James of Viterbo
James of Viterbo (c. 1255–1308) is one of a number of highly significant theologians who were active in the last quarter of the thirteenth century, alongside Godfrey of Fontaines, Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome, three authors whose views he constantly discusses and with whom he often disagrees. Though decidedly influenced by the work and outlook of St. Augustine, James was very much an independent thinker, whose originality was fuelled by his attentive reading of the Greek and Arabic commentators on Aristotle. On several issues, such as cognition, the love of self over God, the relation between the spiritual and temporal powers, James held strikingly original and often controversial positions.
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James was born in Viterbo around 1255. Nothing is known about the early years of his life. It is presumed that he joined the order of the Hermits of St. Augustine somewhere around 1272. He is first mentioned in 1283 in the capitular acts of the Roman province of his order as a recently appointed lecturer (lector) in the Augustinian Convent of Viterbo. This means that he must have spent the previous five years (i.e., 1278–83) in Paris, as the Augustinian order required its lecturers to be trained in theology in that city for a period not exceeding five years. James returned to Paris not long after his appointment in Viterbo, for he is mentioned again in the capitular acts in 1288, this time as baccalaureus parisiensis, i.e., as holding a bachelor of theology degree from the University of Paris. After completing his course of studies, James was appointed Master of Theology in 1292 (Wippel 1974) or 1293 (Ypma 1974), teaching in Paris for the next seven years. His output during that time was considerable. All of his works in speculative theology and metaphysics date from the Parisian period. In 1299–1300, he was named definitor (i.e., member of the governing council) of the Roman province by the general chapter of his order, and in May of 1300 he became regent master of the order’s studium generale in Naples. These would be the last two years of his academic career, however, for in September 1302 he was named Archbishop of Benevento by Pope Boniface VIII, possibly in gratitude for the support James had shown for the papal cause in his great treatise, De regimine christiano (On Christian Rulership). In December of the same year, at the request of the Angevin King, Charles II, he was transferred to the Archbishopric of Naples. He remained in Naples until his death, in 1307 or 1308.
James wrote the bulk of his philosophically relevant work while in Paris. Nothing remains of his early production in that city. His commentary on Peter Lombard’s Sentences has been lost, although still extant is a so-called Abbreviatio in I Sententiarum Aegidii Romani (Summary of the First Book of the Sentences of Giles of Rome), which recent scholarship suggests might be James’ preparatory notes for lectures on the Sentences rather than a summary of Giles’ commentary to the same (Tavolaro 2018), although it is unclear whether these notes were prepared during James’ student years in Paris or whether they date from his later teaching in Naples. Also lost are a treatise on the animation of the heavens (De animatione caelorum), as well as a commentary on Aristotle’s Metaphysics (Expositio primae philosophiae), two works to which James refers explicitly in his Quodlibets and which Ypma surmises must have been written during James’ four-year residency as a “formed bachelor”, i.e., between 1288 and 1292 (Ypma 1975).
James’ most significant works written while in Paris are his four quodlibetal questions and thirty-four disputed questions on the categories as they pertain to divine matters (Quaestiones de praedicamentis in divinis), although five of them have actually nothing to do with theology or the categories, as they deal with the human will and the habits (see Ypma 1975 for a possible explanation regarding their inclusion in the Quaestiones). These two works constitute the most important sources for our knowledge of James’ philosophical thought.
In Naples, James wrote the work for which he is arguably best known (Gutiérrez 1939: 61–2), the De regimine christiano, an important work in the history of late medieval political thought, and the only philosophical work he wrote in the last eight or so years of his life.
James is not the author of two works that have been regularly attributed to him by scholars, the De perfectione specierum (Ypma 1974, Tavolaro 2014), and the Quaestiones septem de verbo (Seven Disputed Questions on the Divine Word) (Guttiérez 1939, Scanzillo 1972, Ypma 1975). The author of the De perfectione specierum is James of Saint Martin (Maier 1943), or James of Naples, as he is referred to in the manuscripts, an Augustinian Hermit who was active in the late fourteenth century; and the author of the Quaestiones septem de verbo, as Stephen Dumont has recently shown (Dumont 2018b), was James’ confrère and near-successor at the head of the Augustinian school in Paris, Henry of Friemar.
The following table provides the list of James’ authentic works with approximate dates of composition. Single asterisks mark those which have been fully edited; double asterisks indicate those for which there exist only partial editions:
- Lectura super IV libros Sententiarum (1286–1288)
- Quaestiones Parisius disputatae De praedicamentis in divinis** (1293–1295)
- Quaestio de animatione caelorum (1293–1296)
- Expositio primae philosophiae (1293–1295)
- Quodlibeta quattuor* (1293–1298)
- Abbreviatio In Sententiarum Aegidii Romani** (1286–1288 or 1300–1302)
- De regimine christiano* (1302)
- Summa de peccatorum distinctione** (1300–1308)
- Sermones diversarum rerum** (1303–1308)
- Concordantia psalmorum David (1302–1308)
- De confessione (1302–1308)
- De episcopali officio* (1302–1308)
Like many of his contemporaries, James devotes serious attention to determining the status of theology as a science and to specifying its object, or rather, as the scholastics say, its subject. In Quodlibet III, q. 1, he asks whether theology is principally a practical or a speculative science. Unsurprisingly, perhaps, for an Augustinian, James responds that the end of theology resides principally not in the knowledge but in the love of God. The love of God, informed by grace, is what distinguishes the way in which Christians worship God from the way in which pagans worship their deities. For philosophers—James has Cicero in mind—religion is a species of justice; worship is owed to God as a sign of submission. For the Christian, by contrast, there can be no worship without an internal affection of the soul, i.e., without love. James allows that there is some recognition of this fact in Book X of the Nicomachean Ethics, for the happy man would not be “most beloved of God,” as Aristotle claims he is, if he did not love God by making him the object of his theorizing. In this sense, it can be said that philosophy as well sees its end as the love of God as its principal subject. But there is a difference, James contends, in the manner in which a science based on natural reason aims for the love of God and the manner in which sacred science does so: sacred science tends to the love of God more perfectly. One way in which James illustrates the difference between both approaches is by contrasting the ways in which God is the “highest” object for metaphysics and for theology. The proper subject of metaphysics is being, not God, although God is the highest being. Theology, on the other hand, views God as its subject and considers being in relation to God. Thus, James concludes, “theology is called divine or of God in a much more excellent and principal way than metaphysics, for metaphysics considers God only in relation to common being, whereas theology considers common being in relation to God” (Quodl. III, q. 1, p. 20, 370–374). Another way in which James illustrates the difference between natural theology and sacred science is by means of the distinction between the love of desire (amor concupiscientiae) and the love of friendship (amor amicitiae) to which I will return in section 7.3. James defines the love of desire as “the love of some good which we want for ourselves or for others,” and the love of friendship as “the love of someone for their own sake.” The love of God philosophers have in mind, James contends, is the love of desire; it cannot, by the philosophers’ own admission, be the love of friendship, for according to the Magna Moralia, friendship involves a form of community or sharing between the friends that cannot possibly obtain between mere mortals and the gods. Now although James concedes that a “community of life” between God and man cannot be achieved by natural means, it is attainable through the gift of grace. The particular friendship grace affords is called charity and it is to the conferring of charity that sacred scripture is principally ordered.
