qualia objections were initially presented as challenges exclusively to functionalist theories, both conceptual and empirical, and not generally to physicalistic theories of experiential states; the main concern was that the purely relational resources of functional description were incapable of capturing the intrinsic qualitative character of states such as feeling pain, or seeing red. (Indeed, in Block's 1980, p.291, he suggests that qualitative states may best be construed as “composite state[s] whose components are a quale and a [functional state],” and adds, in an endnote (note 22) that the quale “might be identified with a physico-chemical state”.) But these objections are now generally regarded as special cases of the “conceivability argument” against physicalism, advanced by (among others) Kripke (1972) and Chalmers (1996), which derives from Descartes's well-known argument in the Sixth Meditation (1641) that since he can clearly and distinctly conceive of himself existing apart from his body (and vice versa), and since the ability to clearly and distinctly conceive of things as existing apart guarantees that they are in fact distinct, he is in fact distinct from his body.
Chalmers's version of the argument (1996), known as the “Zombie Argument”, has been particularly influential. The first premise of this argument is that it is conceivable, in a special, robust, “positive” sense, that there are molecule-for-molecule duplicates of oneself with no qualia (call them “zombies”, following Chalmers, 1996). The second premise is that scenarios that are “positively” conceivable in this way represent real, metaphysical, possibilities. Thus, he concludes, zombies are possible, and functionalism — or, more broadly, physicalism — is false. The force of the Zombie Argument is due in large part to the way Chalmers defends its two premises; he provides a detailed account of just what is required for zombies to be conceivable, and also an argument as to why the conceivability of zombies entails their possibility (see also Chalmers and Jackson (2002)). This account, based on a more comprehensive theory of how we can have knowledge or justified belief about possibility and necessity, reflects an increasingly popular way of thinking about these matters, but remains controversial. (For alternative ways of explaining conceivability, see Kripke (1986), Hart (1988); for criticism of Chalmers's and Jackson's account, see Yablo (2001), Bealer (2002).)
In a related challenge, Joseph Levine (1983, 1993) argues that, even if the conceivability of zombies doesn't entail that functionalism (or more broadly, physicalism) is false, it opens an “explanatory gap” not encountered in other cases of inter-theoretical reduction, since the qualitative character of an experience cannot be deduced from any physical or functional description of it. Such attempts thus pose, at very least, a unique epistemological problem for functionalist (or physicalist) reductions of qualitative states.
In response to these objections, analytic functionalists contend, as they did with the inverted and absent qualia objections, that zombies are not really conceivable, and thus there is no threat to functionalism and no explanatory gap. But an increasingly popular strategy for defending functionalism (and physicalism) against these objections is to concede that there can be no conceptual analyses of qualitative concepts (such as what it's like to see red or what it's like to feel pain) in purely functional terms, and focus instead on developing arguments to show that the conceivability of zombies neither implies that such creatures are possible nor opens up an explanatory gap.
One line of argument (Block and Stalnaker, 1999; Yablo, 2000) contends that the conceivability of counterexamples to psycho-physical or psycho-functional identity statements (such as zombies) has analogues in other cases of successful inter-theoretical reduction, in which the lack of conceptual analyses of the terms to be reduced makes it conceivable, though not possible, that the identities are false. But, the argument continues, if these cases routinely occur in what are generally regarded as successful reductions in the sciences, then it's reasonable to conclude that the conceivability of a situation does not entail its possibility.
A different line of argument (Horgan, 1994; Loar, 1990; Lycan, 1990; Hill, 1997) maintains that, while generally the conceivability of a scenario entails its possibility, scenarios involving zombies stand as important exceptions. The difference is that the qualitative, or “what it's like”, concepts used to describe the properties of experience that we conceive zombies to lack are significantly different from the third-personal, discursive concepts of our common sense and scientific theories such as mass, force or charge; they comprise a special class of non-discursive, first-personal, perspectival representations of those properties. Whereas conceptually independent third-personal conceptsx and y may reasonably be taken to express metaphysically independent properties, or modes of presentation, no such metaphysical conclusions can be drawn when one of the concepts in question is third-personal and the other is qualitative, since these concepts may merely be picking out the same properties in different ways. Thus, the conceivability of zombies, dependent as it is on our use of qualitative concepts, provides no evidence of their metaphysical possibility.
Key to this line of defense is the claim that these special qualitative concepts can denote functional (or physical) properties without expressing some irreducibly qualitative modes of presentation of them, for otherwise it couldn't be held that these concepts do in fact apply to our functional (or physical) duplicates, even though it's conceivable that they don't. This, not surprisingly, has been disputed (White, 2002; Chalmers, 1999, but see the responses of Loar, 1999, and Hill and McLaughlin, 1999; also see Levin, 2002, for a hybrid view), and there is currently much discussion in the literature about the plausibility of this claim. If this line of defense is successful, however, it can also provide a response to the “Distinct Property Argument”, discussed in section 2.5.
