First published Wed Mar 8, 2017

Discussions of hope can be found throughout the history of philosophy and across all Western philosophical traditions, even though philosophy has traditionally not paid the same attention to hope as it has to attitudes like belief and desire. However, even though hope has historically only rarely been discussed systematically—with important exceptions, such as Aquinas, Bloch and Marcel—almost all major philosophers acknowledge that hope plays an important role in regard to human motivation, religious belief or politics. Historically, discussions of the importance of hope were often embedded in particular philosophical projects. More recent discussions of hope provide independent accounts of its nature and its relation to other mental phenomena, such as desire, intention and optimism.

1. Introduction

Compared with more widely discussed attitudes like beliefs and desires, the phenomenon of hope presents some unique challenges for both theories of the mind and theories of value. Hope is not only an attitude that has cognitive components—it is responsive to facts about the possibility and likelihood of future events. It also has a conative component—hopes are different from mere expectations insofar they reflect and draw upon our desires. A classic analysis of hope—the so called “standard account” (see section 3)—takes hope to be a compound attitude, consisting of a desire for an outcome and a belief in that outcome’s possibility. But not all outcomes that we believe to be possible and that we desire are thereby objects of our hope. In order to hope one not only has to consider an outcome possible, one also has to affectively engage with this outcome in a distinctive way. This raises the question as to whether hope can be reduced to beliefs and desires.

Popular discourse often takes hope to be synonymous with optimism. But while optimism can be usefully analyzed as a desire for an outcome together with a belief that the outcome is more likely than not (or more likely than the evidence leads other people to believe), many philosophers argue that hope, properly understood, is independent of probability assessments (see section 3). One can hope for outcomes that one considers to be very unlikely and that one does not expect to happen, such as a miraculous cure of an illness. In such cases, optimism is not an appropriate response.

It is an open question whether the contribution of hope to human agency is to be identified with that of the underlying desires or whether hope makes an independent contribution to motivation or reasoning. If one assumes that hope cannot make any independent contribution to practical reasoning but still motivates, this raises the suspicion that it distorts rational agency. While such an assessment can be found across the history of philosophy, many past and contemporary philosophers provide analyses of hope that add further elements to the belief-desire analysis and use these elements to explain why acting on one’s hopes is (sometimes) rational.

2. The Philosophical History of Hope

Historically, evaluations of hope change together with the prevailing view of the relationship between human action and the future. As long as the human condition is seen as essentially unchangeable, hope is more often treated as arising from mere epistemic uncertainty and as having ambivalent effects on human happiness. In philosophical contexts where either the possibility of a future life beyond this world or the idea of human progress is emphasized, hope is more often seen as an appropriate and even virtuous attitude that enables humans to direct their agency towards these possibilities (see Miceli and Castelfranchi 2010).

2.1 Ancient accounts of hope

In early Greek thought, hope is often seen as an attitude of those who have insufficient knowledge or are easily swayed by wishful thinking. It thus has a primarily negative reputation (Vogt forthcoming) as an attitude that (at least potentially) misleads actions and agents. Already Solon focuses on empty hopes (see Lewis 2006: 85; Caston and Kaster 2016). In the dialogues of Thucydides, it is similarly noted that those who hope typically have a poor understanding of their situation, fail to come up with good plans, and things go badly for them in war (The Peloponnesian War, 5.102–3, 5.113). A slightly more nuanced perspective is often seen to be reflected in Hesiod’s version of the tale of Pandora. When all the evils had escaped from Pandora’s jar, famously, only hope (elpis) remained (“Works and Days”, §90). This seems to suggest that hope can also sustain human agency in the fact of widespread evil. It must be noted, however, that there are many competing interpretations of why elpis remained in the jar (Verdenius 1985): Was it to keep hope available for humans or, rather, to keep hope from man? Is hope consequently to be regarded as good (“a comfort to man in his misery and a stimulus rousing his activity”, Verdenius 1985: 66) or as evil (“idle hope in which the lazy man indulges when he should be working honestly for his living”, Verdenius 1985: 66)? These different interpretations of Pandora’s myth are taken up throughout the history of Philosophy (especially among existentialist authors, see section 2.5).