Like all scholastics since the early thirteenth century, James subscribes to the distinction between God’s ordained power, according to which “God can only do what he preordained he would do according to wisdom and will” (Quodl. I, q. 2, p. 17, 35–37) and his absolute power, according to which he can do whatever is “doable,” i.e., whatever does not imply a contradiction. Problems concerning what God can or cannot do arise only in the latter case. James considers several questions: can God add an infinite number of created species to the species already in existence (Quodl. I, q. 2)? Can he make matter exist without form (Quodl. IV, q. 1)? Can he make an accident subsist without a substrate (Quodl. II, q. 1)? Can he create the seminal reason of a rational soul in matter (Quodl. III, q. 10)? In response to the first question, James explains, following Giles of Rome but against the opinion of Godfrey of Fontaines and Henry of Ghent, that God can by his absolute power add an infinite number of created species ad superius, in the ascending order of perfection, if not in actuality, then at least in potency. God cannot, however, add even one additional species of reality ad inferius, between prime matter and pure nothingness, not because this exceeds his power but because prime matter is contiguous to nothingness and leaves, so to speak, no room for God to exercise his power (Côté 2009). James is more hesitant about the second question. He is sympathetic both to the arguments of those who deny that God can make matter subsist independently of form and to the arguments of those who claim he can. Both positions can reasonably be held, because each argues from a different (and valid) perspective. Proponents of the first position argue from the point of view of reason: because they rightly believe that God cannot make what implies a contradiction, and because they believe (rightly or wrongly) that making matter exist without form does involve a contradiction, they conclude that God cannot make matter exist without form. Proponents of the second group argue from the perspective of God’s omnipotence which transcends human reason: because they rightly assume that God’s power exceeds human comprehension, they conclude (rightly or wrongly) that making matter exist without form is among those things exceeding human comprehension that God can make come to pass.
Another question James considers is whether God can make an accident subsist without a subject or substrate. The question arises only with respect to what he calls “absolute accidents,” namely quantity and quality, as opposed to relational accidents—the remaining categories of accident. God clearly cannot make relational accidents exist without a subject in which they inhere, for this would entail a contradiction. This is so because relations for James, as we will see in section 3.3 below, are modes, not things. What about absolute accidents? As a Catholic theologian, James is committed to the view that some quantities and qualities can subsist without a subject, for instance extension and color, a view for which he attempts to provide a philosophical justification. His position, in a nutshell, is that accidents are capable of existing independently if they are thing-like (dicunt rem). Numbers, place (locus), and time are not thing-like and are thus not capable of independent existence; extension, however, is and so can be made to exist without a subject. The same reasoning applies to quality. This is somewhat surprising, for according to the traditional account of the Eucharist, whereas extension may exist without a subject, the qualities, color, odor, texture, necessarily cannot; they inhere in the extension. James, however, holds that just as God can make thing-like quantities to exist without a subject, so too must he be able to make a thing-like quality exist without the subject in which it inheres. Just which qualities are capable of existing without a subject is determined by whether or not they are “modes of being,” i.e., by whether or not they are relational. This seems to be the case with health and shape: health is a proportion of the humors, and so, relational; likewise, shape is related to parts of quantity, without which, therefore, it cannot exist. Colors and weight, by contrast, are non-relational, according to James, and are thus in principle capable of being made to exist without a subject.
The fourth question James considers in relation to God’s omnipotence raises the interesting problem of whether the rational soul can come from matter. James proceeds carefully, claiming not to provide a definitive solution but merely to investigate the issue (non determinando sed investigando). The upshot of the investigation is that although there are many good reasons (the soul’s immortality, its spirituality and its per se existence) to say that God cannot produce the seminal reason of the rational soul in matter, in the end, James decides, with the help of Augustine, that such a possibility must be open to God. Thus, it is true in the order which God has de facto instituted, that the soul’s incorruptibility is repugnant to matter, but this is not so in absolute terms: if God can miraculously cause something to come to existence through generation and confer immortality upon it (James is presumably thinking of Christ), then he can make it come to pass that souls are produced through generation without being subject to corruption. Likewise, although it appears inconceivable that something material could generate something endowed with per se existence, it is not impossible absolutely speaking: if God can confer separate existence upon an accident—despite the fact that accidents naturally inhere in their substrates—then, in like manner, he can confer separate existence upon a soul, although it has a seminal reason in matter.
The scholastics held that because God is the creative cause of all natural beings, he must possess the ideas corresponding to each of his creatures. But because God is eternal and is not subject to change, the ideas must be eternally present in him, although creatures exist for only a finite period of time. This doctrine of course raised many difficulties, which each author addressed with varying degrees of success. One difficulty had to do with reconciling the multiplicity of ideas with God’s unity: since there are many species of being, there must be a corresponding number of ideas; but God is one and, hence, cannot contain any multiplicity. Another, directly related, difficulty had to do with the ontological status of ideas: do ideas have any reality apart from God? If one denied them any kind of reality, it was hard to see how they could function as exemplar causes of things; but to assign too much reality to them was to run the risk of introducing multiplicity in God and undermining the ex nihilo character of creation.
