Supplement to Thick Ethical Concepts

Additional Debates about Thick Concepts and Their Significance

1. Further Questions about the Significance of Thick Concepts

Section 2 of the main text focuses on three strands of argument concerning the broader philosophical significance of thick concepts. Beyond those arguments, there are further issues in both metaethics and normative ethics for which thick terms and concepts might be thought significant.

In metaethics, thick concepts might have implications for a range of metaphysical questions about ethics. Some of these concern truth and objectivity. If there couldn’t be a wholly non-evaluative expression that is necessarily coextensive with a thick term but utterances involving thick terms are sometimes true, does this mean that there are some irreducible evaluative facts? And even if we think that truth might instead be a minimal property, so that the truth of a claim doesn’t entail that there is a corresponding fact in any ontologically robust sense, we might still wonder whether utterances involving thick terms could be objectively true, in the sense of holding independently of even our best stances towards them. But as noted at the end of section 2.3 in the main text, it is controversial whether we can draw any significant conclusions about the nature of evaluative truths and their objectivity specifically from reflection on thick terms and concepts. Be that as it may, if thick concepts pick out robust properties with inseparable evaluative and non-evaluative aspects, then the supervenience claim that there can be no evaluative difference without a non-evaluative difference might be problematic: a difference in properties ascribed by thick concepts might not be traceable to a difference in non-evaluative properties (Dancy 1995: 278). And in the same event the claim that evaluative properties enter in their own right into causal explanations of non-evaluative goings-on would seem to be easier to defend. Claims such as “Honesty engenders trust” and “People are starving because of the selfishness of others” are commonplace, and seem to advance causal explanations. Conversely, the prospects for such “moral explanations” seem dimmer if the properties picked out by thick terms aren’t genuinely evaluative (Cline 2015).

Thick concepts have received less attention in normative ethics than in metaethics. Focus on good and bad, right and wrong, obligation and duty has been dominant in the consequentialist, deontological, and contractualist traditions in Western moral philosophy. But insofar as neglecting thick concepts leads to a simplistic or distorted picture of our first-order ethical thought, attention to them is required even in normative ethics (Anscombe 1958; Williams 1985). Concepts such as right and obligatory are so general and abstract that thicker terms may be required to give them more determinate content and enable us to figure out how to act. And since virtue and vice concepts are prominent among paradigmatic thick concepts, it may be no accident that urging greater attention to thick concepts tends to go with sympathy for virtue ethics. Rosalind Hursthouse, for example, argues that an action is right if and only if it is what a virtuous agent would characteristically do in the circumstances, where a virtuous agent is one who has and exercises the virtues (Hursthouse 1996: 20–2). To help the non-virtuous who may have little direct idea of what the virtuous person would do in the circumstances, helpful guidance for right action can be specified more concretely in terms of “virtue rules” which virtuous action will follow: “Do what is honest/charitable/etc/”; “Do not do what is selfish/cruel/inconsiderate/disloyal/etc.” (Hursthouse 1996: 26–7; cf. Annas 2016). Hursthouse claims that even toddlers can know what it takes to follow rules such as “Be kind to your brother”, and explicitly counts virtue terms as thick (1996: 27; see also Annas 2016). Claims like these seem again to require particular commitments regarding the nature of thick concepts. They don’t sit well with Thin Centralism; if thin concepts were conceptually and explanatorily prior to the thick, then the practical import rules couched in thick terms (“Don’t do what is disloyal”; “Do what is honest”) would seem to derive from that of bad or wrong. And if Separability were true, the action-guiding character of thick concepts would merely combine those of thin ethical concepts and non-evaluative concepts; thus a case for a genuinely distinctive normative role of thick concepts seems easiest to mount under Inseparability. Similar commitments may accrue to other proposals on the normative role of thick concepts, such as the idea that ethics requires traditions that are stable enough to deliver thick specifications of virtues and exemplars (MacIntyre 1984).

