Notes to Ramsey and Intergenerational Welfare Economics

1. In a talk on 28 February 1925 before fellow Apostles (a secret mostly-undergraduate discussion society in Cambridge University, known to its fraternity as “The Society”), Ramsey had expressed a different viewpoint:

My picture of the world is drawn to perspective, and not like a model to scale. The foreground is occupied by human beings and the stars are as small as threepenny bits. I don’t really believe in astronomy, except as a complicated description of part of the course of human and possibly animal sensation. I apply my perspective not merely to space but also to time. In time the world will cool and everything will die; but that is a long time off still, and its present value at compound interest is almost nothing. Nor is the present less valuable because the future is blank. (Ramsey, 1931: 291).

Ramsey was speaking after dinner, behind closed doors, to his fraternity of Apostles. But as the talk predated his famous 1928 paper in the Economic Journal, one can’t tell whether he had changed his mind by the time he came to compose the paper, or whether he had just put on Sunday-best clothes for a journal publication (see also Arrow and Kurz, 1970: 12). Recently the economist Ken-Ichi Akao suggested an entirely convincing third explanation to me. Akao observed that in his talk to the Apostles, Ramsey was giving expression to his personal discount rate, whereas in his Economic Journal paper, concerned as he was there with social optimum saving, Ramsey was speaking of the public discount rate.

Copyright © 2019 by
Partha Dasgupta <pd10000@cam.ac.uk>

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