Notes to Ontological Commitment

1. See Van Inwagen (1998), who coined the term ‘meta-ontology’. Hofweber (2013) draws the border between ontology and meta-ontology somewhat differently.

2. Similar statements of the criterion occur in Quine (1951a: 11, 1951b: 67, 1953: 103, 1960: 242). Quine sometimes uses the slogan: “to be is to the value of a variable” (Quine 1948: 15). But the lack of explicit reference to a theory has the potential to mislead.

3. Quine's view as to exactly how names should be eliminated in favor of predicates evolved over the years. See Graff Fara (2011).

4. Michaels (2008: 46) writes: “the [existential] claims themselves are the ontological commitments”. But taking ontological commitment to be—not just be analyzed in terms of—an entailment relation to “claims” (or “statements” or “propositions”), in addition to disagreeing with common usage, fails to solve the problem of ontological neutrality; for claims, statements, propositions, and the like are no less controversial entities than kinds.

5. Perhaps the special case is all we need if we go on to say: a theory is ontologically committed to whatever the existential sentences that it logically entails are committed to.

6. Extensional interpretations of Quine's criterion were shown to be inadequate early on in Cartwright (1954) and Scheffler and Chomsky (1958). See also Parsons (1970).

7. Single quotes should be read as corner quotes where appropriate. For a similar metalinguistic version, compare Scheffler and Chomsky (1958: 79–81). Azzouni (2004: 50) explicitly takes Quine's criterion to be the metalinguistic version. Note that treating the metalinguistic criterion as a schema requires that all object language predicates are included in the metalanguage. If this is not the case, the criterion can be made explicitly linguistic by understanding “ontologically committed to Ks” as “ontologically committed to ‘K’”. Quine often took this tack of making problematic relations explicitly linguistic, for example, in the case of propositional attitudes; see Quine (1960: 211–216). Alternatively, one can say: T is ontologically committed to Ks iff T logically entails ‘∃x Pxfor some predicatePthat expresses the kind K. See Rayo (2007: 432), where something similar is called the “logical version” of Quine's criterion.

8. For an early, more general objection of the following sort, see Searle (1969: 109–110). Searle's argument, however, needs amending, as is done by Michael (2008: 48–50).

9. A narrower notion of explicit commitment would require that the existential sentence be a member of the theory, not just logically entailed by the theory. See Michael (2008: 46–7) and Peacock (2011: 87). But since theories can be taken (and often are taken) to be closed under logical entailment, this narrower notion has little independent interest.

10. Quine, however, appears to accept implicit ontological commitment in this second sense. See, e.g., Quine (1951b: 67).

11. This criterion is explicitly endorsed by Devitt (1980), Jackson (1989), and Peacock (2011).

12. Modal realism—sometimes called “concretism”—is presented and defended in Lewis 1986. Versions of ersatz modal realism—less contentiously called “abstractionism”—have been defended by Plantinga (1974), Adams (1974), and Stalnaker (1976). Armstrong's combinatorialism (1989) can be interpreted as an ersatzist account of worlds, though he prefers a fictionalist interpretation. For an overview, see Menzel (2013).

13. Compare what Rayo (2007: 432) calls “the metaphysical version of Quine's criterion”: a theory T is ontologically committed to Ks iff, for every world w, T is true at w only if Ks “are counted amongst the values of the variables”. Rayo appears in application to treat this as equivalent to the Modal Quantifier Criterion. But if the ‘only if’ is taken to be a material conditional, it is equivalent instead to a weaker modal entailment account: if numbers are in the domain of every world, then when ‘∃x Unicorn(x)’ is evaluated with respect to any world, numbers “are counted amongst the values of the variables”. The problem of irrelevant necessary existents has not been solved.

14. Switching from metaphysical to a priori entailment is defended in Michael (2008); see §2.3 below.

15. For a survey of relevant entailment relations, and a semantic treatment using impossible worlds, see Priest (2001).

16. Peacock (2011) defends modal entailment by invoking a distinction between explicit and implicit ontological commitment; see §2.2 below.

17. The empty domain objection to Quine's account is from Church (1958). Quine discusses quantification and the empty domain, and coins the phrase ‘inclusive logic’, in Quine (1966). For an overview of free logic and inclusive logic, see Bencivenga (1986).

18. Gottlieb (1974) argues that the possibility of substitutional quantification shows that Quine's criterion fails, at least for ordinary language.

19. Meinongianism comes in different flavors. A more radical Meinongian, including Meinong himself, would assert not only that “some things do not exist” but also that “some things are such that there are no such things”. Routley (1982), McGinn (2000), and Priest (2005) have defended versions of Meinongianism.

