This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

version history

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

This document uses XHTML/Unicode to format the display. If you think special symbols are not displaying correctly, see our guide Displaying Special Characters.
last substantive content change

Epistemological Problems of Perception

The historically most central epistemological issue concerning perception, to which this article will be almost entirely devoted, is whether and how beliefs about physical objects and about the physical world generally can be justified or warranted on the basis of sensory or perceptual experience -- where it is internalist justification, roughly having a reason to think that the belief in question is true, that is mainly in question (see the entry justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of). This issue, commonly referred to as "the problem of the external world," divides into two closely related sub-issues, which correspond to the first two main sections below. The first of these issues has to do with the nature of sensory experience and its relation to the physical world; it is typically (though as we shall see not altogether perspicuously) formulated as the question of what are the immediate objects of awareness in sensory experience or, in a variant but essentially equivalent terminology, of what is given in such experience. Perhaps the most historically standard, though not currently the most popular answer to this question has been that it is sense-data (private, non-physical entities actually having the experienced sensory qualities) that are the immediate objects of awareness or that are given. The second issue has to do with the way in which beliefs about the physical world are justified on the basis of such sensory experience. If it is concluded that physical objects are not themselves given, the two main answers to this question are representationalism (the view that the immediate objects of experience represent or depict physical objects in a way that allows one to infer justifiably from such experience to the existence of the corresponding "external" objects) and phenomenalism (the view that physical objects are reducible to or definable in terms of the occurrence and obtainability of such experience). A third alternative view that has received attention in recent discussion is direct realism: the view that physical objects are after all directly or immediately perceived in a way that allegedly avoids the need for any sort of justificatory inference from sensory experience to physical reality. In addition to these views concerning the internalist justification of beliefs about physical objects, there are also externalist accounts of how such beliefs are justified; these will be briefly considered at the end of the article.

1. The Nature of Sensory Experience

What is it that we are immediately or directly aware of in sensory or perceptual experience? Is it public physical objects, private sensory entities of some sort, or perhaps some still further sort of entity (or state)?

1.1 The idea of immediacy or givenness

Before considering answers to this question, it is important to become clearer about the meaning of the question itself. What is it for something to be an object of immediate (or direct) awareness or to be given? (For brevity I will mostly employ the latter term.)[1] Historically, most of those (beginning with Descartes and Locke) who have attempted to answer this question have concluded that it is something other than a physical object that is given, but the reason for this conclusion cannot be understood without becoming clearer about the idea of immediacy or givenness itself.

There are two more or less standard criteria of givenness that have at various times been offered, either jointly or separately, but these unfortunately do not seem to work very well. The first of these appeals to the idea of inference: something is immediately experienced or is given if the cognitive consciousness of it is not arrived at via any sort of inferential process. The obvious problem with this is that it makes it hard to make sense of the historically common view that physical objects are not given, since the sensory awareness of physical objects in the most normal sorts of cases does not seem on the surface to be a product of inference. Certainly the person who has such an awareness is not normally conscious of having made an inference; and to insist, as is sometimes done, that there must have been an "unconscious inference" of some sort could only be justifiable if some other criterion of givenness is being at least tacitly invoked. It is somewhat more plausible to hold that beliefs about physical objects, even if not arrived at via inference, must still be inferentially justified, but neither the rationale for such a claim nor its relation to the idea of givenness or immediacy is clear at this point.

The second of the standard criteria appeals to the idea of certainty: something is immediately experienced or given if the awareness of it is certain, incapable of being mistaken. But while it is plausible enough that all perceptual awareness of physical objects is at least in principle subject to error, it is less clear that there is anything generally present in sensory or perceptual experience about which error is impossible; beliefs about any aspect of experience, involving as they do the need for conceptual classification, are always capable in principle of being mistaken. Nor, for that matter, is it clear why if some sort of item did have this status, this would show that the awareness of it is more fundamental in the way that the idea of immediacy or givenness seems to suggest, and in particular why beliefs about physical objects must be somehow based on the awareness of this other sort of item.

On the basis of difficulties like these, it has sometimes been concluded that the idea of immediacy or givenness is hopelessly obscure, with the implication being that there is no reason why the perceptual awareness of physical objects should not be itself regarded as epistemically fundamental, not needing to be justified by appeal to a more basic awareness of sense-data or of anything else. This is at least part of the motivation for direct realist views (see below).

But such a conclusion (as is suggested in part by the difficulties that arise in making clear sense of direct realism) seems too hasty. My suggestion instead would be that the underlying conception of immediacy or givenness, of which the foregoing criteria are best regarded as merely symptoms, is that for something to be given is simply for it to be an aspect or feature of the content of conscious experience itself (as distinct from the intentional objects that such conscious content may in part be about). On this conception, much more is given than sensory content narrowly construed: conscious feelings, the conscious aspects of emotions, and most importantly the conscious contents of thoughts or beliefs. But it also seems clear that there is a narrowly sensory component, consisting of or involving colors, shapes, sounds, tactile qualities of various sorts, etc. And although more detailed arguments will be considered shortly, it also seems more or less undeniable that physical objects, at least as commonsensically construed, are not themselves literally part of that conscious content, even though they are depicted or represented by various aspects of it.

1.2 The Sense-Datum Theory

As already remarked, the most widely held view historically concerning the strictly sensory aspect of immediate or given experience is that what is given in such experience is, not public physical objects, but rather sense-data (or sometimes sensa): private, non-physical entities that actually possess the various sensory qualities that a person experiences. (For a variant usage of this term, see Moore [1953], who there uses the term "sense-datum" to stand for whatever it is that is immediately experienced or given, possibly even a public physical object, and then argues somewhat tentatively that the entities that actually have this status are sense-data in the more usual sense, rather than physical objects.)

Two main arguments have been offered for this view.

