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Einstein correctly described the equivalence of mass and energy as
"the most important upshot of the special theory of relativity"
(Einstein, 1919), for it is more than a mere curiosity of physics.
According to Einstein’s famous equation *E* =
*mc*^{2}, the energy (*E*) of a body is
numerically equal to the product of its mass (*m*) and the
speed of light (*c*) squared. It is customary to refer to this
result as "the equivalence of mass and energy," or simply
"mass-energy equivalence," because one can choose units in which
*c* = 1, and hence *E* = *m*. An
important consequence of *E* = *mc*^{2} is
that a change in the rest-energy of a body is accompanied by a
corresponding change to its inertial mass. (This is discussed further
in Section 1.) This has led many philosophers to argue that
mass-energy equivalence has profound consequences for ontology, the
philosophical study of what there is. There are two main
philosophical interpretations of *E* =
*mc*^{2}. The first is that mass-energy equivalence
teaches us that "mass" and "energy" designate the same
*property* of physical systems. This is the weaker of the two
interpretations because no further ontological claims are made. The
second interpretation is that *E* =
*mc*^{2} entails that there is only one sort of
fundamental *stuff* in the world. (This is discussed further
in Section 2.) Recently, the history of *E* =
*mc*^{2} has also attracted the attention of some
philosophers. This is primarily, though not exclusively, because this
history shows that *E* = *mc*^{2} is a
direct consequence of changes to the structure of spacetime brought
about by Special Relativity. (This is discussed further in Section
3.)

- 1. Mass-Energy Equivalence: The Result
- 2. Philosophical Interpretations of Mass-Energy Equivalence
- 3. History of Derivations of Mass-Energy Equivalence
- 4. Experimental Verification of Mass-Energy Equivalence
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

The equation *E*=*mc*^{2} has two distinct physical
consequences. To see this, one needs first to distinguish between a
body’s rest-mass and its relativistic mass. In Newtonian physics, the
inertial mass of a body is a measure of that body’s resistance to
acceleration. This is the notion of mass one uses in everyday life when
one talks about, for example, 1 kg. of salt. Furthermore, in Newtonian
physics, the inertial mass of a body is independent of its relative
state of motion. Because this is no longer the case in relativistic
physics, one can identify two notions of mass in Special Relativity
(SR). The *rest-mass* of a body is the inertial mass of that
body when it is at rest relative to an inertial frame. The term
*m* in the equation *E*=*mc*^{2} does
*not* represent rest-mass; it represents *relativistic
mass*, which is the inertial mass of a body when it is in a state
of motion relative to an inertial frame. If we use
*m*_{o}
to designate the rest-mass of a body, then we can re-write
Einstein’s equation in the following way:

These equations entail that:

(I)In the frame of reference in which a body is at rest, its energy (in this case called therest-energy) is equal to the product of its rest-massm_{o}and the speed of light squared. This is because in this casev= 0, so the Lorentz factor is one.

(II)In a frame of reference in which a body moves with velocityv, the energy of the body is equal to the product of its rest-mass, the speed of light squared, and the Lorentz factor.

From **(I)** it follows that if there is a change in
the rest-energy of a body, there must be a corresponding change in its
rest-mass. For example, if a body is heated, and thereby absorbs a
small amount of energy
*E*
(as measured in the frame of reference in which the body is at
rest), its rest-mass will increase by a very small amount equal to
*E*/*c*^{2}.
This increase is tiny because of the high numerical value of the
speed of light. Indeed, for mid-sized objects, such an increase in
mass would be too small to measure with even the most accurate
balance. For example, if a 1 kg block of gold is heated so that its
temperature increases by 10 °C, then its mass could increase by
as much as 1.4 × 10^{-14} kg; a cube of gold of this
additional tiny mass would have sides smaller than one
one-thousandths of a millimeter. Similarly, if a body emits an
amount of energy
*E*,
say in the form of light or heat, its rest-mass will decrease by a
tiny amount
*E*/*c*^{2}.
In both cases, the important and novel claim made by SR is that the
inertial mass of a body can change depending on whether it absorbs or
emits energy.