In the Timaeus, Plato also adopts a rather negative attitude towards hope by recounting a myth according to which the divine beings give us “those mindless advisers confidence and fear, (…) and gullible hope” (Timaeus, 69b). In the Philebus, by contrast, he seems to also allow for a more favorable view of the role of hope in human life. The relevant discussion of hope takes place in the context of an argument about “false pleasures”. Against Protarch’s objection that only opinions can be true or false, but not pleasures, Socrates develops an analogy between opinion and pleasure (Philebus, 36d). In this context, he describes “pleasures of anticipation”, that is, expectations of future pleasures, that are called hopes (Philebus, 39e3). As Frede (1985) argues, in the case of such pleasures of anticipation what we enjoy at present is only a thought. As there can be a discrepancy between the thought that we enjoy and what is in fact going to happen, the pleasure can be true—in which case it seems appropriate to say that the corresponding hope can be rationally endorsed—or false (Frede 1985: 174f.). The Philebus also presents hope as essential to human agency: Plato seems to suggest that all our agential representations are concerned with the future which connects them to hope (Vogt forthcoming).

Another ancient account which does not attribute a merely negative role to hope is Aristotle’s whose treatment of hope in the context of his discussion of the virtue of courage has received some attention (Gravlee 2000; Lear 2008). On the one hand, Aristotle describes the relationship between hope and courage as a contrast. He identifies two sources of hopefulness that are non-courageous: First, it is possible to be hopeful “at sea […] and in disease”, but this hope does not involve courage, insofar as, in such situations, there is neither “opportunity of showing prowess” nor is death “noble” in these cases, according to Aristotle (Nicomachean Ethics 3.6, 1115a35ff.). Second, one can be hopeful based on one’s experience of good fortune (Nicomachean Ethics 3.8, 1117a10ff.). In this case, the belief in the probability of a good outcome is not well grounded, but founded on mere induction. Both kinds of hopefulness that are non-courageous. On the other hand, there is also a connection between hope and courage via the concept of confidence (Gravlee 2000). For example, Aristotle says:

The coward, then, is a despairing sort of person; for he fears everything. The brave man, on the other hand, has the opposite disposition; for confidence is the mark of a hopeful disposition (Nicomachean Ethics 3.7, 1116a2)

Thus, even though not every hopeful person is courageous, every courageous person is hopeful. Hopefulness creates confidence, which, if derived from the right sources, can lead to the virtue of courage. Gravlee (2000: 471ff.) identifies two further considerations that are relevant for hope’s value in Aristotle’s thought. First, hope underlies deliberation, which is needed for any exercise of a virtuous disposition. Second, hopefulness is also presented as valuable in its connection with youth and the virtue of megalopsychia (high-mindedness): hopefulness spurs us to the pursuit of the noble.

Perhaps unsurprisingly, hope received a less favorable treatment by the Stoic philosophers. In particular, Seneca emphasizes hope’s relation to fear (an idea that is later taken up by Spinoza, see section 2.3):

[t]hey are bound up with one another, unconnected as they may seem. Widely different though they are, the two of them march in unison like a prisoner and the escort he is handcuffed to. Fear keeps pace with hope. Nor does their so moving together surprise me; both belong to a mind in suspense, to a mind in a state of anxiety through looking into the future. Both are mainly due to projecting our thoughts far ahead of us instead of adapting ourselves to the present. (Seneca, Letter 5.7–8; in: 1969: 38)

According to Seneca, we should avoid both fear and hope and instead focus on the present and cultivate tranquility of the soul.

2.2 Christian authors on hope

While pre-Christian accounts see hope mostly as an attitude to reality that is based on insufficient insight into what is true or good and that can, therefore, contribute to virtuous action only accidentally, if at all. By contrast, Christian philosophers such as Augustine and Thomas Aquinas analyze hope as one of the most central virtues of a believer: Hope, precisely in virtue of its capacity to justify action in a way which is not bound to knowledge, is a part of rational faith.

Already in Saint Paul’s argument for the extension of the Christian community beyond the Jewish law, hope plays a central role. Paul states that we can only hope for what is uncertain (Romans 8:24; see also Augustine, City of God, book XIX, §IV, 1960:139). Nevertheless, such hope can be the product of the experience of suffering, if this experience is seen through the lens of faith (Romans 5:3–5) and if the desire to be saved from this suffering is supported by confidence in not being disappointed. Instead of backward-looking law-conformity (associated by Paul with the Jewish faith), it is such forward-looking hope that characterizes the appropriate relation to God. As an illustration, Paul describes Abraham as “hoping against hope” (Romans 4:18), emphasizing the way in which hope goes beyond the evidence.