2. Three Further Inseparabilist Proposals

Section 3.2 of the main text covers only a simple proposal concerning what thick concepts might have in common with thin evaluative concepts according to Inseparabilists. At least three other Inseparabilist options have been noted. The first is due to Edward Harcourt and Alan Thomas. The property picked out by the concept red is a determinate of the determinable property picked out by the concept colored. Harcourt and Thomas suggest that the relation between a thick concept such as brutal and the thin concept pro tanto bad is analogous to the relation between red and colored (2013: 24–7). We cannot analyze red as a combination of being colored plus some feature other than redness, so the analogous proposal about thick concepts won’t collapse to Separability. It can explain how thick concepts are descriptive: being brutal is a specific way of being bad in the same way as being red is a specific way of being colored; in each case the determinate has more descriptive content than its determinable. The view can also explain how thick concepts get to be evaluative: since being brutal is a way of being pro tanto bad, brutal can derive its evaluative import (such as reasons to avoid and disapprove of brutal actions) from the evaluative import of pro tanto bad. This view needn’t commit Inseparabilists to Thin Centralism, since it isn’t clear that we can grasp colored without grasping at least some of its determinates; Thick Centralism and No Priority remain on the table. It is, however, unclear whether the thick-thin relation is sufficiently analogous to the determinate-determinable relation to be explained as an instance of it. The determinates of a determinable exclude each other: no colored thing can be both red and yellow (all over). But a pro tanto bad action can be both selfish and brutal. No color property is a determinate of both colored and some other determinable that isn’t a color property; but how do we settle whether cruel is a determinate of wrong or bad? Finally, many writers believe that thick concepts can vary in their evaluative valence across contexts (Blackburn 1992; Dancy 1995; Väyrynen 2011; Kyle 2013a). Rudeness, for instance, isn’t always bad, but may be evaluatively neutral or even called for, and it may be morally misguided but not necessarily confused to think that international terrorism merits focused brutality. But the instantiation of a determinate property necessitates the determinable property. Red things cannot but be colored. These features of the thick-thin relation seem to mark enough differences with the determinate-determinable relation to question Harcourt and Thomas’s analogy.

A second proposal is due to Debbie Roberts. On her view, a concept is evaluative when and because it ascribes an evaluative property (other writers reverse the explanation: a property is evaluative when and because it is ascribed by an evaluative concept; see Eklund 2013). For a concept to ascribe a property P is for the real definition of P to be given by the content of that concept. And a property P is evaluative if (i) P is intrinsically linked to human concerns and purposes; (ii) there are various lower-level properties, each of which can make it the case that P is instantiated but none of which is necessary for P to be instantiated; and (iii) these lower-level properties don’t necessitate the instantiation of P, rather some further features must also obtain. Roberts holds that both thick and thin concepts ascribe properties that satisfy (i)–(iii) (Roberts 2013b: 91–5). However, some non-evaluative properties seem to satisfy (i)–(iii) as well. Evolutionary fitness (organisms’ capacity to survive and reproduce in their environment) is intrinsically linked to human concerns and purposes, it can be instantiated by many different lower-level properties depending on what the organism’s environment happens to be, but its instantiation isn’t necessitated by these lower-level properties (all sorts of factors can interfere with capacities for survival and reproduction). But evolutionary fitness isn’t an evaluative property in the relevant sense. (The reply that (i) should be strengthened to “intrinsically linked to distinctively human concerns and purposes” would rule out too much.)