**(I)** also entails that there are physical
interactions in which masses no longer combine by simple addition, as
they do in pre-relativistic physics. For example, suppose two bodies
*A* and *B* collide to produce a single, more massive
body *AB*. Suppose further that a net amount of energy
*E* is emitted in this inelastic collision, say in the form of
heat. **(I)** entails that the rest-mass of *AB*
will be *less* than the rest-mass of *A* plus the
rest-mass of *B* by an amount equal to
*E*/*c*^{2}. This stands in sharp contrast to
the pre-relativistic prediction that the rest-mass of *AB*
will be *equal* to the rest-mass of *A* plus the
rest-mass of *B*. So, for example, suppose a meteor
(*A*) struck the earth (*B*). After the crash, the
earth (*AB*) would have a mass that is a tiny bit less than
the mass of the meteor plus the mass of the earth prior to the
crash. This is because during the collision the meteor loses part of
its kinetic energy as heat radiation. This energy loss corresponds to
a loss of mass. It is worth emphasizing that, according to SR, it is
the *inertial* mass of bodies that is no longer simply added
in collisions such as these. In other words, SR predicts that the
resulting body *AB* will resist acceleration a tiny bit less
than one would have predicted according to pre-relativistic physics.
There is an analogous result for cases where a single body
disintegrates into two or more bodies.

These consequences of **(I)** also illustrate how the
classical conservation principles are modified by SR. According to
Newtonian physics, all physical interactions are separately governed
by the principles of conservation of mass and conservation of
energy. So, for example, according to pre-relativistic physics the
mass of the block of gold discussed above must remain the same as it
is heated. However, as we have seen, this is not the case in
relativistic physics, because the energy absorbed by the block of
gold contributes to an increase in its rest-mass. Similarly,
Newtonian physics predicts that mass is conserved when the meteor
crashes into the earth in the above example. However, according to
relativistic physics, some of the mass is radiated away as energy in
the form of heat. In both of these examples, it is the total mass
*and* energy of the entire system that is conserved in these
interactions. In general, in SR physical interactions no longer
satisfy the two classical conservation principles
separately. Instead, these two principles are fused into a single
principle: the principle of conservation of mass-energy. It is these
consequences of **(I)**, and indirectly the fusing of
the two classical conservation principles, that have motivated
different philosophical interpretations of
*E*=*mc*^{2} (see Section 2,
Philosophical Interpretations of Mass-Energy Equivalence).

From **(II)** it follows that no bounded amount of
energy is sufficient to accelerate a body to the speed of light. This
is because as the speed of a body approaches the speed of light its
relativistic mass increases without bound. But this means that the
body’s resistance to acceleration, as measured in the inertial
frame relative to which it is moving, also increases without
bound. In practice, this means that it takes more and more energy to
achieve proportionally smaller increases in the speed of a body. For
example, suppose an electron requires an amount of energy *E*
to reach 50% of the speed of light. The electron requires twice that
amount of energy to reach 90% of the speed of light, roughly six
times *E* to reach 99% of the speed of light, and nearly two
hundred times *E* to reach 99.999% of the speed of light! This
consequence of *E*=*mc*^{2} is thus crucial in
the design and operation of particle accelerators, and it is often
emphasized in the popular media (e.g., in popular science books and
films). However, its philosophical import is relatively minor because
the increase in relativistic mass does not result in a change to the
body. In the frame of reference in which the body is at rest, its
inertial mass continues to be
*m*_{o}.

A common misconception surrounding *E* =
*mc*^{2} is that it entails that the entire rest-mass
of a body can become energy. Strictly speaking, mass-energy
equivalence only entails that a *change* in the rest-energy of
a body is invariably accompanied by a corresponding *change*
in the rest-mass of the body. For example, a body may lose a bit of
its mass because it radiates a bit of energy. The stronger claim that
a body may lose *all* of its rest-mass as it radiates energy
is *not* a consequence of SR. However, this stronger claim is
very well confirmed by experiments in atomic physics. Many
particle-antiparticle collisions have been observed, such as
collisions between electrons and positrons, where the entire mass of
the particles is radiated away as energy in the form of
light. Nevertheless, SR leaves open the possibility that a form of
matter exists whose mass cannot become energy. This is significant
because it emphasizes that mass-energy equivalence is not a
consequence of a theory of matter; it is instead a direct consequence
of changes to the structure of spacetime imposed by SR (see Section
3,
Derivations of Mass-Energy Equivalence: History).

Philosophical interpretations of mass-energy equivalence can be
classified into two main groups. Interpretations in the first group,
such as Eddington’s (1929), and more recently Torretti’s
(1983), regard the terms "mass" and "energy" as designating
*properties* of physical systems. According to these
interpretations, *E* = *mc*^{2} teaches us
that properties hitherto regarded as distinct are actually the
same. For example, Eddington states that "it seems very probable that
mass and energy are two ways of measuring what is essentially the
same thing, in the same sense that the parallax and distance of a
star are two ways of expressing the same property of location" (1929,
p. 146). According to Eddington, the distinction between mass and
energy is artificial. We treat mass and energy as different
properties of physical systems because we routinely measure them
using different units. However, one can measure mass and energy using
the *same* units by choosing units in which
*c* =1, i.e., units in which distances are measured in
units of time (e.g., light-years). Once we do this, Eddington claims,
the distinction between mass and energy disappears.