The Argument from Illusion

(Or, perhaps better, the argument from illusion/perceptual relativity/hallucination.) This very widely advocated argument (first offered explicitly in Berkeley [1713]) appeals to the immense variety of cases in which: (i) what is immediately perceived or given has different qualities from different perspectives or under different perceptual conditions, even though the relevant physical object does not change (perceptual relativity); or (ii) in which qualities are immediately experienced that the relevant object clearly does not possess (illusion); or (iii) in which qualities are experienced in a situation in which there is no physical object of the relevant sort present at all (hallucination). Some fairly standard examples: viewing a circular coin from different angles, resulting (allegedly) in the experience of a variety of elliptical shapes; viewing a white or colored object under different kinds of lighting; feeling the temperature of a luke-warm bucket of water with a hand that has previously become inured to water of substantially higher or lower temperatures; viewing a straight stick that is immersed in water and so looks bent; hallucinating a non-existent object such as pink rat or a dagger.

The basic claim is that in cases of illusion or hallucination, the object that is immediately experienced or given has qualities that no public physical object in that situation has and so must be distinct from any such object. And in cases of perceptual relativity, since objects with different qualities are experienced from each of the different perspectives or under each of the relevant conditions, at most one of these various immediately experienced or given objects could be the physical object itself; it is then further argued that since there is no apparent experiential basis for regarding one out of any such set of related perceptual experiences as the one in which the relevant physical object is immediately experienced, the most reasonable conclusion is that the immediately experienced or given object is always distinct from the physical object (or, significantly more weakly, that there is no way to identify which, if any, of the immediately experienced objects is the physical object itself, so that the evidential force of the experience is in this respect the same in all cases, and it is epistemologically as though physical objects were never given, whether or not that is in fact the case).

The cogency of this argument has been challenged in a number of different ways, of which the most important are the following. First, it has been questioned whether there is any reason to suppose that in cases of these kinds there must be some object present that actually has the experienced qualities, which would then seemingly have to be something like a sense-datum. Why couldn't it be the case that the perceiver is simply in a state of seeming to experience such an object without any object actually being present? (See the discussion below of the adverbial theory.) Second, it has been argued that in cases of illusion and perceptual relativity at least, there is an object present, namely the relevant physical object, which is simply misperceived, for the most part in readily explainable ways. Why, it is asked, is there any need to suppose that an additional object is also involved? Third, the last part of the argument has been challenged, both (i) by questioning whether it is really true that there is no experiential difference between veridical and non-veridical perception; and (ii) by arguing that even if sense-data are experienced in non-veridical cases and if the difference between veridical and non-veridical cases is, after all, experientially indiscernible, there is still no reason to think that sense-data are the immediate objects of experience in veridical cases. Fourth, various puzzling questions have been raised about the nature of sense-data: Do they exist through time or are they momentary? Can they exist when not being perceived? Are they public or private? Can they be themselves misperceived? Do they exist in minds or are they extra-mental even if not physical? On the basis of the intractability of these questions, it has often been argued that the conclusion of the argument from illusion is clearly unacceptable or even ultimately unintelligible, even in the absence of a clear diagnosis of exactly where and how it goes wrong.[2]

The Argument from the Scientific Account of Perception

A second argument for the conclusion that sense-data, rather than physical objects, are the direct or immediate objects of even veridical perceptual experience appeals to the causal account of the perceptual process offered by natural science. The main aspects of that account that are cited in this connection are: (i) the fact that the character of the resulting experience and of the physical object that it seems to present can be altered in major ways by changes in the conditions of perception or the condition of the relevant sense-organs and the resulting neurophysiological processes, with no change in the external physical object (if any) that initiates this process and that may seem to be depicted by the experience that results; (ii) the related fact that any process that terminates with the same sensory and neural results will yield the same perceptual experience, no matter what the physical object (if any) that initiated the process may have been like; and (iii) the fact that the causal process that intervenes between the external object and the perceptual experience takes at least a small amount of time, so that insofar as the character of the experience reflects the features of that object, they reflect an earlier stage of that object rather than the one actually existing at that moment. (In extreme cases, as in astronomical observation, the external object may long ago have ceased to exist by the time it is perceived.) These facts are claimed to point inexorably to the conclusion that the direct or immediate object of such an experience, the object that is given, is an entity produced at the end of this causal process and is thus distinct from the physical object, if any, that initiates the process.

It is difficult to resist the conclusion that there is a fundamental distinction between the external object, if any, that initiates the perceptual process and the perceptual experience that eventually results, thus amounting to a fundamental dualism between perceptual experience and the external object and raising the issue of how the latter can be known on the basis of the former. What can and has been resisted, by the adverbial theory in particular, is the idea that this dualism is a dualism of objects, with perceptual experience being a more direct experience of objects of a diffeent sort, sense-data. (Though we will eventually see that the result of balking at this point may have less epistemological significance than it has usually be accorded.)

1.3 The Adverbial Theory

The sense-datum theory is often characterized as an act-object theory of the nature of immediate experience: it accounts for such experience by postulating both an act of awareness or apprehension and an object (the sense-datum) which that act apprehends or is aware of. The fundamental idea of the adverbial theory, in contrast, is that there is no need for such objects and the problems (such as whether they are physical or mental or somehow neither) that they bring with them. Instead, it is suggested, merely a mental act or mental state with its own intrinsic character is enough to account for the character of immediate experience.

According to the adverbial theory, what happens when, for example, I immediately experience a silver elliptical shape (as when viewing a coin from an angle) is that I am in a certain specific state of sensing or sensory awareness or of being appeared to: I sense in a certain manner or am appeared to in a certain way, and it is that specific manner of sensing or way of being appeared to that accounts for the specific content of my immediate experience. This content can be verbally indicated by attaching an adverbial modifier to the verb that expresses the act of sensing (which is where the label for the view comes from). Thus in the example just mentioned, it might be said that I sense or am appeared to silver-elliptical-ly -- where this rather artificial term is supposed to express the idea that the qualitative content that is treated by the sense-datum theory as involving features or properties of an object should instead be thought of as somehow nothing more than the specific manner in which I sense or the specific way in which I am appeared to. Similarly, when I hallucinate a pink rat, I sense or am appeared to a-pink-rat-ly -- or, perhaps better, a-pink-ratshape-ly. And analogously for other examples of immediate experience.