One influential solution to these difficulties was provided by Thomas Aquinas, who argued that divine ideas are nothing else but the diverse ways in which God’s essence is capable of being imitated, so that God knows the ideas of things by knowing his essence. Ideas are not distinct from God’s essence, though they are distinct from the essences of the things God creates (De veritate, q. 2, a. 3).
One can discern two answers to the problem of divine ideas in the works of James of Viterbo. At an early stage of his career, in the Abbreviatio in Sententiarum Aegidii Romani—assuming one accepts, as seems reasonable, the early dating suggested by Ypma (1975)—James defends a position that is almost identical to that of Thomas Aquinas (Giustiniani 1979). In his Quodlibeta, however, he defends a position that is closer to that of Henry of Ghent. In the following I will sketch James’ position in the Quodlibeta as it provides the most mature statement of his views. For detailed discussions, see Gossiaux (2007) and Côté (2018).
Although James agreed with the notion that ideas are to be viewed as the differing ways in which God can be imitated, he did not think that one could make sense of the claim that God knows other things by cognizing his own essence unless one supposed that the essences of those things preexist in some way (aliquo modo) in God. James’ solution is to distinguish two ways in which ideas are in God’s intellect. They are in God’s intellect, firstly, as identical with it, and, secondly, as distinct from it. The first mode of being is necessary as a means of acknowledging God’s unity; but the second mode of being is just as necessary, for, as James puts it (Quodl. I, q. 5, p. 64, 65–67), “if God knows creatures before they exist, even insofar as they are other than him and distinct (from him), that which he knows is a cognized object, which must needs be something; for that which nowise exists and is absolutely nothing cannot be understood.” But James also thinks that the necessity of positing distinct ideas in God follows from a consideration of God’s essence. God enjoys the highest degree of nobility and goodness. His mode of knowledge must be commensurate with his nature. But according to Proclus, an author James is quite fond of quoting, the highest form of knowledge is knowledge through a thing’s cause. That means that God knows things through his own essence. More precisely, he knows things by knowing his essence as the cause of those things, knowledge that is distinct in James’s view from God’s mere knowledge of himself.
Although James’ insistence on the distinctness of ideas with respect to God’s essence is reminiscent of Henry of Ghent’s teaching, it is important to note, as has been stressed by M. Gossiaux (2007), that James does not conceive of this distinctness as Henry does. For Henry, ideas possess “being of essence” (esse essentiae); James, by contrast, while referring to divine ideas as things (res), is careful to add that they are not things “in the absolute sense but only in a qualified sense,” viz., as cognized objects (Quodl. I, q. 5, p. 63, 60). Thus, divine ideas for James possess a lesser degree of distinction from God’s essence than do Henry of Ghent’s. Nevertheless, because James did consider ideas to be distinct in some sense from God, his position would be viewed by some later authors—e.g., William of Alnwick—as compromising divine unity. (See Côté 2016)
The concept of being, all the medievals agreed, is common. What was debated was the nature of this commonness. According to James of Viterbo, all commonness is founded on some agreement, and this agreement can be either merely nominal or grounded in reality. Agreement is nominal when the same name is predicated of wholly different things, without there being any objective basis for the application of the common name; such is the case of equivocal names. Agreement is real in the following two cases: (1) if it is based on some essential resemblance between the many things to which a particular concept applies, in which case the concept applies to these many things by virtue of the self-same ratio and is said of them univocally; or (2) if that concept is truly common to the many things of which it is said, although it is not said of them in relation to the same nature (ratio), but rather it is said in a prior sense of one and in a posterior sense of others, insofar as they are related in a certain way to the first. A concept that is predicated of things in this way is said to be analogous, and the agreement displayed by the things to which it applies is said to be an agreement of attribution (convenientia attributionis). James believes that it is according to this sense of analogy that being is said of God and creatures, and of substance and accident (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis I, q. 1, p. 25, 674–80). For being is said in a prior sense of God and in a posterior sense of creatures by virtue of a certain relation between the two; likewise, being is said first of substance and secondarily of accidents, on account of the relation of posteriority accidents have to substance. The reason why being is said in a prior sense of God and in a secondary sense of creatures and, hence, the reason why the ‘ratio’ or nature of being is different in the two cases is that being, in God, is “the very thing which God is” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 1, p. 16, 412), whereas created being is only being through something added to it. From this first difference follows a second, namely, that created being is being by virtue of being related to an agent, whereas uncreated being has no relation. These two differences can be summarized by saying that divine being is being through itself (per se), whereas created being is being through another (per aliud) (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 1, p. 16, 425–6). In sum, being is said of God and creature, but according to a different ratio: it is said of God according to the proper and perfect nature of being, but of creatures in a derivative or secondary way.
The question of how being and essence are related to each other, and in particular whether they are really identical or not, attracted considerable interest in the last quarter of the thirteenth century, with all major masters devoting some discussion to it. James of Viterbo is no exception. Drawing his inspiration from Anselm’s semantics, he attempts to articulate a compromise solution (Gossiaux 2018) between the main competing solutions on offer in his day.
James’ most detailed discussion of the distinction between being and essence occurs in the context of a question that asks whether creation could be saved if being (esse) and essence were not different (Quodl. I, q. 4). His answer is that although he finds it difficult to see how one could account for creation if being and essence were not really different, he does not believe it is necessary to conceive of the real distinction in the way in which “certain Doctors” do. Which Doctors does he have in mind? In Quodl. I, q. 4, he summarizes the views of three authors: Godfrey of Fontaines, according to whom the distinction is only conceptual (secundum rationem); Henry of Ghent, for whom esse is only intentionally different from essence, a distinction that is less than a real distinction but greater than a verbal distinction; and finally, Giles of Rome, for whom esse is one thing (res), and essence another. Thus, James agrees with Giles, and disagrees with Henry and Godfrey, that the distinction between being and essence is real; however, he disagrees with Giles about the proper way of understanding the real distinction.