Torretti (1983) argues along similar lines when he responds to the opposing view, which is held by a minority (e.g., Bunge, 1967; Sachs, 1981). This minority holds that the numerical equivalence of mass and energy is not sufficient to conclude that the two properties are the same. However, according to Torretti, "If a kitchen refrigerator can extract mass from a given jug of water and transfer it by heat radiation or convection to the kitchen wall behind it, a trenchant metaphysical distinction between the mass and the energy of matter does seem far fetched" (1983, p. 307, fn. 13). Like Eddington, Torretti points out mass and energy seem to be different properties because they are measured in different units. But the units of mass and energy are different only if one uses different units for space and time, which one need not do. For Torretti, the apparent difference between mass and energy is thus an illusion that arises from "the convenient but deceitful act of the mind by which we abstract time and space from nature" (1983, p. 307, fn. 13). Interpretations such as Torretti’s and Eddington’s draw no further ontological conclusions from mass-energy equivalence beyond the claim that the two properties are the same. For example, neither Eddington nor Torretti make any explicit claim concerning whether properties are best understood as universals, or whether one ought to be a realist about such properties.

Interpretations in the second group, such as Zahar’s (1984),
Einstein and Infeld’s (1938), and Russell’s (1915, 1948),
regard "mass" as a measure of the quantity of matter and "energy" as
a measure of the quantity of energy. Thus, these interpretations
regard "mass" and "energy" as the representatives, within physical
theory, of stuff in the world. According to these interpretations,
the philosophical lesson of *E* = *mc*^{2}
is that we should no longer regard the world as consisting of two
types of stuff: matter and energy. Instead, the world is composed of
only one type of fundamental stuff. For example, According to Zahar,
energy in pre-relativistic physics occupies a distinct "ontological
level" from matter primarily because the former is regarded as
dependent on the latter, but not *vice versa*. In relativistic
physics, however, Einstein’s famous equation shows that these
two ontological levels are in fact identical. According to Zahar,
Einstein showed "that ‘energy’ and ‘mass’
*could* be treated as two names for the same basic entity. The
stuff which appears to the senses as hard extended substance and the
quantity of energy which characterises a process are in fact one and
the same thing" (1989, p. 262). For Zahar, the apparent difference
between mass and energy arises from the contingent fact that our
senses perceive mass and energy differently. On this reading,
mass-energy equivalence has the metaphysical implication that what is
real, "is no longer the familiar hard substance but a new entity
which can be interchangeably called matter or energy" (1989,
p. 263). Thus, Zahar holds that the fundamental stuff of physics is a
sort of "I-know-not-what" that we can call either "mass" or
"energy."

Einstein and Infeld (1938) hold a slightly different version of this interpretation. They claim that mass-energy equivalence implies that we can no longer distinguish between "matter" and "the field". Einstein and Infeld (1938) argue that in pre-relativistic physics there are physical criteria for distinguishing matter and field since matter has mass but fields do not. Hence, there is a qualitative difference between matter and fields, and so it is reasonable to adopt an ontology containing both. However, the equivalence of mass and energy entails that "matter represents vast stores of energy and that energy represents matter" (1938, p. 242). Consequently, Einstein and Infeld argue, the distinction between matter and field is no longer a qualitative one in relativistic physics. Instead, it is merely a quantitative difference, since "matter is where the concentration of energy is great, field where the concentration of energy is small"(1938, p. 242). Thus, mass-energy equivalence entails that we should adopt an ontology consisting only of fields.