The essential point here is that when I sense or am appeared to silver-elliptical-ly, there need be nothing more going on than that I am in a certain distinctive sort of experiential state. In particular, there need be no object or entity of any sort that is literally silver and elliptical -- not in the material world, not in my mind, and not even in the realm (if there is such a realm) of things that are neither physical nor mental.

1.4 Conclusion Concerning the Sense-Datum and Adverbial Theories

Each of these two views has fairly obvious virtues and equally obvious drawbacks. The sense-datum theory accounts more straightforwardly for the character of immediate experience. I experience a silver and elliptical shape because an object or entity that literally has that color and shape is directly before my mind. But both the nature of these entities and (as we will see further below) the way in which they are related to the mind are difficult to understand.

The adverbial theory, on the other hand, has the advantage of being metaphysically simpler and of avoiding difficult issues about the nature of sense-data.[3] The problem with it is that we seem to have no real understanding of the nature of the states in question or of how exactly they account for the character of immediate experience. It is easy, with a little practice, to construct the adverbial modifiers. But it is doubtful that anyone has a very clear idea of the meaning of such an adverb, of what exactly it says about the character of the state -- beyond saying merely and unhelpfully that it is such as to somehow account for the specific character of the experience.

Here I will limit myself to a brief consideration of one further, less obvious argument against the sense-datum theory and in favor of the adverbial theory, and to pointing out why the issue between these two views, though of great metaphysical significance, may not matter very much if at all for epistemological purposes. As we have so far characterized it, the sense-datum theory is incomplete in one fundamental way. In addition to arguing that sense-data exist, a sense-datum theorist needs some account of the relation between a person and a sense-datum when the former immediately experiences the latter. It does not seem acceptable to say that simply that the sense-datum is itself in the mind, a mental entity, since it has features which neither an immaterial mind nor the physical brain seem capable of possessing. The natural thing to say is that the sense-datum somehow influences the internal state of the person (that is, of his or her mind) in a way that reflects the sense-datum's specific character. But the resulting state of mind would then be just the sort of state that the adverbial theory describes, one which is such that a person who is in it will thereby experience the properties in question. And there would then be no apparent reason why such a state could not be produced directly by whatever process is supposed to produce the sense-datum, with the latter thus becoming an unnecessary intermediary. Thus the sense-datum theorist must apparently say that the immediate experience of the sense-datum does not involve any distinct internal state of the person that reflects its character, but is instead an essentially and irreducibly relational state of affairs. The person simply experiences the sense-datum, but without there being any corresponding change in his or her internal states that would adequately reflect the character of the supposed sense-datum and so make its existence unnecessary in the way suggested. But does this really make good metaphysical sense, and, more importantly, would it allow the person to grasp or apprehend the nature of the sense-datum in a way that could be the basis for further justification and knowledge?

Both views thus have serious problems, though, in light of the last argument, I would assess the problems of the sense-datum theory as the more serious. Fortunately, however, as already suggested, it does not seem necessary for strictly epistemological purposes to decide between these two views. The reason is that while they give very different accounts of what is ultimately going on in a situation of immediate experience, they make no difference with respect to the experienced content of that experience. And it is on that experienced content, not on the further metaphysical explanation of it, that the justificatory power, if any, of such an experience depends.

2. The Justification of Beliefs about the Physical World

In considering this second issue, it will be useful to begin by assuming, subject to later reconsideration, that either the sense-datum theory or the adverbial theory is correct: that what we are immediately aware of in sensory experience is never an external material object, but is either a sense-datum or else the content of a state of sensing or being appeared to. It will be useful to have a brief label for this disjunctive position, and I will refer to it here as perceptual subjectivism.[4] In fact, I will usually, for the sake of simplicity, formulate the issues to be considered in terms of sense-data, leaving the adverbial variant to be supplied by the reader.[5]

Assuming perceptual subjectivism, there are two main non-skeptical alternatives regarding the justification of beliefs concerning material objects on the basis of immediate experience. The more obvious and historically prior view, at least approximated by Descartes and Locke, is representationalism or representative realism: the view that our subjective sensory experience (and the beliefs that we adopt on the basis of it) constitute a representation of the external material world, one that is caused by that world and that we are justified, on the basis of something like a causal or explanatory inference, in thinking to be at least approximately accurate. The second main view is that (i) we can have no knowledge (or perhaps even no intelligible conception) of a realm of external causes of our experience, but also (ii) that our beliefs about the material world can still be in general justified and true because their content pertains only to the features and order of our subjective experience. This is the view that has come to be known as phenomenalism.[6] It will be convenient to begin with the latter of these two views, which was widely held for at least a good part of the 20th century.

2.1 Phenomenalism

As just briefly formulated, the phenomenalist view is that the content of propositions about material objects and the material world is entirely concerned with features and relations of the immediate objects of our perceptual experience, that is, the features and relations of our sense-data.[7] According to the phenomenalist, to believe that a physical or material object of a certain sort exists is just to believe that sense-data of various sorts have been experienced, are being experienced, will be experienced, and/or would be experienced under certain specifiable conditions. Thus, for example, to believe that there is a large brown table in a certain room is to believe, roughly, (i) that the sorts of sense-data that seem from a common-sense standpoint to reflect the presence of such a table either have been, are presently, or will in the future be experienced in the context of other sense-data, themselves experienced concurrently or immediately before or after, that reflect the location as the room in question; and in addition -- or instead, if the table has never in fact been perceived and never in fact will be perceived -- (ii) that such sense-data would be experienced if other sense-data that reflect the perceiver's going to that room were experienced.

In a fairly standard formula, to believe that such a material object exists is, according to the phenomenalist, to believe nothing more than that sense-data of the appropriate sort are actual (in the past, present, or future) and/or possible -- where to say that certain sense-data are possible is to say, not just that it is logically possible for them to be experienced (which would apparently always be so as long as the description of them is not contradictory), but that they would in fact be experienced under certain specified circumstances (themselves specified in sense-datum terms); thus it would be clearer to speak of actual and obtainable sense-data. John Stuart Mill put this point by saying that material objects are "permanent possibilities of sensation,"[8] that is, of sense-data -- where, of course, the possibilities in question are only relatively permanent, since objects can change or be destroyed.