20. Qualification. In some cases of ontological reduction of Ks to K*s, we withhold application of the predicate ‘K’ to the K*s because not enough of what we ordinarily take to be true of the Ks is preserved by the reduction. In that case, we might choose to say that the ontological reduction eliminates ontological commitment to Ks. But this distinction between reductions that are and are not eliminative is essentially semantic; it relates to how we describe the ontology, not to the ontology itself. For discussion, see Hylton (2007: 245–50).

21. See especially Fine (2001, 2009). Cameron (2008) also holds that ontological commitment, if it is to play a role in the ontological enterprise, should be restricted to fundamental kinds. This leads him to endorse a truthmaker account of ontological commitment. Truthmaker accounts are discussed in §3 below.

22. Armstrong (1980: 443) writes: Quine gives to predicates

what has been said to be the privilege of the harlot: power without responsibility. The predicate is informative, it makes a vital contribution to telling us what is the case, the world is different if it is different, yet ontologically it is supposed not to commit us. Nice work: if you can get it.

Lewis (1983: 354) quotes this, and turns it back on Armstrong who allows that one predicate does not carry ontological commitment: the predicate of instantiation.

23. Rayo and Yablo (2001) argue that polyadic second-order quantifiers can be interpreted in an ontologically innocent way using “non-nominal” quantifiers such as ‘somehow’. See also Prior (1971: ch. 3) for an early discussion of non-nominal quantifiers and ontological commitment.

24. Boolos (1984: 449) writes:

neither the use of plurals nor the employment of second-order logic commits us to the existence of extra items beyond those to which we are already committed.

Arguments for the ontological innocence of plural quantification can be found in Lewis (1991: 65–9). Arguments against can be found in Resnik (1988) and Hazen (1993). See Linnebo (2013) for discussion.

25. There will also be a modal entailment criterion for commitment to particulars: A theory T is ontologically committed to a iff T necessarily implies that a exists iff, for every (metaphysically) possible world w, T is true at w only if a is in the domain of w. Note that, whereas in the criterion for commitment to kinds the necessity is de dicto (with respect to ‘K’), in the criterion for commitment to particulars, the necessity is de re.

26. For an account of counterfactuals with impossible antecedents that invokes impossible worlds, see Nolan (1997). For criticism of counterfactual accounts of ontological commitment, see Brogaard (2008: 30–1).

27. Whether “conceptually possible worlds” should be taken to be distinct from metaphysically possible worlds, or instead identified with metaphysically possible worlds (or centered worlds) but with a distinct notion of “truth at a world” (à la two-dimensional semantics), is here left wide open. For some background and discussion, see Jackson (1998: ch. 3) and Chalmers (2006).

28. A truthmaker account of ontological commitment is suggested by Armstrong (2004: 23): “To postulate certain truthmakers for certain truths is to admit those truthmakers to one's ontology.” A truthmaker account is developed and endorsed by Cameron (2008), rejected by Schaffer (2008), and further developed and defended by Cameron (2010). See also Heil (2003: 9) and Melia (2005: 72–8).

29. Lewis (2001) applies the truthmaker relation directly to non-linguistic propositions. Armstrong (2004: 12–6) takes the bearers of truth and ontological commitment to be intentional objects understood as properties instantiated, or only possibly instantiated, by concrete belief tokens; but it is unclear how this is to be squared with his naturalist convictions.

30. For a more complete overview of accounts of truthmaking, see McBride (2013: §1).

31. Truthmaker necessitarianism is the dominant view among truthmaker theorists. Armstrong (1997: 115–6) presents an argument for the view; see also Bigelow (1988: 126). Cameron (forthcoming) criticizes Armstrong's argument, but defends truthmaker necessitarianism from objections in Mellor (2003) and Heil (2003: 63).

32. This terminology will be adhered to from now on (roughly following Cameron (2010), who speaks of “real being”; for discussion of this and related notions, see Fine (2001)). A fuller account would need to make clear how this distinction relates to other distinctions that have been taken to have similar consequences for tallying ontological commitments such as the more familiar distinction between fundamental entities and derived entities, or the Meinongian distinction between entities that exist and entities that don't exist.

33. See Schaffer (2009) for an account of the ontological enterprise that focuses on the question—what kinds of entity are fundamental?—rather than—what kinds of entity exist?—an account he traces to Aristotle. Fine (1991) and Fine (2001) were especially influential in promoting a neo-Aristotelian account of ontology.