Among philosophers, Russell interprets mass-energy equivalence in a
similar fashion to Einstein and Infeld. According to Russell, "a unit
of matter tends more and more to be something like an electromagnetic
field filling all space, though having its intensity in a small
region" (1915, p. 121). In his later work, Russell continues to hold
this view. For example, in *Human Knowledge, Its Scope and
Limits*, he points out that "atoms" are merely small regions in
which there is a great deal of energy. Furthermore, these regions are
precisely the regions where one would have said, in pre-relativistic
physics, that there was matter. For Russell, these considerations
suggest that "mass is only a form of energy, and there is no reason
why matter should not be dissolved into other forms of energy. It is
energy, not matter, that is fundamental in physics" (1948,
p. 291). Russell is not claiming, as Zahar does, that there is one
unknown type of stuff that we can call either "mass" or
"energy". Instead, Russell is proposing that mass is
*reducible* to energy in the sense that the world consists
only of energy. Thus, for Russell, "mass" and "matter" are otiose in
modern physics. Several physicists have held a similar position,
though this view is less common now. For example, after a discussion
particle-antiparticle annihilation experiments in 1951, Wolfgang
Pauli states: "Taking the existence of all these transmutations into
account, what remains of the old idea of matter and of substance? The
answer is energy. This is the true substance, that which is
conserved; only the form in which it appears is changing" (1951,
p. 31).

Despite the marked difference in the ontological claims made by the two groups of interpretations, there is one significant similarity. All interpretations implicitly claim that mass-energy equivalence changes our knowledge concerning the extensions of the concepts "mass" and "energy". In pre-relativistic physics, the terms "mass" and "energy" had different extensions and intensions. Relativistic physics teaches us that the extension of the two terms is actually the same. This is analogous to the discovery that the referents of "the morning star" and "the evening star" are the same. We can push the analogy a bit further. Just as it is possible to verify empirically that the planet Venus is the referent of both "the morning star" and "the evening star," it is possible to verify empirically that the extensions of "mass" and "energy" are the same. (See Section 4, Experimental Verification of Mass-Energy Equivalence.) From this perspective, the various interpretations of mass-energy equivalence disagree only about what kinds of things the terms "mass" and "energy" designate.

Einstein first derived mass-energy equivalence from the principles
of SR in a small article titled "Does the Inertia of a Body Depend Upon
Its Energy Content?" (1905b). This derivation, along with others that
followed soon after (e.g., Plank (1906), Von Lau (1911)), uses
Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism. (See Subsection 3.1,
Derivations of *E* = *mc*^{2} that Use Maxwell’s Theory.)
However, as Einstein later observed (1935), mass-energy equivalence
is a result that should be independent of any theory that describes a
specific physical interaction. This is the main reason that led
physicists to search for "purely dynamical" derivations, i.e.,
derivations that invoke only mechanical concepts such as "energy" and
"momentum", and the principles that govern them. (See Subsection
3.2,
Purely Dynamical Derivations of *E* = *mc*^{2}.)

Einstein’s original derivation of mass-energy equivalence is the
best known in this group. Einstein begins with the following
thought-experiment: a body at rest (in some inertial frame) emits two
pulses of light of equal energy in opposite directions. Einstein then
analyzes this "act of emission" from another inertial frame, which is
in a state of uniform motion relative to the first. In this analysis,
Einstein uses Maxwell’s theory of electromagnetism to calculate
the physical properties of the light pulses (such as their intensity)
in the second inertial frame. By comparing the two descriptions of
the "act of emission", Einstein arrives at his celebrated result:
"the mass of a body is a measure of its energy-content; if the energy
changes by *L*, the mass changes in the same sense by
*L*/9 × 10^{20}, the energy being measured in
ergs, and the mass in grammes" (1905b, p. 71). A similar derivation
using the same thought experiment but appealing to the Doppler effect
was given by Langevin (1913) (see the discussion of *E* =
*mc*^{2} in Fox (1965)).

Some philosophers and historians of science claim that
Einstein’s first derivation is fallacious. For example, in
*The Concept of Mass*, Jammer says: "It is a curious incident
in the history of scientific thought that Einstein’s own
derivation of the formula *E* = *mc*^{2},
as published in his article in *Annalen der Physik*, was
basically fallacious. . . the result of a *petitio
principii*, the conclusion begging the question" (Jammer, 1961,
p. 177). According to Jammer, Einstein implicitly assumes what he is
trying to prove, viz., that if a body emits an amount of energy
*L*, its inertial mass will decrease by an amount
*m* =
*L*/*c*^{2}. Jammer also accuses Einstein of assuming
the expression for the relativistic kinetic energy of a body. If
Einstein made these assumptions, he would be guilty of begging the
question. Recently, however, Stachel and Torretti (1982) have shown
convincingly that Einstein’s (1905b) argument is sound. They note
that Einstein indeed derives the expression for the kinetic energy of
an "electron" (i.e., a structureless particle with a net charge) in his
earlier (1905a) paper. However, Einstein nowhere uses this expression
in the (1905b) derivation of mass-energy equivalence. Stachel and
Torretti also show that Einstein’s critics overlook two key moves
that are sufficient to make Einstein’s derivation sound, since one need
not assume that
*m* =
*L*/*c*^{2}.