The main argument for this commonsensically implausible view derives from Hume [1739-40]. One premise is the Humean idea that causal relations can be known only by experience, so that there is no way in which a causal relation between the immediate content of experience and something outside that immediate content could be known (and hence also no way to justifiably invoke such external causes as explanations of that experience). The other main premise is simply the common-sense conviction that skepticism is false, that we do obviously have justified beliefs and knowledge concerning ordinary objects like trees and rocks and buildings and about the material world in which they exist. And the argument is then just that the only way that such justified beliefs and knowledge are possible, given that no causal or explanatory inference from immediate experience to material objects that are genuinely external to that experience could ever be justified, is if the content of our beliefs about the material world does not really have to do with objects existing outside our immediate experience, but instead pertains just to that experience and the order that it manifests. Most phenomenalists will admit that this seems initially implausible, but will try to argue that this apparent implausibility is in some way an illusion, one that can be explained away once the phenomenalist view and the considerations in favor of it have been fully understood.[9]

Objections to Phenomenalism

Many, many objections and problems that have been advanced in relation to phenomenalism. Here we will be content with a few of the most interesting ones:

Consider, first, what is perhaps the most obvious question about the phenomenalist view: Why, according to the phenomenalist, are the orderly sense-data in question obtainable or "permanently possible?" What is the explanation for the pattern of actual and obtainable sense experiences that constitutes the existence of a material object or of the material world as a whole, if this is not to be explained by appeal to genuinely external objects? The only possible phenomenalist response to this question is to say that the fact that sensory experience reflects this sort of order is simply the most fundamental fact about reality, not further explainable in terms of anything else. For any attempted further explanation, since it would obviously have to appeal to something outside of that experience, would be (for the reasons already discussed) unjustified and unknowable. (The phenomenalist will add that it is obvious anyway that not everything can be explained, since each explanation just introduces some further fact for which an explanation might be demanded.)

But it seems both quite implausible to suppose that something as large and complicated as the total order of our immediate experience has no explanation at all -- and also very obvious that common sense (at least if it accepted perceptual subjectivism) would regard claims about material objects as providing such an explanation, rather than as just a redescription of the experiential order itself (as the phenomenalist claims). Perhaps, for all we have seen so far, the phenomenalist is right that we cannot ever know that any such explanation is correct, but this, if so, is an argument for skepticism about the material world, not a justification for perversely reinterpreting the meaning or content of claims about material objects. (Here it is important to be clear that phenomenalism is not supposed to be a skeptical view, but rather an account of how beliefs about material objects are indeed justified and do constitute knowledge -- given the phenomenalist account of the content of such beliefs.)

A second problem (or rather a set of related problems) has to do with the specification of the conditions under which the various sense-data that (according to phenomenalism) are what a material-object proposition is about either are or would be experienced. It is clear that such conditions must be specified to have even a hope of capturing the content of at least most such propositions in sense-datum terms. To recur to our earlier example, to say merely that the sense-data that are characteristic of a brown table are actual or obtainable in some circumstances or other may perhaps capture the content of the claim that the world contains at least one brown table (though even that is very doubtful), but surely not of any more specific claim, such as the one about such a table being in a particular room. For that, conditions must be specified that say, as it were, that it is in relation to that particular room that the sense-data are or would be experienced. (But for the phenomenalist, the room does not of course exist as a mind-external place; talk of a room or of any physical location is to be understood merely as a way of indicating one aspect of the order of immediate experience.)

What makes this problem extremely difficult is that for phenomenalism to be a viable position, the conditions under which sense-data are experienced or obtainable must themselves be specifiable in terms of other sense-data, not in terms of material objects and structures such as the library or room in question. For the essential claim of phenomenalism is that the content of propositions about material objects can be entirely specified in terms of sense-data. If in specifying the conditions under which the actual and obtainable sense-data relevant to one material-object proposition would occur, it were necessary to make essential reference to other material objects, then the account of the content of the first proposition would not yet be completely in sense-datum terms. And if in specifying the conditions relevant to claims about those other material objects, still other material objects would have to be mentioned, and so on, then the phenomenalist account would never be complete. If the content of propositions about material objects cannot be given entirely in terms of sense-data, if that content involves essential and ineliminable reference to further such objects, then phenomenalism fails.

How then can the idea that sense-data are or would be observed in a certain location be adequately captured in purely sense-datum terms? The natural response, which was in effect invoked when the example was originally discussed, is to appeal to the idea of a sensory route: a series of juxtaposed and often overlapping sense-data that would be experienced in what we think of intuitively as moving to or approaching the location in question. But there are at least two serious problems about this answer, however. One is that there are normally many different sensory routes to a given location, depending on where one starts; and if the starting location is itself determined by a previous sensory route, then a regress threatens, in which the sensory conditions must go further and further back in time without ever reaching a place from which they can unproblematically begin. A second problem is that it seems clear that we can often understand the claim that a certain material object or set of objects exists at a certain physical location without having any clear idea of the relevant sensory route: for example, I understand the claim that there are penguins at the South Pole, but have no idea of the sensory route that I would have to follow to guarantee that I have reached the South Pole. (Note that it is a guarantee that is required, for otherwise the content of the claim in question as not been fully captured.)[10]

A related, but still much more difficult problem of what the phenomenalist can say about the content of propositions about material objects and events in the past, perhaps the very distant past. Under what sensory conditions would sense-data of a tree have to have been obtainable to make it true that there was a pine tree in the place now occupied by my house in 1000 B.C.? It is thus very doubtful that the sort of specification of conditions that the phenomenalist needs is possible in general.