Augustine of Hippo discusses hope systematically in chapter two of his Enchiridion on Faith, Hope and Love (c. 420). Hope is there distinguished from faith—which is also based on incomplete evidence—by two features: First, hope is necessarily directed to future events, whereas faith can also relate to past events (such as Christ’s resurrection). Second, hope only relates to what is good for the hopeful person, whereas faith can also relate to what is bad (such as punishment for one’s sins). Finally, hope, faith and love are seen as interconnected—only if one loves the future fulfillment of God’s will and thus hopes for it, can one arrive at the correct form of faith (Enchiridion, II.7). As love provides the normative outlook that underlies hope and faith (and thus, in some sense, the desire-component of hope), love is seen as a more central virtue than hope (Enchiridion, XXX.114).

The hope for a life after death also plays an important role in Augustine’s political philosophy. In the City of God, Augustine distinguishes the actual earthly city from the heavenly city that only exists in the hope placed in God (City of God, book XV, §XXI, 1966: 541)—the latter provides a reference point for a Christian view of politics. Hope, however, not only provides for a perspective on politics which surpasses the narrow perspective of classical politics (Dodaro 2007), an appropriate theorizing of hope also modifies the understanding of traditional political virtues, as it redirects their purpose from the earthly to the heavenly city. One example of such a modification concerns punishment: through hope, a Christian statesman will redirect punishment away from an exclusive concern with proportionality towards the potential reform of the criminal (City of God, book V, §XXIV, 1963: 263).

In one of his letters to Macedonius, a public official, Augustine finally emphasizes that the hope for a future life underlies all true human happiness, both on the level of the individual and of the state (Letter 155, Political Writings, §4–8, pp. 91–94). Thus, hope is not just of concern for individual believers but also for statesmen that are concerned with collective happiness, as paying attention to hope allows them to pursue a political constitution that allows true virtue of citizens to emerge (see also Dodaro 2007).

While Augustine is more or less exclusively concerned with the significance of hope for our pursuit of a good Christian life, Thomas Aquinas’ Summa theologiae contains a very extensive discussion of hope that also covers forms of hope that are not connected to faith. As for the analysis of what hope is (as such, independently from its theological significance), Aquinas argues that hope is one of the “irascible passions” (i.e., passions which counteract our immediate impulses, SsS III,26; ST I-II 40.1). Hope, he argues, is always directed at a good that lies in the future. However, in contrast to mere desire, the objects of hope are unlikely outcomes or outcomes that are hard to achieve but which are nevertheless in the realm of possibility (ST I-II 40.1). As this last part requires a cognition of possibility, hope is also always partly grounded in experience (ST I-II 40.5).

Regarding the rationality of hope, Aquinas has a nuanced view. On the one hand, he admits that a lack of experience can make one unaware of obstacles. This tendency (and drunkenness, ST I-II 40.6) can promote (irrational) hope. On the other hand, he assumes that hope can promote rational agency: as hope incorporates both knowledge of the possible and knowledge of the difficulties to reach the desired outcome, it can motivate agents to devote energy to their activities.

Because of this ambivalence, hope in the ordinary sense is not a virtue for Aquinas. As a passion, humans can display an excess and a deficiency of hope (ST II-II 17.5); furthermore, passions are not virtues by definition. This changes, however, as soon as we examine theological hope, i.e., the hope we can put in God. First, as directed towards God, such hope does not know any excess. Second, we cannot understand theological hope as a passion. We must analyze it as a habit of the will. While hope as a passion can only be incited by sensible goods (and subsequently motivates action insofar the subject takes herself to be capable to realize that good), we can also hope for God’s assistance (ST II-II 17.1) in reaching eternal happiness (ST II-II 17.2). As eternal life and happiness are not sensible goods, this kind of hope cannot be a passion but must reside in the will (ST II-II 18.1). Insofar it is a habit, hope is not under one’s control but itself given by grace (ST II-II 17.1). From this account, it follows that one cannot place one’s hope (in this sense) in other people and one cannot hope, except indirectly, for the happiness of others—one can only hope in God.