The starting point of his analysis is Anselm’s statement in the Monologion that the substantive lux (light), the infinitive lucere (to-emit-light), and the present participle lucens (emitting light) are related to each other in the same way as essentia (essence), esse (to be), and ens (being). The relation of lucere to lux, James tells us, is the relation of a concrete term to an abstract one; but this is just the relation that obtains between being and essence. Now, a concrete term signifies more things than the corresponding abstract term; for an abstract term signifies only a form, whereas the concrete term signifies the form and the “subject”, i.e., the bearer of the form; it is said to signify the former principally, and the latter secondarily. So it is in the case of being and essence: esse signifies the form (principally) and the subject (secondarily), while essence signifies the form only. What is taken for granted in this analysis is that the distinction between a form and its bearer is a real one, at least in creatures. This is how James achieves his compromise solution: pace Godfrey of Fontaines and Henry of Ghent there is a real distinction (that between the subject and the form) but pace Giles, it is real only in qualified sense, since being principally signifies the same thing as essence.
James devotes five of his Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis (qq. 11–15), representing some 270 pages of edited text, to the question of relations. It is with a view to providing a proper account of divine relations, he explains, that it is “necessary to examine the nature of relation with such diligence” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 11, p. 12, 300–301). But before turning to Trinitarian relations, James devotes the whole of q.11 to the status of relations in general. The following account focuses exclusively on q. 11. James in essence adopts Henry of Ghent’s “modalist” solution, which was to exercise considerable influence among late thirteenth-century thinkers (Henninger 1989), although he disagrees with Henry about the proper way of understanding what a mode is.
The question boils down to whether relations exist in some manner in extra-mental reality or solely through the operation of the intellect, like second intentions (species and genera). Many arguments can be adduced in support of each position, as Simplicius had already shown in his commentary on Aristotle’s Categories—a work that would have a decisive influence on James’ thought. For instance, in support of the view that relations are not real, one may point out that the intellect is able to apprehend relations between existents and non-existents, e.g., the relation between a father and his deceased son; yet, there cannot be anything real in the relation given that one of the two relata is a non-existent. But if so, then the same must be true of all relations, as the intellectual operation involved is the same in all cases. Another argument concerns the way in which relations come to be and cease to be. This appears to happen without any change taking place in the subject which the relation is said to affect. For instance, a child who has lost his mother is said to be an orphan until the age of eighteen, at which point it ceases to be one, although no change has occurred: “the relation recedes or ceases by reason of the mere passage of time.”
But good reasons can also be found in support of the opposing view. For one, Aristotle clearly considers relations to be real, as they constitute one of the ten categories that apply to things outside the soul. Furthermore, according to a view commonly held by the scholastics, the perfection of the universe cannot consist solely of the perfection of the individual things of which it is made; it is also determined by the relations those things have to each other; hence, those relations must be real.
The correct solution to the question of whether relations are real or not, James contends, depends on assigning to a given relation no more but no less reality than is fitting to it. Those who rely on arguments such as the first two above to infer that relations are entirely devoid of reality are guilty of assigning relations too little reality; those who appeal to arguments such as the last two, showing that relations are distinct from their subjects in the way in which things are distinct from each other, assign too great a degree of reality to relations. The correct view must lie somewhere in between: relations are real, but are not distinct from their subjects in the way one thing is distinct from another.
That they must be real is sufficiently shown by the first Simplician arguments mentioned above, to which James adds some others of his own. However, showing that they are not things is slightly more complicated. James’ position, in fact, is that relations are not things “properly and absolutely speaking,” but only “in a certain way according to a less proper way of speaking.” A relation is not a thing in an absolute sense because of the “meekness” of its being, for which reason “it is like a middle point between being and non-being” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 11, p. 30, 668–9). The reasoning behind this last statement is as follows: the more intrinsic some principle is to a thing, the more that thing is said to be through it; what is maximally intrinsic to a thing is its substance; a thing is therefore maximally said to be on account of its substance. Now a thing’s being related to another is, in the constellation of accidents that qualify that thing, what is minimally intrinsic to it and thus farthest from its being, and so closest to non-being. But if relations are not things, at least in the absolute sense, what are they? James answers that they are modes of being of their foundations. “The mode of being of a thing does not differ from the thing in such a way as to constitute another essence or thing. The relation, therefore, is not different from its foundation” (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 11, p. 33, 745–7). Speaking of relations as modes allows us to acknowledge their reality, as attested by experience, without hypostasizing them. A certain number’s being equal to another is clearly something distinct from the number itself. The number and its being equal are two “somethings” (aliqua), says James; they are not, however, two things; they are two in the sense that one is a thing (the number) and the other is a mode of being of the number.
In making relations modes of being of the foundation, James was clearly taking his cue from Henry of Ghent, “the chief representative of the modalist theory of relation” (Henninger 1989). For Henry and James, relations are real in the sense that they are distinct from their foundations and belong to extra mental reality. However, James’ understanding of the way in which a relation is a mode differs from Henry’s. For Henry, a thing’s mode is the same thing as its ratio or nature; it is the particular type of being that thing has, what “specifies” it. But according to James’ understanding of the term, a mode lies beyond the ratio of a thing, like an accident of that thing (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, p. 34, 767–8).
In conclusion, one could say that in his discussion of relations, James was guided by the same motivation as many of his contemporaries, namely securing the objectivity of relations without conferring full-blooded existence upon them. Relations do exhibit some form of being, James believed, but it is a most faint one (debilissimum), the existence of a mode qua accident.
James discusses individuation in two places: Quodl. I, q. 21 and Quodl. II, q. 1. I will focus on the first treatment, because it is the lengthier of the two and because the tenor of James’ brief remarks on individuation in Quodl. II, q. 1, despite certain similarities with his earlier discussion (Wippel 1994), make it hard to see how they fit into an overall theory of individuation.
The question James faces in Quodl. I, q. 21 is a markedly theological one, namely whether, if the soul were to take on the ashes or the matter of another man at resurrection, the resulting individual would be the same as before resurrection. In order to answer that question, James tells us, it is first necessary to determine what the cause of numerical unity is in the case of composite beings. There have been numerous answers to that question and James provides a short account of each. Some philosophers have appealed to quantity as the principle of numerical unity; others to matter; others yet to matter as subtending indeterminate dimensions; finally, others have turned to form as the cause of individuation. According to James, each of these answers is part of the correct explanation though each is insufficient if taken on its own. The correct view, according to him, is that form and matter taken together are the principal causes of numerical identity in the composite, with quantity contributing something “in a certain manner.” Form and matter, however, are principal causes in different ways; more precisely, each accounts for a different kind of numerical unity. For by ‘singularity’ we can really mean two distinct things: we can mean the mere fact of something’s being this or that singular thing, or we can point to a thing qua “something complete and perfect within a certain species” (Quodl. I, 21, 227, 134–35). It is matter that accounts for the first kind of singularity, and form for the second. Put otherwise, the kind of unity that accrues to a thing on account of its being a mere singular results from the concurrence of the “substantial” unity provided by matter and the “accidental” unity provided by quantity. By contrast, the unity that characterizes a thing by virtue of the perfection or completeness it displays is conferred to it by the form, which is the principle of perfection and actuality in composites.
