Supplement to Infinite Regress Arguments

Metaphysical Foundationalism and the Well-Foundedness of Grounding

Metaphysical Foundationalism is the view that there exist some absolutely fundamental entities upon which all non-fundamental entities ultimately ontologically depend. If we have a non-fundamental entity \(E_{A1}\) that ontologically depends on \(E_{B1}\) and \(E_{B2}\), and \(E_{B1}\) depends on \(E_{C1}\) and \(E_{C2}\), and \(E_{B2}\) depends on \(E_{C3}\) and \(E_{C4}\), and so on, Metaphysical Foundationalism says that we must be able to trace the various branching strands of ontological dependence ultimately down to some fundamental entities: a collection of things that do not depend on anything, and upon which all the non-fundamental entities above them on the branch ultimately depend.

Sometimes philosophers, in describing Metaphysical Foundationalism, describe it as the view that ontological dependence (or cognate notions) must be well-founded. For example, Karen Bennett (2017, 116), talking about building relations, says “Well-foundedness says that every building chain terminates in something unbuilt”. Ricki Bliss (2013, 416) says “A well-founded grounding chain is one that is grounded in something fundamental.” Jonathan Schaffer (2010, 37) says “Well-foundedness is imposed by requiring that all priority chains terminate.” And Theodore Sider (2011, 115), talking about in virtue of, says that it is natural to assume that this is well-founded “in the sense that if a truth holds in virtue of any truth at all, then it is connected by an in-virtue-of chain to some truth that does not hold in virtue of any truth (‘no unbounded descending chains of in-virtue-of’)”. There are many other such quotes.

However, ‘well-founded’ has a strict meaning in the branch of mathematics from which it comes, order theory, and if used in its strict technical sense, the claim that ontological dependence is well-founded is a stronger view than Metaphysical Foundationalism.

For a relation to be well-founded with respect to some domain is for every non-empty subset of that domain to contain a minimal element—that is, some element that is not greater than (with respect to the order imposed by that relation) any other thing in that domain. So for example, ‘is taller than’ is a well-founded relation on the domain of human beings, because for any non-empty set of human beings, there will be a minimal element: a human being who is not taller than any other human being in that set—that is, a person who is the least tall, or who is tied for being least tall.

When considering ontological dependence, element \(x\) is greater than element \(y\) just in case \(x\) depends on \(y\): the more minimal element is the more fundamental one. This is somewhat stipulative: it is simply to capture the thought that the ‘first’ layer of the sequence is made up of the absolutely fundamental things, if such there be. So the minimal elements in any set of things will be those things (if there are any) that do not depend on any thing(s) in that set. So for ontological dependence to be well-founded simpliciter (i.e., over the domain of everything), it must be the case that for any non-empty set of things, there will be something in that set that does not depend on any thing in that set. If the relation of ontological dependence is well-founded with respect to the domain of everything that there is then Metaphysical Foundationalism must be true. For if Metaphysical Foundationalism is false then (at least assuming, as is orthodoxy, that ontological dependence cannot go in a circle) there is at least one chain of ontological dependence that has infinitely many elements, each more fundamental than the previous one, and that has no last element. In which case there is a non-empty subset of this domain—namely, the set containing the infinitely many elements of this infinite chain—that has no minimal element.

But Metaphysical Foundationalism can be true even if ontological dependence is not well-founded. Suppose there is a collection of things that are fundamental, but that for any non-fundamental thing, \(x\), there is a further non-fundamental thing, \(y\), that is more fundamental than \(x\). (See Cameron 2008, 4–5.) Imagine for example that there is exactly one fundamental entity, \(F\). There is also the non-fundamental entity \(E_1\), which is dependent on the non-fundamental entity \(E_{0.5}\), which is dependent on the non-fundamental entity \(E_{0.25}\), which is dependent on the non-fundamental entity \(E_{0.125}\), which is dependent on … and so on ad infinitum, but where everything on this infinite list is ultimately dependent on \(F\). Suppose this is all that exists. If this is how the world is, Metaphysical Foundationalism is true: every one of the infinitely many non-fundamental entities is ultimately dependent on the fundamental entity \(F\). However, we only ever get from a non-fundamental entity to a fundamental one via infinitely many intermediate non-fundamental entities, and because of this ontological dependence is not well-founded. If we take the set of all things, there are of course minimal elements: things that are not dependent on anything else in that set (in this example, \(F\) is the minimal element). But if we take the proper subset of this set that has as its members every non-fundamental thing (i.e. the infinite set {\(E_1\), \(E_{0.5}\), \(E_{0.25}\), …}), there are no minimal elements in this set, for everything in this set is dependent on some other thing in the set, since every non-fundamental thing ontologically depends on some other non-fundamental thing. And so while the well-foundedness of ontological dependence entails Metaphysical Foundationalism, Metaphysical Foundationalism does not entail the well-foundedness of ontological dependence. Usually when metaphysicians talk about well-foundedness, what they actually mean is the weaker claim of Foundationalism.

See Dixon 2016 and Rabin and Rabern 2016 for discussion of different theses in the neighborhood of Metaphysical Foundationalism, well-foundedness, etc.

Copyright © 2018 by
Ross Cameron <cameron@virginia.edu>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]