A generalization of this objection is offered by Roderick Chisholm.[11] Chisholm argues that there is in fact no conditional proposition in sense-datum terms, however long and complicated the set of conditions in the "if" part, that is ever even part of the content of a material-object proposition. This is shown, he claims, by the fact that for any such sense-datum proposition, it is always possible to describe conditions of observation (including conditions having to do with the state of the observer) under which the sense-datum proposition would be false, but the material-object proposition might still be true. The idea here is to describe various sorts of abnormalities pertaining to the conditions or the observer: for example, having followed the sensory route to the room in the library, I am suddenly struck blind or knocked unconscious or injected with a mind-altering drug at just the instant before I would experience the distinctive table sense-data, which thus are not experienced (or the lighting is so altered as to make it impossible to see the table or to make it look very different in color; or the table is dropped through a trap door in the floor, to be restored only after I leave; etc.). Chisholm's suggestion is that the only way to guarantee that the sense-data that are experienced reflect the object that is actually there is to specify the conditions in material terms. But in that case, for the reason already discussed, the phenomenalist project cannot succeed.

A third, somewhat related, but deeper problem[12] arises by reflecting that it is apparently a condition for the success of phenomenalism that the realm of sense-data have an intrinsic order of its own, one that can be recognized and described solely in terms of the sense-data themselves. For how could we (without invoking independent material objects) have any justification for thinking that further sense-data will, under various conditions, occur, except by finding regularities in those we actually experience and reasoning inductively? But does such an intrinsic order of sense-data really exist? It is obvious that our sense-data are not merely chaotic, but far less obvious that they have an order that can be captured without making reference to material objects. And this is not something that the phenomenalist can just assume, for it is utterly essential to his whole position.

A fourth and final objection to phenomenalism, one that is much simpler and more straightforward, concerns what the phenomenalist must apparently say about the knowledge of the mental states of people other than myself (or other than whoever is thinking about the issue). The whole thrust of the phenomenalist position, as we have seen, is that any inference beyond immediate experience is impossible, that claims that might seem to be about things outside of experience must, if they are to be justified and knowable, be understood as pertaining only to features and orderly patterns of that experience. But the mental states of other people, their experiences and feelings and conscious thoughts, are surely outside of my immediate experience. Indeed, to reach justified conclusions about what people distinct from me are genuinely thinking and experiencing apparently requires two inferences: first, an inference from my immediate experience of sense-data pertaining to their physical bodies to conclusions about those bodies; and then, second, an inference from the facts about those bodies thus arrived at to further conclusions about the minds and mental states of the people in question. Both of these inferences depend on causal relations that are, according to the phenomenalist, unknowable, because we cannot experience both sides, or in the second case even one side, of the relation; and thus neither inference, construed in that way, is justified according to the basic phenomenalist outlook.

What phenomenalism must apparently say here, in order to be consistent, is: (i) that the content of propositions about the conditions and behavior of other people's bodies, like that of all other material object propositions, pertains only to facts about my immediate experience; and (ii) that the content of further claims about the mental states associated with those bodies is only a further, more complicated and less direct description of, once again, my experience. Though the phenomenalist would perhaps resist putting it this way, the upshot is that my mind and mental states, including my immediate experience, is the only mind and the only collection of mental states that genuinely exist, with claims that are apparently about other minds amounting only to further descriptions of this one mind and its experiences. This is the view known as solipsism. It seems clearly to be an absurd consequence, thus yielding a really decisive objection, if one were still needed, to phenomenalism.

2.2 Representationalism

If phenomenalism is indeed untenable, and assuming that we continue to accept perceptual subjectivism, then the only non-skeptical alternative apparently left is representationalism: the view, restating it a bit, that our immediately experienced sense-data, together with the further beliefs that we arrive at on the basis of them, constitute a representation or depiction of an independent realm of material objects -- one that we are in general, according to the representationalist, justified in believing to be true.

Defenses of representationalism have taken a variety of forms, but I will assume here that the best general sort of defense for such a view is one along the lines suggested, albeit not very explicitly, in Locke (and indeed also, though even less explicitly, in Descartes). The central idea is, first, that (contrary to the claim of the phenomenalist) some explanation is needed for the complicated and intricate order that we find in our (involuntarily experienced) sense-data (or adverbial contents); and, second, that the best explanation, that is, the one most likely to be correct, is that those experiences are caused by and, with certain qualifications, systematically reflect the character of a world of genuinely independent material objects, which we accordingly have good reasons for believing to exist.

It is this appeal to what has come to be referred to as "inference to the best explanation" that allegedly provides an answer to the Humean argument, by allowing the supposed causal and explanatory relation between material objects and sensory experience to be known or justifiably believed in despite the fact that it cannot itself be immediately experienced. A consideration of the merits of this general idea of explanatory or abductive inference is beyond the scope of the present article [see abduction]. Here we will be concerned solely with whether and to what extent representationalism can be defended, given the fairly widely accepted assumption that such reasoning is in general cogent.

The Representationalist Explanation of Experience

Before considering whether the representationalist explanation of sensory experience is really the best one, we need to consider in more detail what the rationale for that explanation might be.

The place to start is to ask what it is about the character of our immediate sensory experience that points to or perhaps even seems to demand such an explanation. In perhaps the earliest very explicit discussion of this issue, Locke[13] points to two features of our experience in this connection: (i) its involuntary character, i.e., the fact that it simply occurs without any choice or control on the part of the person having the experience; (ii) the systematic order or coherence of that experience. But while these features may indeed demand some sort of explanation, they do not, at least when described at that level of abstraction, point at all clearly at the specific one that the representationalist favors. Why shouldn't these features of experience be explained in some quite different way, such as the one proposed by Berkeley (and considered by Descartes): by appeal to a deity or similar being who causes the experience in us?[14] If anything about experience does points to Locke's explanation rather than Berkeley's, it will have to be something more specific than the features mentioned by Locke.