Because of these two features, hope is a theological virtue (ST II-II 17.5; see also 1 Corinthians 13). While love (or charity) is directed to God for the sake of unity, faith and hope are directed towards God with a view to some good to be obtained from that unity: faith relates to God as a source of knowledge, hope relates to God as a source of goodness (ST II-II 17.6).

The rationality of theological hope can only be properly understood, according to Aquinas when we acknowledge that hope has to be preceded by faith (which underlies the belief in the possibility of salvation), but, given faith, hope for the good of salvation is rational. Despair, as caused either by the absence of faith or the desire to be saved, is sinful (ST II-II 20.1). As hope is, by definition, future-directed, it only is possible for human beings who are uncertain of whether they are blessed or damned, whereas love can persist even after their ultimate fate has been revealed (ST II-II 18.2–3).

2.3 Hope in 17th and 18th century philosophy

In 17th and 18th-century philosophy, hope is discussed by most philosophers as a part of their general theories of motivation and cognition and often discussed as a “passion”, i.e., as a fundamentally noncognitive attitude (even though it might have a belief-component). This implies a rejection of Aquinas’ division between different kinds of passions in favor of a moral psychology which classifies emotions and desires together as passions that generate action, of which hope is usually conceived as a species. Almost all authors mentioned in the following also embrace some version of the idea defining for the “standard account” that hope is based on uncertainty in belief together with a representation of an object as desirable. As a result, hope is seen by most philosophers in this period (with the exception of Spinoza) as a motivating factor in human agency that is neutral, as it can lead to both rational and irrational action.

According to René Descartes, hope is a weaker form of confidence (Passions of the Soul, [1649] 1985: 389) and consists in a desire (a representation of an outcome to be both good for us and possible) together with a disposition to think of it as likely but not certain (Passions of the Soul, [1649] 1985: 350f, 389). This means that hope and anxiety always accompany each other (in contrast to both despair and confidence which are absolute opposites). Hope also underlies the more complex passions of boldness and courage (Descartes [1649] 1985: 391). While hope for the approval of others can move us to virtue and thus be commendable (Descartes [1649] 1985: 401), it is, like all passions, a product of the movements of the “spirits” and thus not completely under the control of our soul (Descartes [1649] 1985: 345) which means that it may work against the good of the soul-body union.

Thomas Hobbes adopts a similar analysis. For him, hope is a complex passion or a “pleasure of the mind”, i.e., a pleasure that arises not from direct sensation but from thinking. For Hobbes, the simplest building block underlying hope is appetite, and “appetite with an opinion of obtaining” is hope (Leviathan, 36, I.VI.14). As in Descartes, hope serves as a building block for more complex mental phenomena, such as courage or confidence (Leviathan, 36f, I.VI.17/19). But hope also plays a role in the mental activity of deliberation which is defined as the alternation of hope and fear with appetites and aversion (Leviathan, 39, I.VI.49). Hope—a term which Hobbes often uses more or less synonymously with (justified) expectation—plays an important role in the political application of his moral psychology: not only is the equality in the state of nature defined as an equality of hope (Leviathan, 83, I.XIII.3)—which makes it rational for everyone to pursue their individual advantage—the laws of nature also command one to seek peace where one has hope for obtaining it (Leviathan, 87, I.XIV.4). Both the collective agency problem in the state of nature and the solution to it thus depend on what hopes individuals can rationally entertain.

Baruch de Spinoza defines the passion of hope as a form of pleasure (Ethics III, P18, Spinoza [1677] 1985: 505) or joy that is mingled with sadness (due to the uncertainty of the outcome, see Short Treatise, book II, ch. IX, Spinoza [c. 1660] 1985: 113). In contrast to more modern definitions, Spinoza distinguishes the pleasure that is involved in hope from desire. Hope (in the Ethics) is thus not necessarily connected to desire, but rather a way in which the mind is affected by the idea of a future event.