Although James thinks he can quite legitimately enlist the support of such prestigious authorities as Aristotle and Averroes in favor of the view that matter and form together are constitutive of a thing’s numerical unity, his solution has struck commentators as a somewhat contrived and ad hoc attempt to reach a compromise solution at all costs (Pickavé 2007; Wippel 1994). James, it has been suggested, “seems to be driven by the desire to offer a compromise position with which everyone can to some extent agree” (Pickavé 2007: 55). Such a suggestion does accord with James’ oft-expressed preference for solutions that present a “middle way” (media via) among competing theories (Quaestiones de divinis praedicamentis, q. 11, p. 23, 513; Quodl. II, q. 7, p. 108, 118; De regimine christiano, 210; see also Quodl. II, q. 5, p. 65, 208–209), although these professions of moderation must sometimes be taken with a grain of salt, as we will see in Section 8 below.
The belief that matter contains the ‘seeds’ of all the forms that can possibly accrue to it is one of the hallmarks of James of Viterbo’s thought, as is the belief that the soul pre-contains, in the shape of “fitnesses” (idoneitates), all the sensitive, intellective, and volitional forms it is able to take on, though, as we will see, there is an important difference between both cases. I will present James’ doctrine of “fitnesses” in the intellect in Section 6, and his doctrine of fitnesses in the will in Section 6. In this section, I review James’ arguments in favor of seminal reasons (For a full account see Pickavé and Côté 2018).
James takes as the point of departure of his analysis of change the view commonly attributed to Aristotle by the medievals according to which substantial change involves a natural agent educing a form from the potency of matter. His contention is that for the form to be educed from prime matter it has to preexist in prime matter in an “incipient or inchoate” state. Otherwise the forms would have to be put into matter by an external cause. That cause could only be a natural agent or a supernatural one. It cannot be the latter, for then change would no longer be natural; but nor can it be the former because James holds that forms do not “migrate” from one substance to another. Hence the forms must preexist in matter.
James holds that the inchoate form present in matter is the same as the full-fledged, actualized form, differing from it only modally (Quodl. II, q. 5, p. 70, 386–388). To the objection that if this were true nothing “new” would result from the process of change, he responded by pointing out that the assumption that natural change results in the emergence of new things is rejected by no less an authority than Averroes himself, who denies that natural agents “induce something extrinsic in matter” (Quodl. II, q. 5, p. 77, 621). What newness does result from natural change is accounted for by the modal difference between the potential and the actualized form.
James holds that natural change requires two active principles: that of the potential form existing in potency in matter, i.e., the seminal reason, and that of the extrinsic natural agent acting on the matter. He explicitly denies that the potential form on its own is a sufficient cause of change (Quodl. II, q. 5, p. 89, 1012–1014). The first active principle is that of the inchoate form itself: it is active “by means of inclination”, that is, it is active inasmuch as it naturally tends to its actualization. The second active principle is the extrinsic agent that educes the form from matter; it is active by means of transmutation, i.e., by efficiently causing the change by virtue of the power of acting (virtus agendi) conferred upon it by God. Both causes cooperate in the production of the effect.
Although James teaches that there are preexisting ideas and volitions in the soul similarly to the way in which seminal reasons preexist in matter, there is an important difference between the two cases. For the “inclining principles” in matter, he explains in Quodl. III, q. 4 (p. 70, 416–424), stand farther from their actualization than do the inclining principles in the soul. They thus require more on the part of the extrinsic transmutative cause than do the soul’s inclining principles. So much so, James explains, that it sometimes appears that all the work is being done by the extrinsic agent. This is not so, of course, as the “intrinsic inclining principle” also plays a role. Because James assigns such an important role to external agent causes in his account of natural change, one of the common complaints directed against theories of seminal reasons, namely that they deny the reality of secondary causes, clearly does not apply to his version of the theory.
James’ doctrine of seminal reasons would elicit considerable criticism in the early fourteenth century and beyond (Phelps 1980). The initial reaction came from Dominicans. Bernard of Auvergne wrote a series of Impugnationes (i.e., refutations) contra Jacobum de Viterbio (see Pattin 1962 and Côté 2016), attacking various aspects of James’ metaphysics, including his theory of seminal reasons; and John of Naples later argued against James’ distinction between the potency of matter and matter tout court. James’ theory also encountered resistance from within the Augustinian Order, e.g., from Alphonsus Vargas of Toledo. Even arts masters entered the fray. The Milanese arts master Maino de Maineri devoted a lengthy section of one of his questions in his question-commentary on Averroes’ De substantia orbis dating from 1315–1317 to a presentation and rebuttal of James’ theory of natural change (see Côté 2019).
According to Aristotle in the De anima,“ the soul is in a sense all things.” James wants to infer from this that all things must somehow preexist in the soul “by a certain conformity and resemblance.” (Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 91, 403). James distinguished between three sorts of conformity: the conformity between the sense and the sensibles, that between the intellect and intelligibles, and that between the will and appetibles. He thus believed that all sensibles must preexist in the sense-power, all intelligibles in the intellective power, and all “appetibles” in the appetitive power, i.e., the will. They do not preexist in their fully actualized state, of course; but nor do they preexist as purely indeterminate capacities: James holds that they preexist as “incomplete actualities,” innate and permanent qualities of the soul tending toward their actualization. Borrowing from Simplicius’ commentary on Aristotle’s Categories, James described a power of the soul as a “general (communis) aptitude (aptitudo) or a fitness (idoneitas) with respect to the complete act” (Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 92, 421) that is divided into further specific “fitnesses” (speciales idoneitates), “following the diversity of objects” of that power. For instance, intellect is a general idoneitas that is subdivided in specific idoneitates “following the diversity” of intelligibles. Despite what the phrase “following the diversity” would have us believe, James did not assert that the division of fitnesses in the soul exactly mapped the division of kinds of objects. Though he was clearly committed to some correspondence between the two, he believed it was not possible in this life to know how far the division into specific “fitnesses” proceeded, and hence how many “fitnesses” there are in the soul.