My tentative suggestion is that there are at least two aspects of the order of experience that suggest and might indeed seem to demand the representationalist's explanation in terms of external material objects. The first is the presence in immediate experience of repeatable sequences of experienced qualities that overlap and often shade gradually into one another. Here I have in mind something like the "sensory routes" that were, as discussed earlier, invoked by the phenomenalist. While these "sensory routes" cannot ultimately do the job that the phenomenalist needs them to do, for the reasons given there, they are nonetheless very real and pervasive. Think of the ways in which such "sensory routes" can be experienced in opposite orders (imagine here what common sense would regard as walking from one place to another and then returning to the first place by the same route -- perhaps even walking backwards, so as to make the two sequences as similar as possible). Think of the ways in which such "sensory routes" intersect with each other, thus, for example, allowing one to get from one end to the other without going through the "route" itself, thereby delineating a sensory loop. Think of the resulting structure of a whole set of overlapping and intersecting "sensory routes."[15]

The idea is then that at least the most obvious and natural explanation of these features of our experience is that we are located in a 3-dimensional spatial realm of objects through which we move and of which we can perceive at any given moment only the limited portion that is close enough to be accessible to our various senses (what this requires differs from sense to sense). Our experience reflects both the qualities of these objects and the different perspectives from which they are perceived as we gradually approach them from different directions, at different speeds, under different conditions of perception, etc. It is thus the relatively permanent structure of this spatial array of objects that is reflected in the much more temporary and variable, but broadly repeatable features of our immediate experience.

The second, and even more important aspect of immediate experience that points to the representationalist explanation is the fact, already noticed in our discussion of phenomenalism, that the order just indicated, though undeniably impressive, is in fact incomplete or fragmentary in a number of related ways. The easiest way to indicate these is by reference to the sorts of situations that, from a common-sense standpoint, produce and explain them (though the representationalist cannot, of course, assume at this stage, without begging the question, that these situations are what is actually occurring). Imagine then traversing a "sensory route" of the sort just indicated, but doing so: (i) with one's eyes closed (or one's ears plugged, etc.) during some of the time required, or perhaps while asleep during part of the time (traveling in a car or train); or (ii) while the conditions of perception, including those pertaining to the functioning of your sense-organs and to your mental "processing", are changing or being varied (involving such things as changing lighting, including complete darkness; jaundice and similar diseases that affect perception; objects and conditions that temporarily block or interfere with perception; even something as simple as turning one's head in a different direction, blinking, or wiping one's eyes). Reflection on cases like these show that the sensory sequences that define the various "sensory routes" are in fact substantially less regular and dependable than they might at first seem.

Thus the representationalist can in effect argue that the realm of immediate sensory experience, of sense-data (or adverbial contents), is both too orderly not to demand an explanation and not orderly enough for that explanation to be that the sense-data have an intrinsic order of their own. What this strongly suggests, the representationalist will argue, is an independent realm of objects outside our experience, having its own patterns of (mainly spatial) order, with the partial and fragmentary order of our experience resulting from our partial and intermittent perceptual contact with that larger and more stable realm.

The discussion so far provides only an initial and highly schematic picture of the representationalist's proposed explanation. It would have to be filled out in a number of ways in order to be even approximately complete. Here I will be content with three further points. First, the main focus of the discussion so far has been on spatial properties of material objects and the features of immediate experience that seem to suggest them. Thus the result so far is at best only a kind of skeletal picture of the material world, one that would have to be "fleshed out" in various ways in order to even approximate the common-sense picture of the world. In fact, it is useful to think of the representationalist explanation as starting with spatial properties as a first and most fundamental stage and then adding further refinements to that starting point.

Second, the most important addition to this initial spatial picture of the world would be various sorts of causal relations among material objects and between such objects and perceivers, together with the causal and dispositional properties of objects (flammability, solubility, malleability, brittleness, toxicity, etc., etc.) that underlie such relations. These are warranted by the need to explain apparent changes in material objects that are reflected in relatively permanent changes in the otherwise stable "sensory routes". Here it is important to note that like the stable spatial order, the causal regularities that pertain to material objects are only intermittently and fragmentarily reflected in immediate experience, partially for the reasons already considered, but also because any given perceiver may simply not be in the right position to observe the beginning or end or some intermediate part of a given causal sequence, even though other parts are experienced. Simple examples would include throwing a rock into the air without seeing or hearing it land, pulling on a string without observing the movement of an object at the other end (or seeing the object move but without observing the movement of part of the intervening string), or planting a seed and returning later to find a well-developed plant.[16]

Third, there is the issue of primary and secondary qualities. Locke's view was that material objects have primary qualities like size, shape, and motion through space, but not secondary qualities like color, smell, taste, and felt temperature; and most other representationalists have tended to agree with him on this. Here it will suffice to focus on color, surely the most apparently pervasive and interesting of the secondary qualities.[17] Clearly the denial that material objects are genuinely colored seriously complicates the representationalist's proposed explanation by making the relation between material objects and our immediate experiences much less straightforward than it would otherwise be: according to such a view, while our immediate experiences of spatial properties are caused more or less directly by closely related spatial properties of objects (allowing, importantly, for perspective), our immediate experiences of color properties are caused by utterly different properties of material objects, primarily by how their surfaces differentially reflect wavelengths of light.

Locke offers little real argument for this view, but the argument he seems to have in mind is that as the causal account of the material world develops, it turns out that ascribing a property like color (construed as the "sensuous" property that is present in immediate visual experience) to material objects is in fact quite useless for explaining our experiences of colors. What colors we experience depends on the properties of the light that strikes our eyes and this in turn, in the most standard cases, depends on how material objects reflect and absorb light, which yet in turn depends on the structure of their surfaces as constituted by primary and causal properties. I think that this is correct as a matter of science, but the important point for the moment is that if it is correct, then the denial that material objects are really colored simply follows from the basic logic of the representationalist position: according to representationalism, the only justification for ascribing any property to the material world is that it is required to explain some aspect of our immediate experience, so that the ascription of properties that cannot figure in such explanations is automatically unjustified.

Alternatives to the Representationalist Explanation

The discussion so far has perhaps made a reasonable case, though of course nothing like a conclusive one, that the representationalist's proposed explanation of the order of our immediate experience has a good deal of plausibility in relation to that experience. But this is still not enough to show that it is the best explanation and hence the one, assuming the general acceptability of theoretical reasoning, whose acceptance is thereby justified. Why, if at all, should the explanation of our experience that invokes external, mind-independent material objects be preferred to other possible explanations such as Berkeley's view that our sensory experience is caused by God, who shapes and maintains the order that it reflects (or the very similar if not identical one that appeals to Descartes's evil genius)?