In contrast to Hobbes and Descartes, Spinoza understands hope as fundamentally irrational. He argues that it must be the result of false belief inasmuch as it does not correctly represent that everything is governed by necessity (Short Treatise, book II, ch. IX, [c. 1660] 1985: 113). Additionally, in the Ethics, Spinoza describes hope as one of the causes of superstition, especially as it is always accompanied by fear (Ethics III, P50, [1677] 1985: 521). Such fear necessarily precludes it from being intrinsically good (Ethics IV, P47, [1677] 1985: 573). This is also the reason why we should attempt to make ourselves independent from hope.

Spinoza agrees with Hobbes, however, by ascribing political significance to hope. As he explains in the Theological-Political Treatise, the fact that men are governed by hope and fear makes them easy victims of superstition and false belief (Theological-Political Treatise, [1670] 2002: 389); however, good laws can also take advantage of this and motivate people by arranging outcomes such that they can be motivated by hope (Theological-Political Treatise, [1670] 2002: 439). The same importance he places on hope also underlies his social contract argument. Like Hobbes, he argues that the only reason why men remain faithful to the social contract or to carry out the orders of a sovereign has to be found in their hope of obtaining a certain good this way (Theological-Political Treatise, [1670] 2002: 529). Even a people as a whole is always united by common hopes and fears (Political Treatise, [1675] 2002: 700), but hope rather than fear is dominant in the case of free peoples (ibid.).This leads Spinoza to proclaim hope and fear as the basis of political power in the Political Treatise ([1675] 2002: 686).

David Hume’s account is another example of an analysis of hope as a passion, modified, however, by the specific approach he takes to human psychology. For Hume, hope is a “direct passion” that is produced when the mind considers events that have a probability between absolute certainty and absolute impossibility. Hume describes probability-beliefs as an effect of the mind entertaining contrary views—of an event or object as either existent or nonexistent—in quick succession after another. Each of these views gives rise to either joy or sorrow (when the object is something good or bad) which linger longer in the mind than the original imagination of the object’s existence or non-existence. When considering objects that are probable, but not certain, the mind is thus affected by a mixture of joy and sorrow that, depending on the predominant element, can be called hope or fear.

It is after this manner that hope and fear arise from the different mixture of these opposite passions of grief and joy, and from their imperfect union and conjunction. (Treatise, [1738] 2007: 283)

As Hume sees hope as a necessary effect of the consideration of an uncertain event, it follows that we cannot but hope for any positive outcome about which we are uncertain. The uncertainty in question can be based on the actual uncertainty of the event but also on uncertain belief.

2.4 Immanuel Kant

While hope is primarily discussed as a feature of the psychology of individual humans in the 17th and 18th century and, as a noncognitive attitude, taken to be neither essentially rational nor irrational, it is given much greater significance by Immanuel Kant who adopts a much more substantial (and complex) view of the connection between hope and reason, not only allowing for reasonable hope but even for hope as something which might be rationally demanded in certain contexts.

Kant’s definition of hope as “unexpected offering of the prospect of immeasurable good fortune” (AE 7:255) in the Anthropology still seems to remain within the traditional discourse about hope. However, Kant eventually promotes hope to occupy a central place in his philosophical system by focusing on hope as an attitude that allows human reason to relate to those questions which cannot be answered by experience. In the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant states the question “For what may I hope?” as one of the fundamental questions of philosophy, after “What can I know?” and “What should I do?” (A805/B833). This question, as far as its answer depends on claims regarding the consequences of moral righteousness and the existence of God, is “simultaneously practical and theoretical” (A805/B833) and it is answered by religion (AE 9:25). Kant’s account of hope consequently connects his moral philosophy with his views on religion. He emphasizes the rational potential of such hope, but he also makes clear that rational hope is intimately connected to religious faith, i.e., the belief in god.

Kant considers three primary objects of hope in his writings: (1) One’s own happiness (as part of the highest good), (2) one’s own moral progress (in the Religion) and (3) the moral improvement of the human race as a whole.