In addition to explaining how the soul’s powers relate to intelligibles, sensibles and appetibles, James also described their relation to occurrent acts of understanding, sensing, and willing. As with seminal reasons, an aptitude in potency in the soul and the corresponding actualized aptitude were not viewed as really but only as modally distinct (Quodl. III, q. 5, p. 84, 62–63). James also held that each power was both passive and active in relation to its actualization: passive inasmuch as a power qua power is not yet actualized, active insofar as it tends toward its actualization (Quodl. I, q. 12, p. 165, 281–285). To the argument that nothing could be both active and passive in the same respect, James responded that this was true only of transeunt actions, such as fire heating a pot, which require the active cause of change to be distinct from the passive recipient of change, not of immanent actions, as are the operations of the soul.
Although James held that all the soul’s powers were active, they were not so to the same degree: the will and its aptitudes were considered to be more active and thus “closer” to their actualization than those of the intellect; and the intellect and its aptitudes, in turn, were viewed as more active and closer to their actualization than those of the senses. Accordingly, James considered that the more active an aptitude or “inclining principle” was, the more causal power it had and the less causal input it required from other sources.
From the foregoing it is easy to see what position James would take in what was a commonly discussed topic in the thirteenth century, namely the problem whether or not the “essence” of the soul was really different from its powers. The position espoused by the scholastics whose teachings James studies most carefully, namely Thomas Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines was the soul was indeed really distinct from its powers. There was, however, a commonly discussed minority position, one that eschewed both real distinction and strict identity (which had few followers): that of Henry of Ghent. Henry believed that the powers of the soul were “intentionally,” not really distinct from its essence. James, however, sided with Thomas, Giles, and Godfrey, against Henry (Quodl. II, q. 14, p. 160, 70–71; Quodl. III, q. 5, 56–84,63). His reasoning was as follows. Given that everyone agreed that there was a real distinction between the essence of the soul and one of its powers in act, that is, between the soul and, e.g., an occurrent act of willing, then if one denied that there was a real distinction between the soul and its powers, as Henry had, one would be committed to the existence of a real distinction between the power in act (the occurrent act of willing) and that same power in potency (the will qua capable of produce that act). But as we have already seen, James believed that something in potency is not really distinct from that same thing in act. Hence the soul’s essence must be distinct from its powers.
James’ longest discussion of cognition occurs in question 12 of his first Quodlibet, which asks whether it is necessary to posit an agent intellect in the human soul that is distinct from the possible intellect (for discussion see Côté 2013, and Solère 2018a and 2018b). Since the view that there is such a distinction was an important component of abstraction theories of knowledge, what was really at stake was whether abstraction theory provided the correct account of knowledge acquisition. According to abstraction theory, of which Aquinas was one of the most famous exponents, the mind derives its content from an engagement with sense-images (phantasms). The agent intellect, a “part” of the intellectual soul, was held to abstract intelligible species from the sense-images, and these species were then “received” by the possible intellect. Since the same power could not be both active and passive, the two intellects had to be distinct. As can be gathered from the preceding section, James would not be favorably disposed to such a theory. Since intelligibles, for him, preexisted in the soul in the form of “aptitudes” or “fitnesses,” there was no need for them to be abstracted; and since the main reason for positing an agent intellect was to perform abstraction, there was no reason to suppose that such a faculty existed — which is exactly the position he defended in question 12. James’ theory of innate idoneitates in the soul thus entailed a wholesale rejection of abstraction theories of knowledge and of the model of the soul on which they rested (Côté 2013).
James was well aware that by denying the distinction between the two intellects, he was opposing the consensus view of Aristotle commentators. Indeed, his views seem to run counter to the De anima itself, though, as he would mischievously point out, it was difficult to determine just what Aristotle’s doctrine was, so obscure was its formulation (Quodl. I, q. 12, p. 169, 426—170, 439). He explained that what he was denying was not that there was a “difference” in the intellect—the soul’s powers did exhibit such a difference since they were both active and passive—rather, what he was denying was that’s the existence of a difference implied a real distinction of powers (Quodl. I, q. 12, p. 170, 440–45).
As far as James was concerned the relevant question was not how intelligibles are abstracted so as to produce occurrent acts of cognition, but rather how innate intellectual aptitudes can develop into occurrent acts of cognition. The key to his solution lay in his view that aptitudes actively tend toward their completion. James described such active inclination as a kind of self-motion—formal self-motion–which he viewed as the main created causal contributor to a power’s actualization. But of course “main causal contributor” does not mean “sole causal contributor.;” Although the soul’s powers stand closer to their actualization and exercise greater formal self-motion than do the seminal reasons in matter, and although the intellect and its aptitudes likewise stand closer to their actualization and exercise greater self-motion than do the senses and their aptitudes, no “fitness” on its own is sufficient to bring about its actualization (Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 102, 777–778; something further is required. In the case of the senses, what is required is the “excitative” causality (excitatio) exercised by the physical change in the organ of sense; in the case of the intellect, it is the excitative causality supplied by the phantasm. In both cases, James held that the power’s formal self-motion together with the “rousing” action stemming from the organ or the phantasm necessarily entailed their effect.
James of Viterbo is thus part of a group of thinkers in the history of philosophy for whom the intellect itself, as opposed to extra-mental objects or their proxies in the soul, is the main causal factor not only of the production of acts of knowledge but of their conceptual content as well. Indeed, for James, that content is already present in the soul in the form of general and specific “fitnesses” or “aptitudes.” The aptitudes are innate (naturaliter inditae, “always present in [the soul]” (Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 92, 422–423), ready to be actualized in the presence of the appropriate triggering factors. Few other scholastics were ready to espouse such an extreme form of innatism, which some scholars have likened to the theory innate ideas of the Early Moderns (Solère 2018a).