In another important, related, challenge to functionalism (and, more generally, physicalism), Thomas Nagel (1974) and Frank Jackson (1982) argue that a person could know all the physical and functional facts about a certain type of experience and still not “know what it's like” to have it. This is known as the “Knowledge Argument”, and its conclusion is that there are certain properties of experiences — the “what it's like” to see red, feel pain, or sense the world through echolocation — which cannot be identified with functional (or physical) properties.
An early line of defense against these arguments, endorsed primarily but not exclusively by conceptual functionalists, is known as the “Ability Hypothesis”. (Nemirow, 1990, Lewis, 1990, Levin, 1986) “Ability” theorists suggest that knowing what it's like to see red or feel pain is merely a sort of practical knowledge, a “knowing how” (to imagine, remember, or re-identify, a certain type of experience) rather than a knowledge of propositions or facts. (See Tye, 2000, for a summary of the pros and cons of this position.) An alternative, and currently more widespread, view among contemporary functionalists is that coming to know what it's like to see red or feel pain is indeed to acquire propositional knowledge uniquely afforded by experience, expressed in terms of first-personal concepts of those experiences. But, the argument continues, this provides no problem for functionalism (or physicalism), since these special first-personal concepts need not denote, or introduce as “modes of presentation”, any irreducibly qualitative properties. This view, of course, shares the strengths and weaknesses of the analogous response to the conceivability arguments discussed above.
There is one final strategy for defending a functionalist account of qualitative states against all of these objections, namely, eliminativism (Dennett, 1988; Rey, 1997). One can, that is, deny that there are any such things as irreducible qualia, and maintain that the conviction that such things do, or perhaps even could, exist is due to illusion — or confusion.
Another important question concerns the beliefs that we have about our own “occurrent” (as opposed to dispositional) mental states such as thoughts, sensations, and perceptions. We seem to have immediately available, non-inferential beliefs about these states, and the question is how this is to be explained if mental states are identical with functional properties.
The answer depends on what one takes these introspective beliefs to involve. Broadly speaking, there are two dominant views of the matter (but see Peacocke, 1999, Ch. 5 for further alternatives). One popular account of introspection — the “inner sense” model on which introspection is taken to be a kind of “internal scanning” of the contents of one's mind (Armstrong, 1968) — has been taken to be unfriendly to functionalism, on the grounds that it's hard to see how the objects of such scanning could be second-order relational properties of one's neural states (Goldman, 1993). Some theorists, however, have maintained that functionalism can accommodate the special features of introspective belief on the “inner sense” model, since it would be only one of many domains in which it's plausible to think that we have immediate, non-inferential knowledge of causal or dispositional properties (Armstrong, 1993; Kobes, 1993; Sterelney, 1993). A full discussion of these questions goes beyond the scope of this entry, but the articles cited above are just three among many helpful pieces in the Open Peer Commentary following Goldman (1993), which provides a good introduction to the debate about this issue.
Another account of introspection, identified most closely with Shoemaker (1996a,b,c,d), is that the immediacy of introspective belief follows from the fact that occurrent mental states and our introspective beliefs about them are functionally interdefined. For example, one satisfies the definition of being in pain only if one is in a state that tends to cause (in creatures with the requisite concepts who are considering the question) the belief that one is in pain, and one believes that one is in pain only if one is in a state that plays the belief role, and is caused directly by the pain itself. On this account of introspection, the immediacy and non-inferential nature of introspective belief is not merely compatible with functionalism, but required by it.
But there is an objection, most recently expressed by George Bealer (1997; see also Hill 1993), that, on this model an introspective belief can only be defined in one of two unsatisfactory ways: either as a belief produced by a (second-order) functional state specified (in part) by its tendency to produce that very type of belief — which would be circular — or as a belief about the first-order realization of the functional state, rather than that state itself. Functionalists have suggested, however (Shoemaker, 2001), that there is a way of understanding the conditions under which beliefs can be caused by, and thus be about, one's second-order functional states that permits mental states and introspective beliefs about them to be non-circularly defined. A full treatment of this objection involves the more general question of whether second-order properties can have causal efficacy, and is thus beyond the scope of this discussion (see Mental Causation entry). But even if this objection can ultimately be deflected, it suggests that special attention must be paid to the functional characterizations of “self-directed” mental states.
Yet another objection to functionalism raises the question of whether any “theory” of the mind that invokes beliefs, desires, and other intentional states could ever be, or even approximate, an empirical theory. Whereas even analytic functionalists hold that mental states are implicitly defined in terms of their (causal or probabilistic) roles in producing behavior, these critics take mental states, or at least intentional states, to be implicitly defined in terms of their roles in rationalizing, or making sense of, behavior. This is a different enterprise, they claim, since rationalization, unlike causal explanation, requires showing how an individual's beliefs, desires, and behavior conform, or at least approximate, to certain a priori norms or ideals of theoretical and practical reasoning — prescriptions about how we should reason, or what, given our beliefs and desires, we ought to do (Davidson, 1970, Dennett, 1978, McDowell, 1985). Thus the defining (“constitutive”) normative or rational relations among intentional states expressed by these principles cannot be expected to correspond to empirical relations among our internal states, sensory stimulations and behavior, since they comprise a kind of explanation that has sources of evidence and standards for correctness that are different from those of empirical theories (Davidson, 1970). One can't, that is, extract facts from values.
Thus, although attributions of mental states can in some sense explain behavior. by permitting an observer to “interpret” it as making sense, they should not be expected to denote entities that figure in empirical laws. (This is not to say, these theorists stress, that there are no causes, or empirical laws of, behavior. These, however, will be expressible only in the vocabularies of the neurosciences, or other lower-level sciences, and not as relations among beliefs, desires and behavior.)
Functionalists have replied to these worries in different ways. Many just deny the intuition behind the objection, and maintain that even the strictest conceptual analyses of our intentional terms and concepts purport to define them in terms of their bona-fide causal roles, and that any norms they reflect are explanatory rather than prescriptive. They argue, that is, that if these generalizations are idealizations, they are the sort of idealizations that occur in any scientific theory: just as Boyle's Law depicts the relations between the temperature, pressure, and volume of a gas under certain ideal experimental conditions, our a priori theory of the mind consists of descriptions of what normal humans would do under (physically specifiable) ideal conditions, not prescriptions as to what they should, or are rationally required, to do.
Other functionalists agree that we may advert to various norms of inference and action in attributing beliefs and desires to others, but deny that there is any in principle incompatibility between normative and empirical explanations. They argue that if there are causal relations among beliefs, desires, and behavior that even approximately mirror the norms of rationality, then the attributions of intentional states can be empirically confirmed (Fodor, 1990; Rey, 1997). In addition, many who hold this view suggest that the principles of rationality that intentional states must meet are quite minimal, and comprise at most a set of constraints on the contours of our theory of mind, such as that people can't, in general, hold (obviously) contradictory beliefs, or act against their (sincerely avowed) strongest desires (Loar, 1981). Still others suggest that the intuition that we attribute beliefs and desires to others according to rational norms is based on a fundamental mistake; these states are attributed not on the basis of whether they rationalize the behavior in question, but whether those subjects can be seen as using principles of inference and action sufficiently like our own — be they rational, like Modus Ponens, or irrational, like the Gambler's Fallacy. (See Stich, 1981, and Levin, 1988, for commentary)
But, though many functionalists argue that the considerations discussed above show that there is no in principle bar to a functionalist theory that has empirical force, these worries about the normativity of intentional ascription continue to fuel skepticism about functionalism (and, for that matter, any scientific theory of the mind that uses intentional notions).
In the last part of the 20th century, functionalism stood as the dominant theory of mental states. Like behaviorism, functionalism takes mental states out of the realm of the “private” or subjective, and gives them status as entities open to scientific investigation. But, in contrast to behaviorism, functionalism's characterization of mental states in terms of their roles in the production of behavior grants them the causal efficacy that common sense takes them to have. And in permitting mental states to be multiply realized, functionalism offers an account of mental states that is compatible with materialism, without limiting the class of those with minds to creatures with brains like ours.
The sophistication of functionalist theories has increased since their introduction, but so has the sophistication of the objections to functionalism, especially to functionalist accounts of representation (Sections 4.4, 4.5), the qualitative character of experiential states (Section 5.1), and the nature of introspective knowledge (5.2). For those unconvinced of the plausibility of dualism, however, and unwilling to restrict mental states to creatures physically like ourselves, the initial attractions of functionalism remain. The primary challenge for future functionalists, therefore, will be to meet these objections to the doctrine, either by articulating a functionalist theory in increasingly convincing detail, or by showing how the intuitions that fuel these objections can be explained away.
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behaviorism | belief | dualism | identity theory of mind | mental causation | mental representation | mind: computational theory of | multiple realizability | physicalism | qualia | qualia: knowledge argument | Turing machines