(1) In the Canon of the Critique of Pure Reason, Kant states clearly: “all hope concerns happiness” (A805/B833). However, it is not the hope for one’s own happiness simpliciter that is at stake, but the hope for happiness that one deserves because of one’s moral conduct (A809/B837). Kant argues that there is a necessary connection between the moral law and the hope for happiness. However, this connection exists only “in the idea of pure reason”, not in nature (A809/B837). A proportionality between happiness and morality can only be thought of as necessary in an intelligible, moral world, where we abstract from all hindrances to moral conduct. In the empirical world of experience, there is no guarantee for a necessary connection between moral conduct and happiness. Thus, Kant concludes, we may reasonably hope for happiness in proportion to morality only if we introduce the additional non-empirical assumption of “a highest reason, which commands in accordance with moral laws, as […] the cause of nature” (A810/B838). This way, Kant connects morality and happiness in the object of hope and secures its possibility in a highest reason, i.e., in god. Kant calls the connection between “happiness in exact proportion with the morality of rational beings, through which they are worthy of it” the highest good (A814/B842). A peculiarity of Kant’s treatment of hope in the Canon is that hope for the highest good is apparently considered necessary for moral motivation (A813/B841)—a thesis he rejects in his later writings.

Kant’s account of hope for happiness presents hope as very closely connected to Kant’s concept of faith. This becomes obvious in the Critique of Practical Reason. Kant argues that in order to believe in the possibility of the highest good—and we have to believe in this possibility, as it is prescribed by the categorical imperative—we have to believe in or postulate the existence of god and immortality of the soul. Kant himself uses both the concept of belief or faith and the concept of hope in explaining the content of the postulate of immortality: we must presuppose immortality in order to conceive of the highest good as “practically possible” and we may therefore “hope for a further uninterrupted continuance of this [moral] progress, however long his existence may last, even beyond this life” (AE 5:123). Thus, Kant can be understood as arguing in favor of a traditional religious form of hope—hope for a life after death or immortality of the soul. However, he points out that immortality is not a ‘mere’ hope (i.e., a hope for an outcome where we lack evidence for the claim that it is really possible), but that reason makes it necessary (as a consequence of the categorical imperative) to assume that immortality is possible. This claim that it is rationally necessary to assume something seems to be stronger than the claim that we may (or even must) hope for it.

Whereas some Kant interpreters do not clearly distinguish between hope and faith (Rossi 1982, Flikschuh 2010), Andrew Chignell emphasizes that hope is an attitude that is distinct from faith or belief and that Kant follows an “assert-the-stronger” policy: he asserts the strongest justified attitude towards p (justified belief), even if one holds also weaker attitudes towards p (hope) (Chignell 2013: 198). O’Neill interprets Kant as holding that hope provides a reason for religious belief: Belief in God and immortality is not “merely possible”, but a matter of “taking a hopeful view of human destiny” (O’Neill 1996: 281). According to O’Neill, the reason for faith is the hope that moral action is successful, i.e., that our moral intention can make a difference to the natural order.

Another possible interpretation is that Kant uses “hope” to describe a certain kind of belief. Such a belief would refer to an object that is theoretically possible, but in regard to which it is undecidable whether it exists and practically necessary to assume its existence. He holds that there can be practical (moral) reasons—that the highest good must be realizable—that make hope (for god’s existence and immortality) not only valuable and rational, but even rationally required.

(2) In the Religion, Kant envisages one’s own moral progress as an object of hope. He assumes that human beings have a propensity to evil, i.e., they occasionally prioritize maxims of self-love over moral ones (see AE 6:32). Consequently, our task as moral agents is to perform a “revolution of the will” by adopting the moral law as one’s fundamental maxim. This revolution is an object of hope:

Man cannot attain naturally to assurance concerning such a [moral] revolution… for the deeps of the heart (the subjective first grounds of his maxim) are inscrutable to him. Yet he must be able to hope through his own efforts to reach the road which leads hither…because he ought to become a good man. (AE 6:46, see also 6:48, translation from Kant [1793] 1960: 51)

Kant claims that this hope may include the hope for divine assistance in performing the revolution (AE 6:171). But if Kant is understood as claiming that we require assistance from God in order to become morally good (Chignell 2013: 212ff.), this claim stands in tension with Kant’s fundamental assumption that human beings are free and fully responsible for being good or evil. Chignell therefore proposes that Kant might

regard it as metaphysically possible for us to receive divine assistance in the intelligible realm while doing something for which we are fully responsible. (Chignell 2013: 216)