It should be obvious that Berkeley's explanatory hypothesis is capable of explaining the very same features of immediate experience that the representationalist appeals to. All that is needed is for God to have an ideally complete conception or picture of the representationalist's material world and then to systematically cause experiences in perceivers that reflect their apparent location in and movement through such a world. (This assumes that God can recognize intentions to "move" in various directions and adjust the person's perceptions accordingly; of course, no genuine movement really takes place, nor does the perceiver really have a physical location.) A different, but essentially parallel explanatory hypothesis, is provided by a science fiction scenario: the perceiver is a disembodied brain floating in a vat of brain nutrients and receiving electrical impulses from a computer that again contains an ideally complete model or representation of a material world and generates the impulses accordingly, taking account of motor impulses received from the brain that reflect the person's intended movements. And further explanatory hypotheses can be generated according to the same basic formula: there must be some sort of a representation or model of a material world together with some sort of mechanism (which need not be mechanical in the ordinary sense) that systematically produces experience in perceivers, allowing for their subjectively intended movements. Any pattern of immediate experience that can be explained by the representationalist's explanatory hypothesis can thus automatically be also explained by explanatory hypotheses of this latter sort, probably indefinitely many of them, with no possible experiential basis for deciding between them or between any one of them and the representationalist hypothesis.

If there is to be a reason for favoring the representationalist hypothesis, it will therefore have to be a priori in character, and it is more than a little difficult to see what it might be. Here I will limit myself to one fairly tentative suggestion.

One striking contrast between the representationalist's explanatory hypothesis and the others we have looked at is that under the representationalist view there is a clear intuitive sense in which the qualities of the objects that explain our immediate experience are reflected in the character of that experience itself, so that the latter can be said to be, allowing for perspective and perhaps other sorts of distortion, experiences of the former, albeit indirect ones. Once again this applies most straightforwardly to spatial properties: thus, for example, the rectangular or trapezoidal shape that is immediately experienced can be said to be an indirect perception of a rectangular face of the material object that causes that experience. In contrast, the features of the elements in the other explanatory hypotheses that are responsible for the various features of our experience are not directly reflected in that experience. For example, what is responsible in these other hypotheses for the rectangular or trapezoidal shape in my immediate experience is one aspect of God's total picture or conception of a material world, or perhaps one aspect of a representation of such a world stored in a computer. This aspect has in itself no shape of any sort (or at least, in the case of the computer, none that is at all relevant to the shape that I experience); it is merely a representation of a related shape, according to some system of representation or coding. Thus its relation to the character of the experience that it is supposed to explain is inherently less direct, more convoluted than is the case for the representationalist's explanation.

My tentative suggestion is that the inherently less direct character of the way that these competing explanatory hypotheses account for the features of our immediate experience may yield a reason for preferring the more direct and thus in a sense simpler representationalist explanatory hypothesis, for regarding it as more likely to be true. But how, exactly?[18] The idea is that an explanatory hypothesis like Berkeley's, at least as we have construed it, depends for its explanatory success on the truth of two equally essential claims: first, the claim that a material world of the sort postulated by the representationalist could account for the features of our experience, for it is precisely by emulating or mimicking the action of such a world that God (or the computer) decides just what experiences to produce in us; and, second, that God (or the computer) can indeed successfully produce the required emulation. But the representationalist view requires only the truth of the first of these two claims. It is thus, I suggest, inherently less vulnerable to problems and challenges and so more likely to be true. And this is an apparent reason for regarding the representationalist's explanatory hypothesis as providing the best of these competing explanations.

Is this a successful argument for representationalism? There are at least two questions about it that need to be considered. First, the argument assumes that the competitors to representationalism are all parasitic upon the representationalist explanatory hypothesis in the way indicated, and it is worth asking whether this is really so. Is there an explanation of our immediate experience that does not in this way rely on an emulation of the way in which a material world would produce that experience? Second, even if the argument succeeds to a degree, how probable or likely does it make the material world hypothesis in comparison to these others? Is the resulting degree of probability or likelihood high enough to agree approximately with our common-sense convictions in this regard?

2.3 Direct Realism

The upshot of our discussion so far is that phenomenalism appears entirely untenable, and that at least a better defense than many have supposed possible can be offered for representationalism. Many recent philosophers, however, have thought that there is a third alternative that is superior to either of these: one usually referred to as direct realism. The central idea of direct realism is that the view we have called perceptual subjectivism is false, that is, that instead of immediately experiencing either sense-data or adverbial contents, we instead directly experience external material objects, without the mediation of these other sorts of entities. And the suggestion often seems to be, though this is usually not explained very fully, that such a view can simply bypass the representationalist's problem of justifying the inference from immediate experience to the material world and do so without having to advocate anything as outlandish as phenomenalism.[19]

For anyone who has struggled with the idea of sense-data (or the adverbial alternative) and with the difficulties and complexities of representationalism and phenomenalism, the apparent simplicity of direct realism, the way in which it seems to make extremely difficult or even intractable problems simply vanish, may be difficult to resist. We must be cautious, however. What does such a view amount to, and can it really deliver the results that it promises?

We may begin with a point that is often advanced in arguments for direct realism, one that turns out however to be of much less help than has sometimes been thought in either defending or even explaining the view. Think about an ordinary example of perceptual experience: standing in my back yard, I watch my dogs chasing each other in a large circle around some bushes, weaving in and out of the sunshine and shadows, as a car drives by on the street. The direct realist's claim is that in such a case (assuming that I am in a normal, non-philosophical frame of mind), the picture that it is easy to find in or read into some representationalists, according to which I first have thoughts or occurrent beliefs about the character of my experience (whether understood in sense-datum or in adverbial content terms) and then infer explicitly from these to thoughts or beliefs about material objects is simply and flatly wrong as a description of my actual conscious state. In fact, the only things that I think about at all directly and explicitly in such a case are things like dogs and bushes and cars and sunlight, not anything as subtle and abstruse as sense-data or adverbial contents. The direct realist need not deny (though some have seemed to) that my sensory experience somehow involves the various qualities, such as complicated patterns of shape and color, that these other views have spoken of, or even that I am in some way aware of conscious of these. His point is that whatever may be said about these other matters, from an intuitive standpoint it is material objects and nothing else that are "directly before my mind" -- and that any view that denies this obvious truth is simply mistaken about the facts.

