Notes to Hume’s Newtonianism and Anti-Newtonianism

1. The passages in Hume cited in this entry can be found in the editions listed in the “Primary Sources” section of the Bibliography.

2. A reprint is available to scholars as: “Is a New Material of David Hume by himself? [sic] A Treatise of Fluxions, by Mr. George Campbell: Professor of Mathematicks in Edinburgh, Written by David Home, 1726”. Edited by Yukihiko Kawashima. The Journal of Tokyo International University: The School of Business and Commerce No. 70, 20 September 2004.

3. David Raynor called our attention to these notes.

4. See also:

I need not examine the vis inertiae which is so much talked of in the new philosophy, and which is ascribed to matter. We find by experience, that a body at rest or in motion continues for ever in its present state, till put from it by some new cause; and that a body impelled takes as much motion from the impelling body as it acquires itself. These are facts. When we call this a vis inertiae, we only mark these facts, without pretending to have any idea of the inert power; in the same manner as, when we talk of gravity, we mean certain effects, without comprehending that active power. (footnote at EHU 7.1.25)

Newton, by contrast, held that attraction was a cause that was a result of “the conspiring nature of” two “bodies”. This is something intrinsic to the bodies (not something episodic). For the “conspiring” to occur, the bodies must share a “nature” (see Newton 1728, System of the World, p. 39).

5. “To the same natural effects we must, as far as possible, assign the same causes. As to respiration in a man and in a beast; the descent of stones in Europe and in America; the light of our culinary fire and of the sun; the reflection of light in the earth, and in the planets”. Cf. Hume’s EHU, 9.1.

6. “The qualities of bodies, which admit neither intensification nor remission of degrees, and which are found to belong to all bodies within the reach of our experiments, are to be esteemed the universal qualities of all bodies whatsoever”.

7. “We are to admit no more causes of natural things than such as are both true and sufficient to explain their appearances. To this purpose the philosophers say that Nature does nothing in vain, and more is in vain when less will serve; for Nature is pleased with simplicity, and affects not the pomp of superfluous causes”.

8. In the “History of Astronomy”, Hume’s close friend, Adam Smith, calls attention to this feature of Newton’s methodology (see Schliesser 2005b).

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