(3) In his political and historical writings, Kant considers another object of reasonable hope: the hope for historical progress towards a morally better, peaceful future. We find a similar relationship between rational belief and hope as with regard to God and immortality: Kant sees the moral improvement of the human race both as an object of an assumption or rational belief, which is connected to a moral duty, and an object of hope (AE 8:309). Similar to the objects of the practical postulates, God and immortality, the assumption of moral improvement of the human race cannot be proven. Nevertheless, it is rational to believe or hope for it because it is a necessary presupposition for a moral duty (the duty to help morally improve the younger generation). Kant assigns “hope for better times” an important function for moral motivation by claiming that without it, the desire to benefit the common good would “never have warmed the human heart” (AE 8:309). Viewing human history with a “confirmation bias” (Kleingeld 2012: 175), i.e., with a view on the realization of moral demands, encourages the attempt to fighting evils “instead of succumbing to despair” (ibid.).

Independently of these systematic issues regarding hope in Kant’s philosophy, it is worth summarizing some general features that Kant touches upon concerning hope. Regarding a descriptive account of what it means that a person hopes that p, one can extract two necessary conditions from Kant’s remarks that are in line with the standard account of hope: the object of hope must be uncertain, and the person must wish for it. Both conditions are can be found in the following passage from Perpetual Peace:

[R]eason is not enlightened enough to survey the entire series of predetermining causes that foretell with certainty the happy or unhappy consequences of humankind’s activities in accordance with the mechanism of nature (although it does let us hope that these will be in accord with our wishes). (AE 8:370)

In regard to the normative conditions under which hope is rational, in Theory and Practice Kant claims that a particular hope (or intention formed on the basis of hope) is not irrational as long as its object cannot be proven to be impossible (AE 8:309f.). Besides this negative criterion, the main positive reason Kant considers in favor of hope is that certain hopes are (necessarily) connected with a moral duty. Therefore, even though the third question of philosophy is “For what may I hope?”, Kant in many passages discusses for what we must hope (see O’Neill 1996: 285).

2.5 Post-Kantian Philosophy and Existentialism

In Post-Kantian philosophy, the role of hope is disputed. One can identify two more or less distinct approaches. On the one hand, there are authors like Arthur Schopenhauer, Friedrich Nietzsche and Albert Camus who reject hope, not so much as epistemically irrational but as expression of a misguided relationship to the world that is unable to face the demands of human existence. On the other hand, authors like Søren Kierkegaard and Gabriel Marcel take hope to be a means to overcome the limitations of ordinary experience.

Kierkegaard examines hope primarily as it is connected to religious faith. However, whereas Kant aims to show that our belief in god and hope for the highest good is possible within the limits of reason, Kierkegaard is keen to emphasize that (eternal) hope must transcend all understanding. As an antipode to despair, hope plays a positive role in Kierkegaard’s work, culminating in his admonition: “a person’s whole life should be the time of hope!” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 251). In Works of Love, Kierkegaard defines hope in its most general form as a relation to the possibility of the good: “To relate oneself expectantly to the possibility of the good is to hope” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 249).

Most interpreters of Kierkegaard emphasize a distinction between “heavenly” (or eternal) hope and “earthly” (or temporal) hope (Bernier 2015; Fremstedal 2012; McDonald 2014). In some passages, Kierkegaard indeed seems to assume that there is also “natural hope” (Kierkegaard [1851] 1990: 82) or hope “for some earthly advantage” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 261). However, strictly speaking, Kierkegaard considers this the “wrong language usage” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 261). He completes his definition as follows: “To relate oneself expectantly to the possibility of the good is to hope, which cannot be any temporal expectancy but is an eternal hope” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 249). On Kierkegaard’s view, hope—strictly speaking—is thus always directed towards the eternal, “since hope pertains to the possibility of the good, and thereby to the eternal” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 249). This is connected to Kierkegaard’s account of time. Hope, as a form of expectation, is an attitude towards the possible. While expectation, generally speaking, relates to the possibility of both good and evil (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 249), hope relates only to the possibility of good. The possibility of the good, on Kierkegaard’s account, is a feature of the eternal (“in time, the eternal is the possible, the future”).

While the expectation of earthly goods is often disappointed—either because it is fulfilled too late or not at all (Kierkegaard [1843–1844] 1990: 215)—eternal hope cannot in principle be disappointed (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 261–3, Kierkegaard [1843–1844] 1990: 216). Eternal hope means “at every moment always to hope all things” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 249). Kierkegaard mostly equates eternal hope with Christian hope (McDonald 2014: 164).