The scholastics all agreed that the human will is free. They also agreed that the will and the intellect both played a role in the genesis of the voluntary act. What they disagreed about was which of the two faculties had the decisive role. For Henry of Ghent, the will was the sole cause of its free acts (Quodl. I, q. 17), so much so that he tended to relegate the intellect’s role to that of a “sine qua non” cause. At the other end of the spectrum of opinions, Godfrey of Fontaines held that the will is always passive in regard to the intellect and that it is the intellect that exercises the decisive motion in producing the voluntary act (Quodl. III, q. 16). Although James of Viterbo used language apt to suggest that he wanted to steer a middle course between Henry and Godfrey (Quodl. II, q. 7), his preferences clearly lay with a position like that of Henry’s, as can be gathered from his most detailed treatment of the question in Quodl. I, q. 7 (see Dumont 2018a for a complete treatment of the issue in James).
James’ thesis in Quodl. I, q. 7 was that the will both moves itself and is moved by another. An agent that is moved by another can be said to be free as long as it also moves itself in some way. The human will is just such an agent: it is moved by itself; but it is also moved by another, namely by the object of willing outside the soul, and it is moved by that same object insofar as it is apprehended by the intellect. To explain how this was so, James used Aquinas’ distinction between the specification of an act of will (the will’s willing this as opposed to that) and the exercise of the act (the will’s actually willing this). The will formally moves itself in regard to the exercise of its act; it is moved by the object outside the soul in regard to the specification of its act; and it is moved by the intellect, or more precisely by the object as apprehended by the intellect, both in regard to the specification and the exercise of its act. James called the motion by which the will was specified by the object as apprehended by the intellect “metaphorical” motion, as distinct from “proper” motion. Final causes were metaphorical movers in this sense. James called the motion by which the will is moved to its exercise by the object as apprehended by the intellect efficient motion. This is prima facie a surprising move given what we know about James’ theory of the soul as a self-mover. For even though James was keen to show that the will cannot, so to speak, “go it alone,” did not making the object as understood by the intellect the efficient cause of the will’s exercise to act risk tilting the causal balance too far in the direction of the intellect? But in fact if the intellect was an efficient cause, it wasn’t so in the usual sense of the word “efficient.” James claimed to follow Aristotle in Metaphysics in distinguishing two ways in which something could be moved efficiently. The first was through direct efficient causation; in this sense, only God was the efficient cause of the will’s motion. The second sense was through “a certain connection” that obtains between two things that are rooted in the same subject. It is this second sense that is relevant for understanding how the intellect moves the will. As James understood the matter, “because the will and the intellect are rooted and connected in the same essence of the soul, it follows that when the soul is in actuality in relation to the intellect, there arises (fit) in the soul a certain inclination such that it becomes in actuality in relation to the will, with the result that (the will) moves itself.” It is, he concluded, “on account of that inclination that the intellect moves the will;” and the motion by which it does so can be termed a “rousing up” (excitatio) ( Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 104, 849–855).
Thus, despite what the language of “efficiency” might suggest, James’ account of how the intellect moves the will is similar to his account of how the sense organ moves the power of sense and how the imagination moves the intellect: in all three cases the motion is of the “excitatory” variety; the power itself as the formal cause of its acts supplies the lion’s share of the voluntary act’s causality. If anything, the will itself can be considered to be an efficient cause (in the first sense of the word), if only per accidens. This is because the will, like heavy objects but unlike the intellect and the senses, belongs to the class of things that both move themselves formally and move others efficiently. Thus, just as a heavy object is formally self-moved as a result of its heaviness but moves another efficiently inasmuch as it divides the medium it traverses, so too the will is a self-mover that efficiently moves the intellect and the other faculties, and hence can be said to move itself per accidens (Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 98, 633–640).
What is unclear is how any of the above makes the will’s volitions free. After all, by James’ own admission, the senses and the intellect are also formal self-movers, and yet they are not free. The difference is that whereas acts of sensation and intellection, given the self-motion of the senses and the intellect, will necessarily follow upon the motions of the organs of sense and the motion of the imagination, no act of willing according to James is necessitated by the efficient causality (in James’ sense of the word) of the intellect. Thus, although any act of willing must be preceded by an act of the intellect, no act of the intellect necessarily entails a particular act of willing. This makes the will the only power of the soul that is essentially free, though some other powers may be called free “by participation,” insofar as they are apt to be moved by the will. (Quodl. I, q. 7, p. 107, 935–944)
Like Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas, James of Viterbo holds that the moral virtues, considered as habits, i.e., virtuous dispositions or acts, are “connected.” In other words, he believes that one cannot have one of the virtues without having the others as well. The virtues he has in mind are what he calls the “purely” moral virtues, that is, courage, justice, and temperance, which he distinguishes from prudence, which is a partly moral, partly intellectual virtue. In his discussion in Quodl. II, q. 17 James begins by granting that the question is difficult and proceeds to expound Aristotle’s solution to it, which he will ultimately adopt. As James sees it, Aristotle proves in Nicomachean Ethics VI the connection of the purely moral virtues by showing their necessary relation to prudence, and this is to show that just as moral virtue cannot be had without prudence, prudence cannot be had without moral virtue. The connection of the purely moral virtues follows from this: they are necessarily connected because (1) each is connected to prudence and (2) prudence is connected to the virtues (Quodl. II, q. 17, p. 187, 436 – p. 188, 441).
Although there has never been any doubt among medieval theologians that man ought to love God more than he loves himself, medieval theologians did disagree about whether man can fulfill this obligation by purely natural means or whether he requires grace in order to do so. The consensus in the thirteenth century, shared, among other authors, by Thomas Aquinas, Giles of Rome, and Godfrey of Fontaines, was that although perfect love of God is possible only through grace, man does have the natural capacity to love God more than himself (See Osborne 2005 for discussion of the topic in the thirteenth century, including in James of Viterbo). Many of these authors believed that granting man such a capacity was necessary in order to safeguard the universally accepted principle that “grace perfects, not destroys, nature”. For if man is naturally inclined to love himself more than God and is made to love God more than himself only through grace, then that natural inclination is not so much perfected as replaced by a different one. Against these authors, James of Viterbo in his Quodlibet II, question 20 famously defended the view that man naturally loves himself more than God. Before stating James’ argument in support of this position, it is important to be attentive to the precise way in which he formulated the question, as well as to how he understands the term “love” (diligere).