A third option is to take the idea that thick concepts are irreducibly thick to mean that they are evaluative “in their own right”. Instead of having evaluative and descriptive aspects, the meanings of thick terms and concepts have only a single element, and that element is both evaluative and descriptive. Thinking that an action is brutal is one thing, thinking that it is thereby bad in a certain way is another, and to think that an action is brutal is to evaluate it even if the claim has no negative valence (cf. Dancy 1995; Kirchin 2013a; Roberts 2013b). This view can account for the sense in which thick terms are descriptive by noting their non-evaluative entailments. The problem for it is explaining what it is for a concept to evaluate the things to which it applies without invoking the notion of valence. Nor is it clear what other putative “marks” of the evaluative would be exemplified by both thick and thin terms but not by non-evaluative terms. For instance, as we saw above, evaluative concepts are by no means alone in being intrinsically linked to human concerns and purposes. Similar worries can be raised about the further putative marks of the evaluative proposed by Roberts (2013b: 88–91).

3. Further Comparisons between Semantic and Pragmatic Views

Section 4 of the main text compares Semantic and Pragmatic Views on the location question mainly with respect to their explanations of the linguistic data, such as the projection and defeasibility behavior of the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances. A significant dimension of this debate is methodological. Even if we agree that factors such as theoretical parsimony and unity make an explanation better, comparisons of competing theories in terms of such factors are complex. For instance, linguists generally agree with a principle called “Grice”s Razor’: if a phenomenon can be explained and predicted in terms of independently motivated pragmatic principles, then it is theoretically more parsimonious to do so than to posit senses, semantic entailments, conventional implicatures, or the like, which cannot be so explained (Grice 1978: 47–8). Insofar as the evaluations normally conveyed by T-utterances can be explained pragmatically without treating them as semantic or conventional properties of thick terms, Grice’s Razor implies that the Pragmatic View is, other things being equal, preferable to its rivals (Väyrynen 2013: ch. 6). For example, the Semantic View defended by Brent Kyle (2013a) not only posits for each thick term separately that its meaning contains evaluation but in addition invokes two distinct pragmatic mechanisms to explain why those evaluations seem to project outside the scope of entailment-cancelling operators. However, the explanation given by the Pragmatic View seems to suppose that the evaluation that projects is the same evaluation when the embedding is a negation as when it is a question or a possibility modal. Is it obvious that the evaluation conveyed by a given thick term is the same in all relevant contexts? If not, the greater parsimony of the pragmatic explanation may be lost. So it is up for debate whether Grice’s Razor favors the Pragmatic View in this case. The appropriate methodology for assessing answers to the location question merits more discussion.

There are also other important comparisons to be made besides explaining the relevant linguistic data. The plausibility of the Pragmatic View depends on whether it can explain various further phenomena that have been thought to support the Semantic View. One such phenomenon is that even the maximal non-evaluative meanings of thick terms underdetermine their extensions. This could be explained if their extensions were determined in part by evaluation, as the Semantic View says (Elstein and Hurka 2009). However, it can also be explained in terms of more general factors that have nothing in particular to do with whether the term is semantically evaluative (Väyrynen 2013: ch. 7). The conventional meanings of many non-evaluative terms also underdetermine their extensions without input from particular contexts. What counts as painful for a context depends on whether not just the intensity of pain but also its duration is relevant to the topic at hand, and on how these are weighted. Different answers give different measures of painfulness. Similarly, what counts as selfish depends on whether the conversation concerns emotional selfishness, financial selfishness, or some aggregate of these multiple dimensions of selfishness, and different specifications of these non-evaluative parameters and their relative weights lead to different measures of selfishness.