34. It cannot overgenerate relative to the modal entailment account (§2.2), since it is a strengthening of that account. But it can overgenerate relative to an a priori entailment account (§2.3), since, presumably, it may not be a priori knowable what the truthmakers of a theory are.

35. Note that a mereological nihilist does not escape the problem by holding that all commitment is to simples. The missing implicit commitments are just re-characterized as simples-arranged-trunkwise, or simples-arranged-malewise. The same problematic patterns of necessity and sufficiency hold at the level of simples.

36. If the entailment relation in question is an appropriately relevant relation, then, plausibly, T entails that a, or some Ks, really exist just in case a, or some Ks, are partial truthmakers for T. In that case, the above criteria can be seen as substituting partial truthmaking for truthmaking as a condition of ontological commitment.

37. For example, Quine writes:

Ordinary language is only loosely referential, and any ontological accounting makes sense only relative to an appropriate regimentation of language. The regimentation is not a matter of eliciting some latent but determinate content of ordinary language. It is a matter rather of freely creating an ontology-oriented language that can supplant ordinary language in serving some particular purposes that one has in mind. (Quine 1977: 168)

38. That objectual quantifiers must be ontologically committing can and has been denied. For example, Azzouni (2004: 55) holds that the view that objectual quantifiers are ontologically committing because they have a Tarskian domain semantics just presupposes that the metalinguistic quantifiers in terms of which the Tarskian semantics is given themselves are ontologically committing.

39. This portion of ordinary language will have to undergo some regimentation if it is to have the full expressive power of first-order logic: there will need to be indefinitely many pronouns to serve as bound variables and sufficient punctuation to disambiguate structure. But these resources, arguably, already belong to ordinary language, however stilted the resulting sentences. On the relation between first-order logic and ordinary language, see Van Inwagen (1998).

40. Schaffer (2009) is content to let the question—what exists?—be easy to answer. The hard question, which forms the heart of metaphysical inquiry, is: what grounds what?

41. Widely accepted examples of ontological reduction come from mathematics, such as the reduction of numbers, or ordered pairs, to sets. Indeed, Quine significantly calls the latter “a philosophical paradigm” (Quine 1960).

42. Van Inwagen, after giving a detailed account of Quine's method of paraphrase, concludes:

All ontological disputes in which the disputants do not accept Quine's strategy of ontological clarification are suspect. If Quine's rules for conducting an ontological dispute are not followed—so say those of us who are adherents of Quine's meta-ontology—it is almost certain that many untoward consequences of the disputed positions will be obscured by imprecision and wishful thinking. (Van Inwagen 1998: 31)

43. Should we trust her answer? An alternative method is to engage in an interpretative project, asking how we might best understand her theory. See Lewis (1990) and §1.6.3 above.

44. Yablo (1999), though no defender of the method of paraphrase, sees paraphrase in a somewhat different light: it is not that the original is indeterminate and needs to be replaced by something more precise, but that the original is metaphorical and needs to be replaced by something that expresses its literal content.

45. Whether an appropriate notion of “having the same truth conditions” can be worked out is controversial. See Hale (1996) for an attempt to do so; Potter and Smiley (2001) for critical discussion.

46. Why must these commitments to objects—whether directions or numbers—be commitments to abstract objects? See Rosen (1993: 168ff) for discussion.

47. Other views that, in virtue of their liberal criteria of ontological commitment, have affinities with the neo-Fregean account include full-blooded Platonism, a.k.a. maximalism (Balaguer 1998; Eklund 2006), pleonasticism (Schiffer 2003), and easy ontology (Thomasson 2008).

48. Carnap (1956: 42–3) writes:

I am essentially in agreement with [Quine's] view…. But, first, I wish to indicate a doubt concerning Quine's formulation … I would prefer not to use the word ‘ontology’ for the recognition of entities by the admission of variables. This use seems to me to be at least misleading; it might be understood as implying that the decision to use certain kinds of variable must be based on ontological, metaphysical convictions.

Notes to the Supplement

1. Counterpart theory was first presented in Lewis (1968). For an extended defense of the inconstancy of de re modality, see Lewis (1986: 248–63).

2. For this account of truthmaking for predications, see Lewis (2003). Lewis uses qua-names, such as ‘Socrates qua wise’, to create contexts in which Socrates is essentially wise. For discussion and critique, see Bricker (2014).

3. Armstrong apparently would not endorse this response; his central argument for states of affairs as truthmakers (Armstrong 1997: 115) requires that ‘a’ refer to the thin particular in ‘a is F’.

4. For an account of truthmaking that favors tropes over states of affairs, see Mulligan, Simons, and Smith (1984).

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