First, the question James raised in Quodl. II, q. 20, was not (a): “Does man naturally love God more than he loves himself?” or (b): “Does man naturally love himself more than God,” but rather (c): “Does man naturally love God more than himself, or the converse (vel econverso)?” What (c), but not (a) or (b), rules out is that man can love himself and God equally. James did not think that this was so. He compared the case of self-love vs. love of God to the distinction between natural and supernatural knowledge: “Natural knowledge starts from creatures and proceeds thence to God; contrariwise, supernatural knowledge begins with God and proceeds thence to creatures.” Since the distinction between natural and supernatural knowledge is exhaustive and mutually exclusive, there is no other kind of knowledge, and hence none that would proceed “equally” from creatures and God. But for the comparison between knowledge and love to hold, the conclusion that applies to the former must apply to the latter, and that conclusion is that if man does not love God more than himself, then he loves himself more than God; and conversely.
Second, following the practice of many scholastics, James distinguished between two forms of love: the “love of desire” or “love of covetousness” (amor concupiscentiae), which he defined as the “love of some good which we want for ourselves or for others,” and the love of friendship (amor amicitiae), or the love of someone for their own sake. Although James believed that rational creatures love God in both these ways, he was clear that the debate about whether or not man loves himself more than God or the converse concerned only the love of friendship; the debate, then, was about whether man naturally loves himself for his own sake more than he loves God for his own sake—which was the view James defended—or the converse.
James offered two arguments to support his position. The first was based on the principle that the mode of natural love must be commensurate with the mode of being and, hence, of the mode of being one—since everything that is is one. Now a thing is one with itself by virtue of numerical identity, but it is one with something else by virtue of a certain conformity. For instance, Socrates is one with himself by virtue of his being Socrates, but he is one with Plato by virtue of the fact that both share the same form. But the being something has by virtue of numerical identity is “greater” than the being it has by reason of something it shares with another. And given that the species of natural love follows the mode of being, it follows that it is more perfect to love oneself than to love another (Quodl. II, q. 20, p. 206, 148 – p. 149, 165). The second argument attempted to derive the same conclusion from the principle that “God’s love of charity elevates [human] nature’s” love of God ( Quodl. II, q. 20, p. 207, 166–167). James reasoned that there was only one way in which charity could elevate nature, namely by making it love God above all else. But if this was so, it had to follow “that nature in itself cannot love God in this way (...). For if it could, it would not need to be elevated by charity.” (Quodl. II, q. 20, p. 207, 181–184). And for James to say that nature itself cannot love God above all else was just to say that man naturally loves himself above all else. QED.
But if charity elevated nature in this way, did it not “destroy” nature after all, by substituting for the inclination to love the self above all else the entirely different inclination to love God above all else? James’ answer was that it did not, since “through charity man loves himself no less than before; he simply loves God more.” (Quodl. II, q. 20, p. 210, 280–282).
James’ opposition to the consensus position on the issue of the love of self vs. love of God did not go unnoticed. It elicited considerable criticism in the years following his death, from such authors as Durand of Saint-Pourçain, Peter of Palude, and John of Naples (Jeschke 2009).
Although James touches briefly on political issues in Quodl. I, q. 17 (see Kempshall, 1999, and Côté, 2012), his most extensive discussions occur in his celebrated De regimine christiano (On Christian Government), written in 1302 during the conflict pitting Boniface VIII against the king of France Philip IV (the Fair). De regimine christiano is often compared in aim and content with Giles of Rome’s De ecclesiastica potestate (On Ecclesiastical Power), which offers one of the most extreme statements of pontifical supremacy in the thirteenth century; indeed, in the words of De regimine’s editor, James’ goal is “to formulate a theory of papal monarchy that is every bit as imposing and ambitious as that of [Giles]” (De regimine christiano: xxxiv). However, as scholars have also recognized, James shows a greater sensitivity to the distinction between nature and grace than Giles did (Arquillière 1926).
De regimine christiano is divided into two parts. The first, dealing with the theory of the Church, is of little philosophical interest, save for James’ enlisting of Aristotle to show that all human communities, including the Church, are rooted in the “natural inclination of mankind.” The second and longest part is devoted to defining the nature and extent of Christ’s and the pope’s power. One of James’ most characteristic doctrines is found in Book II, chapter 7, where he turns to the question of whether temporal power must be “instituted” by spiritual power, in other words, whether it derives its legitimacy from the spiritual, or possesses a legitimacy of its own. James states outright that spiritual power does institute temporal power, but notes that there have been two views in this regard. Some, e. g., the proponents of the so-called “dualist” position such as John Quidort of Paris, hold that the temporal power derives directly from God and thus in no way needs to be instituted by the spiritual, while others, such as Giles of Rome in De ecclesiastica potestate, contend that the temporal derives wholly from the spiritual and is devoid of any legitimacy whatsoever “unless it is united with spiritual power in the same person or instituted by the spiritual power” (De regimine christiano: 211).
James is dissatisfied with both positions and, as he so often does, endeavors to find a “middle way” between them. His solution is to say that the “being” of the temporal power’s institution comes both from God—by way of man’s natural inclination—in “a material and incomplete sense,” and from the spiritual power by which it is “perfected and formed.” This is a very clever solution. On the one hand, by rooting the temporal power in man’s natural inclination, albeit in the imperfect sense just mentioned, James was acknowledging the legitimacy of temporal rule independently of its connection to the spiritual, thus “avoid[ing] the extreme and implausible view of [Giles of Rome]” (Dyson 2009: xxix). On the other hand, making the natural origins of temporal power merely the incomplete matter of its being was a way of stressing its subordination and inferiority to the spiritual order, in keeping with his papalist convictions. Still, James’ very choice of analogies to illustrate the relationship between the spiritual and temporal realms showed that his solution lay much closer to the theocratic position espoused by Giles of Rome than his efforts to find a “middle way” would have us believe. Thus, comparing the spiritual power’s relation to the temporal in terms of the relation of light to color, he explains that although “color has something of the nature of light, (…) it has such a feeble light that, unless there is present a more excellent light by which it may be formed, not in its own nature but in its power, it cannot move the vision” (De regimine christiano: 211). In other words, James is telling us that although temporal power does originate in man’s natural inclinations, it is ineffectual qua power unless it is informed by the spiritual.
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