This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

of Philosophy 
Picture of Stanford University
Spring 2006 Edition
Editorial Information

Principal Editor
Edward N. Zalta
(CSLI, Stanford University)
Editorial Board
Subject Editors
Associate Editor
Colin Allen
(History and Philosophy of Science/Indiana University)
Advisory Board
Department of Philosophy
Stanford University
Assistant Editor
Uri Nodelman
(Computer Science/Stanford University)
List of Authors
Faculty Sponsor
John Perry
(Henry Waldgrave Stuart Professor of Philosophy)
Occasional Referees
Past Contributing Subject Editors

Basic Information

The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy is a dynamic reference work and is a publishing project of the Metaphysics Research Lab at the Center for the Study of Language and Information (CSLI) at Stanford University. The concept of a dynamic reference work was implemented in the design of the Encyclopedia by Edward N. Zalta (Director of the Metaphysics Research Lab). The project began when John Perry was the Director of the Center for the Study of Language and Information. All correspondence should be directed to:


Information about our dynamic reference work can be found in the following papers and abstracts:

Information for Authors:

Editorial Policies:

  1. Editorial decisions concerning the Encyclopedia, including decisions concerning its content, format and distribution, are made by the Principal Editor in consultation with the Associate Editor, Assistant Editor, and the Board of Editors.
  2. The members of the Board of Editors are selected in consultation with the Stanford University Department of Philosophy, which serves as the Encyclopedia's Advisory Board. The Advisory Board also advises the Principal Editor on the basic policies governing the operation of the Encyclopedia.
  3. Contributions to the Encyclopedia are normally solicited by invitation from a member of the Board of Editors. However, qualified potential contributors may send a proposal to write on an Encyclopedia topic, along with a curriculum vitae, to an appropriate member of the Editorial Board. The Board of Editors reserves the right to compare the qualifications of any person submitting an unsolicited request with those of other potential authors who would be qualified to write the entry in question.
  4. All entries, whether solicited or approved, will be refereed by one or more of the subject editors on our Board of Editors or by one or more external referees who have been approved by a member of the Board of Editors. Authors are expected to engage any constructive criticisms they receive during the referee process, prior to publication. Authors should note, however, that no matter whether they have been invited or approved by one of these subject editors, our goal of producing a high-quality reference work requires us to admit the possibility that some submitted entries may not be accepted for publication.
  5. Readers of the Encyclopedia are encouraged to contact authors directly with comments, corrections, and other suggestions for improvements.
  6. It remains the responsibility of authors to maintain their entries and to keep them current. Authors are expected revise their entries in a timely way either (1) in response to important new research on the topic of the entry or (2) in light of any valid criticism they receive, whether it comes from the subject editors on our Editorial Board, other members of the profession, or interested readers. In connection with (1), authors should update the Bibliography and Other Internet Resources sections of their entries regularly, to keep pace with significant new publications, both in print and on the web. In connection with (2), the validity of criticism shall be determined by the Principal Editor, typically in consultation with the relevant members of the Editorial Board. The length of time required for a "timely" revision will be negotiable and will both respect the author's current commitments and reflect how seriously the piece fails to accomodate new research or the seriousness of any valid criticism. Entries which are not revised within the negotiated timetable may be retired from the active portion of the Encyclopedia and left in the Encyclopedia Archives until such time as the entry is revised so as to engage the valid criticisms in question.
  7. The views expressed by the authors in their entries are their own and do not necessarily reflect those of Stanford University, the Stanford University Philosophy Department, the Encyclopedia's Editors or of anyone else associated with the Encyclopedia.