Almost everyone will agree that the direct realist is right about this. What happens most centrally in perceptual experience is that we have explicit thoughts or "perceptual judgments" about what we are perceiving; and in normal cases (apart from very special artistic or perhaps philosophical contexts), these perceptual judgments are directly and entirely about things (and processes and qualities) in the external material world. Philosophers speak of that which a propositional state of mind is directly about as its intentional object, and we can accordingly say that the intentional objects of our basic perceptual judgments are normally material objects. In this way, the relation of such judgments to material objects is, it might be said, intentionally direct.

But what bearing, if any, does this intentional directness have on the central epistemological question of what reason or justification we have for thinking that such perceptual judgments about the material world are true? Perhaps the sort of direct presence to the mind that is involved in the idea of immediate experience considered earlier yields the result that one's beliefs or awarenesses concerning the objects of such experience are automatically justified, simply because there is no room for error to creep in. But is there any way in which it follows from the mere fact that perceptual judgments about material objects are intentionally direct that they are also justified? It still seems obvious that both a perceptual judgment and the total state of mind of which it is a part are quite distinct from the material object, if any, that is its intentionally direct object. This is shown by the fact that in cases like hallucination, the object in question need not exist at all, but it would be clear enough even without such cases -- phenomenalist views having been rejected, the material object does not somehow literally enter the mind. Thus even though perceptual judgments are directly about such objects in the intentional sense, the question of whether they represent them correctly still arises in exactly the same way that it does for the representationalist. And this question must apparently still be answered, if at all, by appeal to the immediately experienced features of that state of mind, with the specific character of the sensory experience being the only obvious thing to appeal to.

Thus while the idea of intentional directness contributes to a view that presents a somewhat more accurate picture of the perceptual state of mind, the view that results seems to still be fundamentally a version of representationalism in that it faces the same essential problem of justifying the transition (whether it is an explicit inference or not) from the character of the person's experience to beliefs or judgments about the material world. If this is all that direct realism amounts to, then it is not a genuinely distinct third alternative.

Is there any further way to make sense of the "directness" to which direct realist appeals, one that might yield more interesting epistemological results? It is far from obvious what it would be. Some proponents of this supposed view have tried to deny that we have any awareness of the character of our immediate experience that is both distinct from our judgmental awareness of material objects and of the sort that could provide the basis for the justification of material object claims. Such a challenge raises subtle and difficult issues about different kinds of awareness, but it is hard to see how it could really be correct. Moreover, the correctness of this challenge, while it would surely constitute a serious or perhaps even conclusive objection to representationalism, would not yield in any obvious way a positive direct realist account of how beliefs about the material world are justified, if not in the representationalist way.

My tentative conclusion is that the idea that direct realism represents a further alternative on the present issue is a chimera. Thus, once phenomenalism is rejected as hopeless, the only alternatives with regard to knowledge of the external world appear to be skepticism and some version of representationalism, perhaps one that recognizes and incorporates the view that perceptual judgments about the material world are intentionally direct.

2.4 Conclusion

The following two conclusions seem to me to be fairly strongly supported by the foregoing discussion. First, some version of perceptual subjectivism is probably correct, with the adverbial theory being the more promising of the two main alternatives. Second, assuming that perceptual subjectivism is indeed correct, representationalism is by far the most defensible non-skeptical account of how beliefs concerning material objects are justified. But there are many philosophers who regard direct realism as a more promising alternative than has been suggested here. And there are perhaps many more (though not the present author) who believe that some epistemological view at a different level, such a a coherentist or contextualist theory of justification, can circumvent these problems.

3. Externalist Theories of Perception

As noted at the beginning, the foregoing discussion is entirely concerned with the views and issues that arise under an internalist account of epistemic justification. The adoption of an externalist account of justification alters and greatly simplifies the account of the justification of perceptual beliefs. Here I wll focus on the most standard version of exernalism, namely reliabilism, according to which a belief is justfied if it results from a reliable causal process.[20]

On such a reliabilist view, the justification of a perceptual belief depends only on the reliability of the perceptual process that produces it, that is, on the fact (assuming that it is a fact) that this process leads to a suitably high proportion of true beliefs. (Note that it is not required that the believer or anyone else know that the process is reliable or have any sort of cognitive access to its reliability -- all that is required it is that is in fact reliable.) The justification of such a belief thus requires no appeal to sensory experience at all, thus effectively short-circuiting the issue that divides representationalism and phenomenalism. Such reliabilist views might in a way be viewed as versions of direct realism, but it is less misleading to simply regard them as rejecting the issue which all three of the more traditional theories attempt to respond to: the issue of how sensory experience provides a reason for thinking that perceptual beliefs are true.

Reliabilism thus offers a very sraightforward and seemingly unproblematic account of how perceptual beliefs about physical objects and the physical world are, in a sense, justified -- again, on the assumption that our perceptual processes are in fact reliable in the way that we take them to be. But it is important to realize that even if this last assumption is correct, the reliabilist account is quite compatible with our having no reason at all for thinking that such processes are indeed reliable and so no reason at all for thinking that our perceptual beliefs are either justified or likely to be true. It is for this reason that the ease with which the standard issues are avoided on a reliabilist view may seem to constitute a defect rather than a virtue of the position.


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

Berkeley, George | Hume, David | justification, epistemic: coherentist theories of | justification, epistemic: foundationalist theories of | justification, epistemic: internalist vs. externalist conceptions of | Locke, John | perception: the problem of

Copyright © 2001
Laurence BonJour

A | B | C | D | E | F | G | H | I | J | K | L | M | N | O | P | Q | R | S | T | U | V | W | X | Y | Z

Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy