Richard Kilvington

First published Tue Aug 7, 2001; substantive revision Tue Dec 20, 2016

Richard Kilvington (ca. 1302–1361), Master of Arts and Doctor of Theology at Oxford, member of the household of Richard de Bury, then Archdeacon of London, and finally Dean of Saint Paul’s Cathedral in London. Along with Walter Burley and Thomas Bradwardine, he represented the first academic generation of the school of Oxford Calculators. Although he brought new ideas and methods into logic, natural philosophy, and theology, and influenced his contemporaries and followers, he has been little studied until recently.

1. Life and Works

Richard Kilvington (we know almost seventy different spellings of his name) was born at the beginning of the fourteenth century in the village of Kilvington, Yorkshire. He was the son of a priest from the diocese of York. He studied at Oxford, where he became Master of Arts (1324/25) then Doctor of Theology (ca. 1335) (for bibliographical details, see Kretzmann and Kretzmann 1990b, Jung-Palczewska 2000b). His academic career was followed by a diplomatic and an ecclesiastical one, working in the service of Edward III and taking part in diplomatic missions. His career culminated in his appointment as Dean of St. Paul’s Cathedral in London. Along with Richard Fitzralph, Kilvington was involved in the battle against the mendicant friars, an argument that continued almost until his death in 1361.

Other than a few sermons, all of Kilvington’s known works stem from his lectures at Oxford. None is written in the usual commentary fashion, following the order of books in the respective works of Aristotle. In accordance with the fourteenth-century Oxford practice, the number of topics discussed was reduced to certain central issues, which were fully developed with no more than ten questions in each set. The reduction in the range of topics is counterbalanced by deeper analysis in the questions chosen for treatment. Some of Kilvington’s questions cover fifteen folios, which in a modern edition yield about 120 pages. His philosophical works, the Sophismata and Quaestiones super De generatione et corruptione, composed before 1325, came from his lectures as a Bachelor of Arts; the Quaestiones super Physicam (1325/26) and Quaestiones super Libros Ethicorum (1326/32) date from his time as an Arts Master; after he advanced to the Faculty of Theology, he produced ten questions on Peter Lombard’s Sentences, composed before 1334. Of these works, only the Sophismata has been edited, translated, and studied in full (see Kretzmann and Kretzmann 1990a-b; for the titles of other questions and their manuscripts, see Jung-Palczewska 2000b).

2. Method in Science

Like many other English thinkers, Kilvington was a leader in three main disciplines: terminist logic, mathematical physics, and the new theology. Methods and insights developed in the first two disciplines were used in the third. The application of the terminist logic and the refutation of the Aristotelian prohibition against metabasis resulted in Kilvington’s broad use of logic and mathematics in all branches of scientific inquiry to emphasize certitude in knowledge and bring into play four types of measurement. The predominant form of measurement by limit, i.e., by the beginning and ending of successive or permanent things (incipit/desinit), by the first and last instants of the beginning and ending of continuous processes (de primo et ultimo instanti), and by the intrinsic and extrinsic limits of capacities of passive and active potencies (de maximo et minimo), does not appear to be straightforwardly mathematical, though it raises mathematical considerations insofar as it prescribes measure for natural processes. The second type of measurement, by latitude of forms, describes processes in which accidental forms or qualities are intensified or diminished in terms of the distribution of natural qualities such as heat or whiteness or moral qualities such as love, grace, sin, will, or desire. In his measurement of the intension and remission of forms, Kilvington is interested in determining how the highest degree of a quality can be introduced into a subject already possessing the same quality to a certain degree by undergoing an alteration, and consequently in establishing the possibility of a most intense or diminished degree of, e.g., heat and cold, or virtue and vice. The third type of measurement, the strictly mathematical, employs a new calculus of compounding ratios to measure speed in local motion or speed in the distribution of love. Finally, the fourth type of measurement describes a ‘rule’ permitting the comparison of infinities, treated as infinite sets containing infinite subsets, and determining which of them is equal, less, or greater.

Kilvington employs all types of measurement to describe events both real and imaginable. Having adopted Ockham’s ontological minimalism, Kilvington claims that absolutes, i.e., substances and qualities, are the only subjects that can be changed. Therefore, no term used to describe change, such as motion, time, latitude, and degree has any representation in reality. Thus, he contrasts things that are really distinct with things distinguishable only in reason, i.e., in the imagination. Imaginary cases are descriptions of hypothetical situations. The elements of the description and not the situation itself are, in fact, of primary concern for Kilvington. He is interested in the coherence of a theory that describes all imaginable cases and not in one that describes only observable phenomena; to be imaginable means to be possible, i.e., not to generate a contradiction. Everything imaginable must be logically possible within a natural framework. Therefore, although we can imagine a void and formulate rules of motion in it, we can only say that a void might have existed if created by God’s absolute power, though it does not actually exist anywhere in the universe.

There are four levels in Kilvington’s secundum imaginationem analyses. These levels may be classified according to their increasing abstraction and decreasing probability. On the first level, there are imaginary cases which are potentially observable and which might occur in nature, such as Socrates’ becoming white. On the second level are imaginary cases which cannot be observed, even though they belong to the natural order. These cases illustrate the necessary consequences of the application of rules properly describing natural phenomena—the best example being Earth’s rectilinear motion, which is caused by its desire to unite the center of gravity with its own center. On the third level are cases not observable but theoretically possible, such as reaching infinite speed in an instant. The fourth level concerns cases that are only theoretically possible. Kilvington uses the last two groups of imaginable, i.e., hypothetical cases to reveal inconsistencies in received theories, especially from Aristotle, demonstrating mathematically the paradoxes that arise from Aristotle’s laws of motion. If hypothetical cases do not involve contradiction, there is no reason to reject them or exclude them from the realm of speculation.

Kilvington’s secundum imaginationem analyses go together with his ceteris paribus method: he assumes that all circumstances in the case being considered are the same, and that only one factor, which changes during the process, causes changes in the results.

3. Logic

Kilvington’s Sophismata, written before 1325, is his only logical work. A sophisma or sophism is neither a standard paradox of disputation nor a sophistical argument but a statement the truth of which is in question. The first sophism Kilvington discusses typifies the basic structure: a statement of the sophism sentence followed by a case or hypothesis, arguments for and against the sophism sentence, the resolution of the sophism sentence and reply to the arguments on the opposing side, ending with an introduction to the next sophism sentence.

Kilvington’s sophisms are meant to be of logical interest, but they also pose important questions in physics or natural philosophy. In constructing his sophisms, Kilvington sometimes makes use of observable physical motion and at other times appeals to imaginable cases that have no reference to outside reality. Although the latter cases are impossible physically, they are theoretically possible, i.e., they do not involve a formal contradiction. At one point he writes:

Even though the hypothesis supposed there is impossible in fact…it is nevertheless possible per se; and for purposes of the sophism, that is enough.

[unde licet casus idem positus sit impossibilis de facto…tamen per se possibilis est; et hoc sufficit pro sophismate] (S29: 69; tr. Kretzmann and Kretzmann 1990b: 249).

The first eleven sophisms deal with the process of whitening, in which the motion of alteration is conceived as a successive entity extrinsically limited at its beginning and end. There is no first instant of alteration, claims Kilvington, but only a last instant before the alteration begins; likewise, there is no last instant of alteration, but only the first instant at which the final degree has been introduced. There is no minimum degree of whiteness or speed gained in motion, but rather smaller and smaller degrees ad infinitum down to zero, since the qualities change continuously. Integers are potentially infinite because one can always find a higher integer, but not actually infinite since there is no single infinite number. In Kilvington’s view, since any continuity—e.g., time, space, motion, heat, whiteness—is infinitely divisible, it can be spoken of quantitatively and measured in terms of infinite sets of integers. The subjects of sophisms 29–44 reveal Kilvington’s special interest in local motion with respect to causes, i.e., active and passive potencies, and effects, i.e., time, distance traversed, and speed in motion. He considers both uniform and difform motion caused by voluntary agents and points out the questionable measure of instantaneous speed through the comparison of speed in uniform and accelerated motion (see Kretzmann 1982)

The last four sophisms are ostensibly connected with epistemology and the logic of knowledge, i.e., sentences on knowing and doubting involving intentional contexts, such as S45: “You know this to be everything that is this”. The most interesting among them is S47, “You know that the king is seated”, where Kilvington calls some rules of obligational disputation into question (see Kretzmann and Kretzmann 1990: 330—47; d’Ors 1991). In the opinion of Stump, “what Kilvington has done in his work on S47, by his change in the rule for irrelevant propositions, is to shift the whole purpose of obligations” (Stump 1982: 332).

4. Natural Philosophy

Although, Kilvington does not enjoy the reputation in natural philosophy that he does in logic, recent research reveal that his questions on Aristotle’s De generatione et corruptione and Physics inspired Thomas Bradwardine’s theory of motion and his famous rule of velocities in motion (see Jung-[Palczewska] 2000b; Jung 2002a; 2002b). Both works stemmed from lectures Kilvington delivered in the Arts Faculty before 1328, i.e., before Bradwardine’s treatise On the Proportion or Proportions of Velocities in Motions.

Like most medieval natural philosophers, Kilvington accepts Aristotle’s general rules of motion:

  1. “everything that is moved is moved by another”; and
  2. “there cannot be a motion without an active capacity (virtus motiva) and a passive capacity (virtus resistiva)”, because without resistance, motion would not be temporal.

While accepting substance and quality as the only two absolute realities, Kilvington states that the reality of motion is limited to what is in motion: the places, qualities, and quantities it successively acquires. Consequently, he is more interested in measuring local motion in terms of the actions of the causes of motion, the distance traversed, and the time consumed, than in the intensity of speed. In his commentaries on De generatione et corruptione and the Physics, Kilvington tries to formulate the differences between generation, alteration, and augmentation; determine rules for actions that are causes of change; find rules for the division of different types of continua; and find a mathematically coherent rule of motion. He considers the problem of the motion of two angels with regard to its causes and effects in several ways: how is their power to be bounded if it is active or passive? Is it subject to weakening? Is it mutable or immutable? How do we determine the boundaries of an active potency if a body moves in a medium that is uniformly resistant or not uniformly resistant?

Kilvington’s discussion of the measure of motion with respect to causes, or what we would call his ‘dynamic’ analysis, has a physical aspect involving relations between forces and resistances, and a mathematical aspect, involving concepts of continuity and limits. The mathematical character of Kilvington’s theory can be seen in his use of two kinds of limit for continuous sequences: an intrinsic boundary (when an element is a member of the sequence of elements it bounds: maximum quod sic, minimum quod sic) and an extrinsic boundary (when an element which serves as a boundary stands outside the range of elements which it bounds: maximum quod non, minimum quod non). Although he did not formulate strict rules about the different types of division of continua, his ‘study cases’ reveal that he approved the following conditions for the existence of limits:

  1. There must be a range in which the capacity can act or be acted on, and another range in which it cannot act or be acted on; and
  2. The capacity should be capable of taking on a continuous range of values between zero and the value which serves as its boundary, and no other values.

According to Aristotle (Physics VIII), motion occurs only if the ratio of acting capacity (a force F) to passive capacity (a resistance R) is a ratio of major inequality, i.e., when it is greater than 1. Kilvington affirms that every excess of force over resistance suffices for motion; thus, whenever force is greater than resistance, there is motion. This assumes that force (an active capacity) is bounded by a minimum upon which it cannot act (minimum quod non), i.e., by the resistance that is equal to it. For a passive capacity of resistance, Kilvington accepts the minimum quod sic limit “with respect to circumstances”; he agrees with Aristotle and claims that to establish a passive limit for Socrates’ capacity of vision, we should point to the smallest thing he can see. However, it is not only that we cannot see a small thing, like a grain, but also a large one, such as a cathedral, if we are close to it. Therefore, passive capacity cannot be described by a minimum quod non limit in each case.

It seems that Kilvington’s belief in the potential power of mathematics also allowed him to formulate a new rule of motion. He agrees that the proper way of measuring the speed of motion is to describe its variations by a double ratio of force (F) and resistance (R) as defined by Euclid. Speed of motion thus varies arithmetically whereas the proportion of force to resistance determining these speeds varies geometrically. Thus, when the proportion of force to resistance is squared, the speed will be doubled. Kilvington is aware that the proper understanding of Euclid’s definition necessitates a new interpretation of Aristotle’s rules of motion and concludes that when he is talking about a power moving half of a mobile, Aristotle means precisely the subdouble ratio of F to R, but when he is talking about power moving a mobile twice as heavy, he means the square of the ratio of F to R. Kilvington’s function provided values of the ratio of F to R greater that 1:1 for any speed down to zero, since any root of a ratio greater that 1:1 is always a ratio greater that 1:1. He thereby avoids a serious weakness in Aristotle’s theory, which cannot explain the mathematical relationship of F to R in very slow motion.

Kilvington applies his new rule of motion to describe both natural and violent motion, such as the uniform and difform motions of mixed bodies and the motion of simple bodies both in a medium and in a vacuum. Reading Kilvington, we must keep in mind that temporal motion is possible only if there is some resistance playing the role of a virtus impeditiva. The simplest example is the violent and natural motion of a mixed body in a medium, when the acting power has to overcome the external resistance of the medium as well as the internal resistance of an element being moved away from its natural place. The local motion of a simple body in a medium is not problematic either, since it can be explained by its natural desire to attain the natural place determined by its heaviness or lightness and the external resistance. Nor does Kilvington have a problem with explaining the natural motion of a mixed body in a vacuum, which is caused by the relative levity and gravity of its elements. Since there is no external resistance in a void, only internal resistance can permit motion in time. Kilvington here seems to follow Ockham, who argued that if a void existed, it would be a place. Since place in the Aristotelian sense is something natural that has essential qualities, it determines the natural motion of elementary bodies and, moreover, their inclination to remain at rest in their natural place. Accordingly, one could imagine a void in four natural spheres, which although empty preserve the proper qualities characteristic of the natural places of earth, water, air, and fire. Hence, the temporal motion of a mixed body in such a void is the result of the natural inclination of heavy or light elements to move to their natural places. The heaviness and lightness play the roles of force and resistance, respectively. Although there would be no external resistance in a vacuum, the motion of a mixed body could occur without any difficulty.

Kilvington’s most perplexing explanation concerns temporal motion of a simple body in a vacuum. In the opinion of Averroes, a simple body such as a piece of earth has an elementary form, prime matter, and different quantitative parts because it can be divided into parts. Because form cannot resist matter, no resistance can come from its qualitative parts. But there can be resistance from its quantitative parts resisting one another. Kilvington maintains that the temporal motion of a simple body in a vacuum is made possible by the internal resistance that results when the peripheral parts of a simple body offer resistance to the central parts because each part is seeking the center. Such an internal resistance produces motion and does not impede it; nevertheless, it guarantees temporal motion. Consequently, if a vacuum existed, the natural motion of a simple body would be possible. Moreover, the speed of such a motion would be the fastest, since there is no resistance to be overcome.

In the dynamic aspect of motion, when the speed is proportional to the F to R ratio, one only determines its value in an instant. Like all later Calculators, Kilvington does not consider speed to be a quality, so there is no real, existential referent for instantaneous speed. Therefore, speed has to be measured by distances, latitudes of quality (formal distance), or quantities traversed, and such traversals take time unless the speed is infinite. In order to characterize changes in the speed of motion, one must analyze the problem of local motion in its kinematic aspect. Kilvington’s discussion of the measure of motion with respect to its effect concentrates on measuring motion by such quantities as distance traversed and time. His attempt to understand the effect of motion as caused by smaller and greater resistances brings him to a distinction, also made by Bradwardine, between the rarity and density of a medium, which causes motion to be fast or slow, and its extent, determining a longer or shorter time consumed in motion. Kilvington correctly recognizes that to measure the speed of a uniform motion that lasts some time, it is enough to establish relations between time and distance traversed. In his opinion, the same distances traversed in equal intervals of time characterize uniform motion. Accelerated motion is described by the same distance traversed in a shorter interval of time, and decelerated motion is characterized by the same distance traversed in a longer time. It is also possible to describe difform motion by, for example, unequal distances traversed in unequal intervals of time.

Although Kilvington never abandoned Aristotelian physics, he frequently goes beyond Aristotle’s theories in order to resolve the paradoxes resulting from his laws, creating the impression that behind the facade of Aristotelian principles and terms, Kilvington is an Ockhamist. Despite the fact that Kilvington never explicitly mentions Ockham, it is beyond doubt that he not only knew the opinions of the Venerable Inceptor but also accepted them as a natural way of understanding the works of the Philosopher.

5. Ethics

The third Aristotelian work on which Richard Kilvington commented during his regency in the Arts Faculty was the Nicomachean Ethics. The commentary on the second and tenth books of the Ethics takes a form of ten questions, which deal only with selected issues that were the subjects of Kilvington’s lectures at Oxford: e.g., creating and destroying moral virtue, free acts of volition, the behavior of honest people and the delight taken in their actions (or conversely, the punishment of those who act evilly), and questions concerning particular virtues such as courage, generosity, magnanimity, justice, and prudence. As Michałowska has shown, Kilvington uses terminist logic and mathematical physics to solve ethical problems (see Michałowska 2011, 2016). Michałowska also shows that, just as he did in his questions on the Physics, Kilvington follows Ockham’s minimalist ontology by treating ethical qualities—i.e., vices and virtues, cognition and wisdom, good and evil—as volition-like objects, calling them the res. Being real things and not merely mental concepts, they can be measured by addition, subtraction, and division into parts, for they undergo change via increase or decrease and so have varying degrees of intensity. Such changes—e.g., undergoing punishment for an evil act—cannot be instantaneous and must happen in time. Each change is the result of overcoming resistance by an acting power. In the case of moral acts, the changes do not produce any external effects but internal modification in terms of the intensity of virtues and vices. When a vice acts upon a virtue, it causes its continuous change, and so a man’s courage can vary in intensity. Virtues and vices are opposed in Kilvington’s physical theory, so it is impossible for a man to be vicious and virtuous at the same time, although it is possible for him to be generous at one time, miserly at another.

The increase or decrease of a moral quality is either an effect of the impact of the opposite quality (or a change in the degree of intensity of the same quality), or else the result of human external acts. For example, frequent generous actions towards others leads to an increase of generosity. Performing morally good actions intensifies the virtues, whereas the constant practice of evil diminishes them. Virtues and vices can be described in terms of different degrees of intensity, so one can say that a man can be more or less generous during his lifetime. And just like physical qualities, Kilvington states that the intensity of a moral quality has only an extrinsic limit, so that one cannot perfect one’s virtue infinitely.

Virtues and vices have absolute or relative character, and can be possessed absolutely (simpliciter) or in a certain respect (secundum quid). There are highest—i.e., most perfect—degrees of intensity of our moral virtues, but there are no absolutely greatest degrees, like Platonic ideas. In Kilvington’s opinion, a man is never absolutely generous or virtuous. The ultimate perfection, i.e., the highest degree of moral virtue, is the product of a man’s natural dispositions, socializations, and moral acts. But since people relevantly differ, each of us is virtuous in our own way. So too, the highest degree of moral virtue is unique in each of us. In Kilvington’s opinion, if a man is prudent in the highest degree, he must have all other virtues in the highest degree as well (see Michałowska 2011, 488–92).

For Kilvington, prudence is one of the primary virtues. It is a habit, which cooperates with right reason (recta ratio) in the process of making good or bad decisions. Even though Ockham is not mentioned by name, his theory of the relation between prudence and moral knowledge is present in Kilvington’s discussion. Ockham distinguishes two types of moral knowledge. The first, which concerns universal truths, is gained through learning; the second, which concerns particular statements and particular situations, is gained through experience. Prudence is understood in two ways: as knowledge about singular propositions and as universal practical knowledge. In his opinion, both types of prudence are gained only through experience, the former concerning singular statements and the latter universal practical statements. The former is properly called prudence, whereas the latter is commonly known as prudence. In Ockham’s view, the first kind of knowledge—i.e., of universal truths—must be distinguished from prudence concerning singular statements. The second type of knowledge, however, is the same as prudence, since it is also gained through experience (Quaestiones q.6, a.10). Kilvington identifies two kinds of moral knowledge. The first is called scientia necessaria, which is composed of general statements and refers to universal truth. The other is called scientia ad utrumlibet, which comprises particular statements. The scientia necessaria, achieved by means of deduction, is not sufficient to make good moral decisions and so it must be complemented by a reference to scientia ad utrumlibet, achieved by experience (see Michałowska 2016, 13). Gaining knowledge through experience is an indispensable part becoming prudent. Kilvington states that a man can err with regard to a moral choice even though he possesses certain and complete knowledge about universal moral truths; a skilled logician is not necessarily a moral person. To make good moral decisions, one needs a fully-developed prudence, which is the same as scientia ad utrumlibet. Kilvington claims that a man who possesses moral knowledge is not automatically prudent, but a prudent man is always wise (see Michałowska/Jung 2010, 109–111).

Good choices are possible only when the will is supported by prudence. The problem of free will and free choice is fully elaborated in Kilvington’s Ethics, where he presents his theory—what Michałowska calls a “dynamic voluntarism”. Kilvington distinguishes three types of human volitional acts: willing, nilling, and not-willing. Willing always wills, and can never be passive or in potency. Even when the will wants nothing (velle nihil), it is willing, and so it cannot rest and is always determined to an act of willing. Here Kilvington seems to be directly influenced by Scotus, who claims that the will cannot be suspended (Ord. I d.1). The will is absolutely free in its acts of willing, and the free will of volition is the primary principle in the genus of contingent propositions. Since the will is active all the time, it must decide between its three acts of volition (velle volitionem), nolition (velle nolitionem), or non-velle. With regard to its own internal acts, the will is absolutely free. With regard to its external acts, however, it chooses between wanting something (velle aliquid) and not wanting something (nolle aliquid). In these cases, the will is also absolutely free to make such a choice.

For Kilvington it is obvious that prudence plays an essential role in producing good moral acts. When the habit of prudence is not fully developed, the will is indecisive. Repeated good moral decisions makes it hesitate (non-velle) less, so that the agent is able to reach a decision in any context, whether affirmatively velle or negatively nolle. Supported by fully developed prudence, the will makes proper and good moral choices more easily or even effortlessly (see Michałowska 2016, 14). Kilvington, however, is of the opinion that most of us rarely make good moral decisions because we often remain in doubt, stuck in the state of non-velle.

6. Theology

In theology, Kilvington applied the new methods of terminist logic and mathematical physics to typical fourteenth-century topics such as human and divine love, fruition, human will and freedom, God’s absolute and ordained power, and divine knowledge of future contingents. Nothing is considered separately from the Creator; therefore, Kilvington relates each human action to God.

Kilvington accepts Scotus’s distinction (Ord. I, d. 44, q. u.) between the absolute and ordained power of God. The established order of nature is the result of God’s ordained power, but God can also act against this order by his absolute power:

God’s power is called ordained insofar as it is a principle for doing something in conformity with a right law with regard to the established order. God’s power is called absolute insofar as it exceeds God’s ordained power, because thanks to it he can act against the established order. The jurists commonly use the terms de facto and de iure, e.g., they say that a king can do de facto anything that is not in accord with ordained law.

Although Scotus never explicitly says that God’s ordained and absolute power can be considered separately, that is how Kilvington interprets him, as he proceeds to claim that

  1. God’s powers are intensively infinite simpliciter, and
  2. God’s absolute power is infinitely greater than, i.e., infinitely more powerful than, his ordained power, since it is only by his absolute power that God could have annihilated the world.

The world’s annihilation would not be less just than its continued existence, since God’s justice stems from his essence, which, like his power, is absolute and ordained. There are also actual, ‘dependent’ (secundum quid) infinities created by God, such as the intensively infinite capacity of the human soul to love, to experience joy, and to suffer.

Like Scotus, Kilvington is convinced that potentia dei absoluta is a power that really is or can be actualized by God. Miracles would be examples of God acting against the natural order. Individual situations also show that God can deviate from laws established in the natural order, reflecting God’s particular judgment. But in his Sentences commentary, there are also many places where Kilvington follows the Ockhamist conception of absolute power in terms of logical possibility, i.e., hypothetical situations that have never become actual. Nevertheless, Kilvington criticizes Ockham (Tractatus contra Benedictum III, 3) when he analyzes hypothetical, imaginary cases (potentia dei absoluta) ruled by logic alone, in which the only principle that must be followed is that of non-contradiction.

Kilvington’s theory of potentia dei absoluta et ordinata serves to underline the contingency of creation and the freedom of divine will. Here Kilvington abridges Scotus’s opinions (Lectura I, dist. 39) and reorders his arguments, taking into account only those most useful for his own theory. Kilvington formulates nine conclusions in order to ‘save the phenomena’ and emphasize God’s absolute freedom of choice. He claims that God’s knowledge, existence, and will are the same as God’s essence. However, with regard to God’s absolute knowledge, assertoric statements about the past and present and contingent statements about the future have the same certitude since they are absolutely necessary, whereas with regard to the God’s ordained knowledge, they have only ordained necessity. Everything revealed absolutely by God happens necessarily with absolute necessity, because otherwise he could make himself incapable of picking up a stick, and this is a contradiction. Everything revealed by God’s ordained power—e.g., articles of faith—depends on God’s will and could be changed. Once revealed, however, they would have ordained necessity, and so they would form a new law. Everything that does not depend on God’s free will comes with ordained necessity, but nothing that depends on God’s free choice is absolutely revealed by God’s ordained power. If something is revealed absolutely, it is absolutely credible, because such a revelation derives from ordained necessity. If something is revealed under conditions, it is certain only with regard to those conditions.

Kilvington’s affinity to Scotus may also be seen in his conception of future contingents. He is in agreement with Scotus (Lectura I, dist. 39, qq. 1–5) in saying that only an instant in time is present since only ‘now’ exists. Therefore, Aquinas’s analogy to God sitting at the center of a circle and being present with all time fails, whereas Scotus’s concept of a radius sweeping out the circumference of the circle is correct, since the entire circle does not exist all at once. Consequently, ‘now’ moves from past to future like a point on the circumference of a circle. Kilvington, like Scotus, also rejects the view that God knows future contingents via Ideas because Ideas necessarily represent what they represent, as in the sentence, “Socrates is Artus”, where it is said that Socrates is Artus. Although Kilvington does not explain his position clearly, it seems that he takes for granted Scotus’s explanation. Scotus says that perhaps Ideas could represent simple or complexes terms necessarily, although, as Chris Schabel puts it:

They could not represent contingent complexes (…), which we can call X. If God had the Idea only, eternally he would know only the part of a contradiction, and there would be no contingency. If He knew both parts, X and ~X , He would know contradictories to be true simultaneously. Second, since Ideas represent both futures that are possible but will not exist, and futures that are possible and will exist, one needs to posit a way to distinguish between what will exist and what will not exist. (Schabel 2000, 42)

Kilvington is also in agreement with Scotus when he says that secondary causes cannot originate any contingency because of the necessity in a chain of causes. Therefore, a contingency observed in the action of secondary causes must be routed to the first cause, which is God. To know contingents, God first has to choose one of two contrary statements, since otherwise, i.e., when God had an act of knowledge before his act of will, he would have had only necessary ordained knowledge about natural order, which he already established, and he would not know contingents. Consequently, God would have only partial knowledge about one side of a contradiction (i.e., he would know only one of two contradictory statements, e.g., “Antichrist will be” or “Antichrist will not be”), and his will would not be absolutely free. Therefore, contingency must be placed in God’s will and not in God’s intellect. Again following Scotus, Kilvington claims that at the same instant in which the divine will wills A, it is able not to will A. Like Ockham, Kilvington accepts Scotus’s synchronic contingency. Again, as Chris Schabel writes:

This is not to say that God’s determinate knowledge of the proposition makes that proposition about future contingents as determinately true as those about the past or present. For although in the latter there is determinate truth—even necessary truth—so that it is impossible for them to be false, with respect to future contingents God’s determinate knowledge is such that allows for enough indetermination that it is still in the power of their cause to do the opposite. In the whole process of divine willing and knowing there is no time involved and no discursive knowledge. (Schabel 2000, 45)

To save God’s absolute free will and at the same time to avoid the prospect of mutability in God’s decision-making, Kilvington asserts that by his absolute power God can make himself not to will A, while A is what God, by his ordained power, wills in that particular instant, and this happens in eternity. This argument proves that there is no change in God’s will. In the opinion of Kilvington, future contingent events are such because God knows that they are future contingent and not vice versa. God’s accepting (beneplacitum) will, with respect to future contingents, is naturally prior to God’s knowledge, because the following consequence is true, “God wants A to happen; therefore, God knows it will happen,” whereas this is false, “God knows it will happen (viz., that Socrates will sin); therefore, he wants him to sin”.

In Kilvington’s commentary on Sentences, the opinions of both Scotus and Ockham are much in evidence, as in Kilvington’s other works. However, while Scotus is often cited by name, Ockham remains in the background. Still, knowledge of both Scotus and Ockham is crucial to understanding Kilvington’s thought, as his own contributions are often the result of blending these two strands of fourteenth-century Franciscan theology. A good example is the concept of God’s absolute and ordained powers, which serves Kilvington to prove that unequal infinities are present not only in God but also in the created world.

6. Impact and Influence

Besides the particular topics he discussed, Kilvington’s extensive use of sophisma argumentation, his mathematization of ethics and theology, and his frequent use of hypothetical (secundum imaginationem) cases, place his thought in the mainstream of fourteenth-century English philosophy and theology. His teachings on logic were influential both in England and on the Continent. Richard Billingham, Roger Rosetus, William Heytesbury, Adam Wodeham, Richard Swineshead were among the English scholars who benefited from Kilvington’s Sophsimata. His Quaestiones super De generatione et corruptione was quoted by Richard Fitzralph, Adam Wodeham, and Blasius of Parma, and his Quaestiones super Physicam was familiar to the next generation of Oxford Calculators, John Dumbleton and Roger Swineshead (who also may have influenced Parisian masters such as Nicolas Oresme and John Buridan). But Thomas Bradwardine was perhaps the most famous student of Kilvington’s theory of motion. In his renowned treatise On the Ratios of Velocities in Motions, Bradwardine included most of Kilvington’s arguments for a new function describing the relation of motive power and resistance. Kilvington’s views on future contingents were discussed by masters at the University of Vienna in the first decade of the fifteenth century such as Nicholas of Dinkelsbühl, John Berwart of Villingen, Peter of Pulkau, and the Carmelite Arnold of Seehausen. His questions on the Ethics and the Sentences enjoyed a reputation not only in Oxford but also Paris and were frequently quoted by Adam Junior, John of Mirecourt, Johanes de Burgo, and Thomas of Krakow (see Jung-[Palczewska] 2000b).


Critical Edition and Translation

  • Kretzmann, Norman and Barbara Ensign Kretzmann (eds.) 1990a: The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington. New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Kretzmann, Norman and Barbara Ensign Kretzmann (eds.) 1990b: The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington: Introduction, Translation, and Commentary, New York: Cambridge University Press.
  • Podkoński, Robert (ed.) 2007: ‘Utrum continuum sit divisibile in infinitum’, Mediaevalia Philosophica Polonorum 36(2), pp. 123–75.
  • Michałowska, Monika (ed.) 2016, Quaestiones super libros Ethicorum. Leiden/Boston: Brill.
  • Jung, Elżbieta 2014 Arystoteles na nowo odczytany. Ryszarda Kilvingtona „Kwestie o ruchu” [Rereading of Aristotle. Richard Kilvington’s “Queastions on motion”], Introduction, Translation into Polish, Łódź: University of Łódź Press.

Secondary Literature

  • Bottin, Francesco, 1973a, ‘Analisi linguistica e fisica Aristotelica nei “Sophysmata” di Ricardi Kilmyngton’, in C. Giacon (ed.), Filosofia e Politica, et altri sagii, Padua, pp. 125–45.
  • –––, 1973b, ‘L’Opinio de Insolubilibus di Richard Kilmyngon’, Rivista critica di Storia della Filosofia 28, pp. 409–22.
  • –––, 1974, ‘Un testo fondamentale nell’ambito della “nuova fisica” di Oxford: I Sophismata di Richard Kilmington’, Miscellanea Medievalia 9, pp. 201–205.
  • Courtenay, William J., 1990, Capacity and Volition. A History of the Distinction of Absolute and Ordained Power, Bergamo, Italy: Pierluigi Lubrina.
  • Dumont, Stephen D., 1995, ‘The Origin of Scotus’s Theory of Synchronic Contingency’, The Modern Schoolman 72, pp. 149–67.
  • Jung-[Palczewska], Elżbieta, 1997, ‘Motion in a Vacuum and in a Plenum in Richard Kilvington’s Question: Utrum aliquod corpus simplex posset moveri aeque velociter in vacuo et in pleno from the “Commentary on the Physics”’, Miscellanea Medievalia 25, pp. 179–93.
  • –––, 2000a, ‘The Concept of Time in Richard Kilvington’, in L. Cova and G. Alliney (eds.), Tempus, Aevum, Eternity. La Conzettualizzazione del tempo nel Pensiero Tardomiedievale, Firenze: Leo S. Olschki, pp. 141–67.
  • –––, 2000b, ‘Works by Richard Kilvington’, Archives d’Histoire Doctrinale et Littéraire du Moyen Age, 67, pp. 181–223.
  • –––, 2002a, Między filozofią przyrody i nowożytnym przyrodoznawstwem. Ryszard Kilvington i fizyka matematyczna w średniowieczu (Between Philosophy of Nature and Science. Richard Kilvington and Mathematical Physics in the Middle Ages), Łódź: University of Łódź.
  • –––, 2002b, ‘Richard Kilvington on Local Motion’, in P. Bakker (ed.), Chemins de la pensée médiévale. Etudes offertes a Zénon Kaluza, Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 113–33.
  • Jung, Elżbieta and Podkoński, Robert, 2008, ‘Richard Kilvington on Proportions’, in J. Biard, S. Rommevaux (eds.), Mathématiques et théorie du mouvement XIVe-XVIe siècle, Villeneuve d’Ascq: Presses Universitaires du Septentrion, pp. 80–101.
  • –––, 2009, ‘Richard Kilvington on continuity’, in C. Grellard and A. Robert (eds.), Atomism in Late Medieval Philosophy and Theology, Leiden-Boston: Brill, pp. 65–84.
  • –––, 2009, ‘The Transmission of English Ideas in the Fourteenth Century—the Case of Richard Kilvington’, Mediaevalia Philosophica Polonorum 37(3), pp. 59–69.
  • Katz, Bernard, D., 1996, ‘On a Sophisma of Richard Kilvington and a Problem of Analysis’, Medieval Philosophy and Theology 5, pp. 31–38.
  • Knuutila, Simo and Lehtinen, Anja Inkeri, 1979, ‘Plato in infinitum remisse incipit esse albus: New texts on the Late Medieval Discussion on the Concept of Infinity in Sophismata Literature’, in E. Saarinen, R. Hilpinen, I. Niiniluoto, and M. B. P. Hintikka (eds.), Essays in Honor of Jaakko Hintikka, Dordrecht: D. Reidel, pp. 309–329.
  • Kretzmann, Norman, 1977, ‘Socrates is Whiter than Plato Begins to be White’, Noûs 11, pp. 3–15.
  • –––, 1982, ‘Richard Kilvington and the Logic of Instantaneous Speed’, in A. Maierù and A. Paravicini-Bagliani (eds.), Studi sul secolo in memoria di Annelise Maier (Edizioni di Storia e Letteratura), Rome.
  • –––, 1988, ‘“Tu scis hoc esse omne quod est hoc“: Richard Kilvington and the Logic of Knowledge’, in N. Kretzman (ed.), Meaning and Inference in Medieval Philosophy, Dordrecht: Kluwer, pp. 225–45.
  • Michałowska, Monika, 2008, ‘Jak być sprawiedliwym? Ryszarda Kilvingtona komentarz do Etyki Arystotelesa [What Does It Mean To Be Just? Richard Kilivngton’s Commentary on Aristotle’s Ethics]’, Roczniki Filozoficzne 56(2), pp. 117–29.
  • –––, 2009, ‘Kilvington’s Concept of Prudence in the Questions on Ethics’, Mediaevalia Philosophica Polonorum 37(3), pp. 85–94.
  • –––, 2010, ‘Czy mądry jest roztropny? Roztropność i wiedza moralna wobec działań woli w komentarzu do Etyki nikomachejskiej Ryszarda Kilvingtona [Is Prudence Always Wise? The Role of Prudence and Moral Knowledge in Acts of Will in Richard Kilvington’s Commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics]’, Przegląd Tomistyczny 16, pp. 1–17
  • ––– 2010, ‘Czy mądry jest roztropny? Roztropność i wiedza moralna wobec działań woli w komentarzu do Etyki nikomachejskiej Ryszarda Kilvingtona [Is Prudence Always Wise? The Role of Prudence and Moral Knowledge in Acts of Will in Richard Kilvington’s Commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics]’, Przegląd Tomistyczny 16, pp. 1–17.
  • ––– 2011, ‘Kilvington’s Use of Physical and Logical Arguments in Ethical Dilemmas’, Documenti e Studi sulla Tradizione Filosofie Medievale XXII, pp. 464–492.
  • d’Ors, A., 1991, ‘“Tu scis regem sedere” Kilvington S47, 4’8, Anuario Filosofico 24, pp. 49–74.
  • Podkoński, Robert, 2009, ‘A Charm of Puzzles. The Fate of Richard Kilvington’s Philosophical Ideas’ Organon 41, pp. 139–150.
  • –––2016, Ryszard Kilvington, nieskończoność i geometria, , Łódź: University of Łódź.
  • Schabel, Chris, 2000, Theology at Paris 1316–1345. Peter Auriol and the Problem of Divine Foreknowledge and Future Contingents, Aldershot: Ashgate.
  • Stump, Eleonore, 1982, ‘Obligations: From the Beginning to the Early Fourteenth Century’, in in N. Kretzmann, J. Pinborg, and A. Kenny (eds.), The Cambridge History of Later Medieval Philosophy, New York: Cambridge University Press, pp. 315–34.
  • Randi, Eugenio, 1987, ‘A Scotist Way of Distinguishing Between God’s Absolute and Ordained Powers’, in A. Hudson and M. Wilks (eds.), From Ockham to Wyclif, Oxford, pp. 43–50.
  • Veldhuis, Henri, 2000, ‘Ordained and Absolute Power in Scotus’ Ordinatio I 44’, Vivarium 38(2): 222–230.
  • Wolter, Allan, B., 1990, ‘Scotus’ Paris Lectures on God’s Knowledge of Future Events’, in A. B. Wolter and M. M. Adams (eds.), The Philosophical Theology of John Duns Scotus, Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press.

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