Copyright Information

Copyright Notice. Authors contributing an entry or entries to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, except as provided herein, retain the copyright to their entry or entries. By contributing an entry or entries, authors grant to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University an exclusive license to publish their entry or entries on the Internet and the World Wide Web, including any future technologies or media that develop to supplement or replace the Internet or World Wide Web, on the terms of the Licensing Agreement set forth below. The rights granted to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University include the right to enforce such rights in any forum, administrative, judicial, or otherwise. All rights not expressly granted to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University, including the right to publish an entry or entries in other print media, are retained by the authors. Copyright of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy itself is held by the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University. All rights are reserved. No part of the Encyclopedia (excluding individual contributions and works derived solely from those contributions, for which rights are reserved by the individual authors) may be reprinted, reproduced, stored, or utilized in any form, by any electronic, mechanical, or other means, now known or hereafter invented, including printing, photocopying, saving (on disk), broadcasting or recording, or in any information storage or retrieval system, other than for purposes of fair use, without written permission from the copyright holder. (All communications should be directed to the Principal Editor.)

Licensing Agreement. By contributing an entry or entries to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy authors grant to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University a perpetual, exclusive, worldwide right to copy, distribute, transmit and publish their contribution on the Internet and World Wide Web. The authors also grant to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University a perpetual, non-exclusive, worldwide right to copy, distribute, transmit and publish any and all derivative works prepared or modified by the Editors from the original contribution, in whole or in part, by any variety of methods on all types of publication and broadcast media other than the Internet, now known or hereafter invented. Authors also grant to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University a perpetual, non-exclusive, worldwide right to translate their contribution, as well as any modified or derivative works, into any and all languages for the same purposes of copying, distributing, transmitting and publishing their work.

Statement of Liability and Indemnity. By contributing an entry or entries to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy authors grant, to the Principal Editor, the Associate Editor, the Assistant Editor, members of the Advisory and Editorial Boards, the Metaphysics Research Lab, CSLI, Stanford University and its officers, trustees, agents and employees (“Stanford Parties”), immunity from all liability arising from their work. All authors are responsible for securing permission to use any copyrighted material, including graphics, quotations, and photographs, within their entries. The Principal Editor, Associate Editor, Assistant Editor, members of the Advisory and Editorial Boards, CSLI, and the Stanford Parties therefore disclaim any and all responsibility for copyright violations and any other form of liability arising from the content of the Encyclopedia or from any material linked to the Encyclopedia. Authors agree to indemnify and hold the Stanford Parties harmless from any claims of copyright infringement or other alleged wrongdoing in connection with the author's entries. Alleged copyright violations should be brought to the attention of the author and the Principal Editor, so that such issues may be dealt with promptly.


The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy project is indebted to various people, both at Stanford and elsewhere, all of whom deserve acknowledgement. Although the Associate Editor (Colin Allen) and the Assistant Editor (Uri Nodelman) have been the Principal and Associate Perl Programmers, respectively, on this project since 1998, Eric Hammer (Peoplesoft Corporation) programmed on the project from 1995 to 1997. Kirsta Anderson (M.A./Philosophy) served as Assistant Editor during the 2003-2004 academic year, and did an outstanding job in communications/control of the Encyclopedia's workflow, offering many suggestions on how to improve our workflow system. Daniel McKenzie served as Assistant Editor during the 2004-2005 academic year, and did a great job juggling communications/control and copy-editing. During the 2000-2001 and 2001-2002 academic years, David James Anderson (M.A./Philosophy) wrote important Perl programs and made other contributions to the project. We'd also like to thank David Barker-Plummer, Mark Greaves, Emma Pease, and Susanne Riehemann for their many helpful suggestions concerning the Encyclopedia project and the construction of this Web site.

The project also acknowledges the contributions of the following individuals and institutions: Javier Ergueta, for his efforts and work in developing a business plan for the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy during the first six months of 2002; Nathan Tawil, who helped design the Encyclopedia entry format when the project started in 1995, and who has assisted the Principal Editor in editing certain entries; the South Korean company C.O.Tech, Inc., deserves acknowledgement for their expert advice concerning XML and for working on a Java-based, graphical XML-editing program for our consideration and possible use by the authors of the Encyclopedia.

Finally, thanks go to John Perry and the following students in his Fall 2004 Proseminar, for their help and assistance in implementing an important element of the SEP's fund-raising plan: Dan Giberman, Tomohiro Hoshi, Alistair Isaac, Daniel Long, Lindsay McLeary, Sarah Paul, Josh Snyder, Quayshawn Spencer and Johanna Wolff.

Table of Contents buttonTable of Contents