Another phenomenon that might be thought to support the Semantic View relates to Shapelessness (section 2.2). If the extensions of thick terms aren’t unified under independently intelligible relations of non-evaluative similarity, you might infer that the truth-conditions of T-utterances must be partly evaluative. And one reason to accept Shapelessness is precisely that there seems to be no non-evaluative characterization that could unify all and only those things that fall under a given thick term. As Margaret Little puts it, we cannot specify what the various ways of being cruel—such as kicking a dog, teasing a sensitive person, and forgetting to invite someone to a party—have in common, and why the pain inflicted during a spinal tap doesn’t count as cruel, without helping ourselves to the evaluative concept cruel (Little 2000: 279; see also Sreenivasan 2001: 19; Kirchin 2010: 6; Roberts 2011: 506). However, the extension of a term T may in this way “outrun” characterizations that can be given in independently intelligible terms even if T is a non-evaluative term. It may not be possible to specify what all and only instances of pain across sentient beings have in common without helping ourselves to our concept pain. But in that case the Pragmatic View can say that analogously there may be no cruel-free way of characterizing the extension of cruel and yet say that when we help ourselves to cruel we aren’t helping ourselves to an evaluative concept. For if the Pragmatic View is true of cruel, then a classification that deploys cruel is itself a non-evaluative classification. So again a phenomenon that might have been thought to support the Semantic View can be explained even if the Semantic View is false, in terms of more general factors that have nothing in particular to do with whether the terms in question are semantically evaluative (Väyrynen 2013: 193–201; Väyrynen 2014). The resources cited here may also help explain why an outsider to an evaluative practice involving a thick term T who grasps only characterizations of its extension which can be given in T-free terms might not be able to track insiders’ application of T (Väyrynen 2013: ch. 6; see also Blackburn 2013).

4. Thick Terms and Pejoratives

Section 5 of the main text focuses on how thick terms and concepts differ from the thin. But a full delineation of the class of thick terms and concepts requires determining also how they relate to other sorts of evaluative terms. This will also matter to the broader methodological question of whether a theory of thick concepts is better insofar as it treats various sorts of evaluative terms in the same way or differently. The main text briefly addresses affective terms such as admirable and “respect-relative” evaluative predicates such as a good knife and good with children. These both count as thick by the intuitive characterization that thick terms and concepts somehow combine evaluation and non-evaluative description. But they also seem in some ways different from paradigmatic thick terms such as generous and cruel; the latter aren’t explicitly pegged to a particular attitude or to a completely independent non-evaluative kind in the way that the former are.

A potentially still more complicated case is that thick terms are sometimes said to be similar to slurs, such as kraut and wop, or other pejorative expressions, such as slut and jerk, which all seem also to involve both evaluation and description (Hare 1963; Blackburn 1992; Gibbard 1992; Boisvert 2008; Richard 2008). It is common to locate the derogatory content of slurs in their truth-conditions (Hom 2008) or conventional implicatures (Williamson 2009). A presuppositional account of both slurs and thick terms is proposed by Cepollaro and Stojanovic (2016). Pejoratives such as slut and jerk may be different from slurs (Hay 2013).

There are, however, enough differences in the linguistic behavior of slurs and thick terms to make us pause before calling for a unified treatment. One concerns their behavior in indirect reports:

  • (11) Pam believes/said that Madonna’s show is lewd. (But I think it isn’t bad in any way for being sexually explicit.)
  • (12) Pam believes/said that Hans is a kraut. (? I think Hans is a fine person.)

A speaker of (11) doesn’t convey a negative evaluation of sexual display, but a negative attitude seeps through the operator in (12). So even in indirect reports slurs create a kind of discomfort which thick terms one regards as objectionable don’t. (You can verify this by considering more explosive slurs than kraut.) Another difference concerns defeasibility. Compare example (6) from the main text with (13):

  • (6) Whether or not this is a good thing, Isolde can be truthfully and neutrally described as being chaste.
  • (13) # Whether or not it’s a bad thing, Hans can be truthfully and neutrally described as a kraut.

If differences such as these mean that the relationship between slurs and derogation is tighter than the relationship between thick terms and evaluation, then treating thick terms differently from slurs and other pejoratives won’t be a problem for any view (Väyrynen 2013: 149–56). Slurs may nonetheless turn out to be significantly similar to thick terms if slurs, too, are given a pragmatic account (Bolinger forthcoming). A further puzzle is how to understand terms which in their metaphorical application to people seem both to be pejorative and convey moral evaluation, such as pig and snake, as well as rude gestures that seem to express thick concepts, such as raising one’s middle finger (Zangwill 2013).

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Pekka Väyrynen <>

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