Einstein’s further conclusion that "the mass of a body is a
measure of its energy content" (1905b, p. 71) does not, strictly
speaking, follow from his argument. As Torretti (1983) and other
philosophers and physicists have observed, Einstein’s (1905b)
argument allows for the possibility that once a body’s energy
store has been entirely used up (and subtracted from the mass using
the mass-energy equivalence relation) the remainder is not zero. In
other words, it is only an hypothesis in Einstein’s (1905b)
argument, and indeed in all derivations of *E* =
*mc*^{2} in SR, that no "exotic matter" exists that is
*not* convertible into energy (see Ehlers, Rindler, Penrose,
(1965) for a discussion of this point). However,
particle-antiparticle anihilation experiments in atomic physics,
which were first observed decades after 1905, strongly support
"Einstein’s dauntless extrapolation" (Torretti, 1983, p.
112).

Purely dynamical derivations of *E* =
*mc*^{2} typically proceed by analyzing an inelastic
collision from the point of view of two inertial frames in a state of
relative motion (the centre-of-mass frame, and an inertial frame
moving with a relative velocity *v*). One of the first papers
to appear following this approach is Perrin’s (1932). According
to Rindler and Penrose (1965), Perrin’s derivation was based
largely on Langevin’s "elegant" lectures, which were delivered
at the College de France in Zurich around 1922. Einstein himself gave
a purely dynamical derivation (Einstein, 1935), though he nowhere
mentions either Langevin or Perrin. The most comprehensive
derivation of this sort was given by Ehlers, Rindler and Penrose
(1965). More recently, a purely dynamical version of Einstein’s
original (1905b) thought experiment, where the particles that are
emitted are not photons, has been given by Mermin and Feigenbaum
(1990).

Derivations in this group are distinctive because they demonstrate
that mass-energy equivalence is a consequence of the changes to the
structure of spacetime brought about by SR. The relationship between
mass and energy is independent of Maxwell’s theory or any other
theory that describes a specific physical interaction.We can get a
glimpse of this by noting that to derive *E* =
*mc*^{2} by analyzing a collision, one must first
define relativistic momentum (**p**_{rel}) and
relativistic kinetic energy (*T*_{rel}), since one
cannot use the old Newtonian notions of momentum and kinetic
energy. In Einstein’s own purely dynamical derivation (1935),
more than half of the paper is devoted to finding the mathematical
expressions that define **p**_{rel} and
*T*_{rel}. This much work is required to arrive at
these expressions for two reasons. First, the changes to the
structure of spacetime must be incorporated into the definitions of
the relativistic quantities. Second, **p**_{rel}
and *T*_{rel} must be defined so that they reduce to
their Newtonian counterparts in the appropriate limit. This last
requirement ensures, in effect, that SR will inherit the empirical
success of Newtonian physics. Once the definitions of
**p**_{rel} and *T*_{rel} are
obtained, the derivation of mass-energy equivalence is
straight-forward. (For a more detailed discussion of Einstein’s
(1935), see Flores, (1998).)

Cockcroft and Walton (1932) are routinely credited with the first experimental verification of mass-energy equivalence. Einstein (1905b) had conjectured that the equivalence of mass and energy could be tested by "weighing" an atom before and after it undergoes radioactive decay. But there was no way of performing this experiment or another experiment that would directly confirm mass-energy equivalence at the time. Technological developments allowed Cockcroft and Walton to take a different approach. They studied the bombardment of a lithium atom (Li) by a proton (p), which produces two alpha particles (). This reaction is symbolized by the following equation:

In this reaction, there is a *decrease* in the total rest-mass
as the reaction proceeds from left to right: the total rest-mass of
proton and the Lithium atom is greater than the total rest-mass of
the two alpha particles. Furthermore, there is also an
*increase* in the total kinetic energy: the kinetic energy of
the proton is less than the total kinetic energy of the two alpha
particles. (One only considers the kinetic energy of the proton
because the Lithium atom is considered at rest, and hence has zero
kinetic energy.) Cockcroft and Walton were able to measure the
kinetic energies of the incident proton and the out-going alpha
particles very precisely. They found that the decrease in rest-mass
corresponds to the increase in kinetic energy according to
Einstein’s famous equation *E* =
*mc*^{2} (to an accuracy of better than 1%). Hence,
the total mass *and* energy of the entire system is
conserved.

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Francisco Flores

*First published: September 12, 2001*

*Content last modified: September 12, 2001*