In order to understand the relation between earthly and heavenly hope, it is helpful to consider the dialectical progression of hope that Kierkegaard presents in the Nachlaß (Malantschuk (ed.) 1978: 247). There is a kind of hope that occurs spontaneously in youth, which appears to be a pre-reflexive hope, a kind of immediate trust or confidence (Fremstedal 2012: 52). It is followed by the “supportive calculation of the understanding”, i.e., by hope involving the reflection about the probability of the hoped-for outcome. This (earthly) hope is often disappointed by the lateness or non-arrival of the expected goods. This disappointment is necessary in order to acquire eternal hope, which “is against hope, because according to that purely natural hope there was no more hope; consequently this hope is against hope” (Kierkegaard [1851] 1990: 82). Kierkegaard’s interpretation of Abraham’s story in Fear and Trembling can be understood as illustration of this kind of hope (Lippitt 2015).

Whereas earthly hope is judged by the understanding according to its probability, eternal hope exceeds the limits of understanding. It is therefore commonly judged as irrational or as “lunacy” (Kierkegaard [1851] 1990: 83). Kierkegaard does not explicitly take up the question of when hope is rational—presumably because eternal hope exceeds reason—but he frames the question of good or bad hope in terms of “honor” and “shame” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 260f.). He observes that a person who entertained an earthly hope that has not been fulfilled is very often criticized as imprudent (or “put to shame” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 260)) because this is supposed to show that she “miscalculated” (ibid.). Kierkegaard objects to this perspective of “sagacity” that judges hope only with regard to its fulfillment. Rather, we should pay attention to the value of the hoped-for ends (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 261). Eternal hope, on this account, “is never put to shame” (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 260, see also 263). Further, and in line with the Christian tradition, he argues that the value of hope depends on its relation to love: we hope for ourselves if and only if we hope for others, and only to the same degree. Love

is the middle term: without love, no hope for oneself; with love, hope for all others—and to the same degree one hopes for oneself, to the same degree one hopes for others, since to the same degree one is loving. (Kierkegaard [1847] 1995: 260)

Thus, similarly as in Kant’s account, one’s hope stands in a proportional relationship with an ethical demand. However, Kierkegaard does not see hope limited by our meeting an ethical demand.

Rather, Kierkegaard sees the proportional relation as determining whether we are in fact hoping, and the actual degree of our expectancy. Our hope for ourselves is only realizable in and through our hope for another. (Bernier 2015: 315)

As already mentioned, Schopenhauer represents the opposite approach in post-Kantian philosophy. Even though he holds that it is natural for humans to hope (Parerga and Paralipomena II, 1851: §313), he also claims that we generally ought to hope less than we are inclined to, calling hope a “folly of the heart” (ibid.). Ambivalent remarks concerning the value of hope (he interprets Pandora’s box as containing all the goods, Parerga and Paralipomena II, 1851: §200) can be found throughout his writings, but on the whole, criticism prevails. There are two aspects to his critical evaluation of hope: hope’s influence on the intellect and its role for happiness. In Schopenhauer’s dichotomy of the will and the intellect, hope is an expression of the will or, more precisely, an inclination. One reason why hope is problematic with respect to its influence on the intellect is that it presents what we wish for as probable (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 2, [1818] 1958: 216, 218). Schopenhauer concedes that hope sharpens our perception insofar as it makes certain features of the world salient. But he links this thesis to the stronger claim that hope may make it (often) impossible to grasp things that are relevant. Hope thus distorts cognition in a problematic way because it hinders the intellect to grasp the truth. However, Schopenhauer also concedes the possibility of a positive effect of hope, namely as motivation and support of the intellect (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 2, [1818] 1958: 221).

With regard to its contribution to personal happiness, Schopenhauer mentions a positive role of hope in his comparison of the life of animals with that of humans. He states that animals experience less pleasure than humans, because they lack hope and therefore the pleasures of anticipation. But hope can not only lead to disappointment when the hoped-for object is not realized, it can even be disappointing when it is fulfilled if the outcome does not provide as much satisfaction as to be expected (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 2 [1818] 1958: 573). Schopenhauer also criticizes Kant’s idea that we may hope for our own happiness in proportion to our moral conduct (the highest good). This conception of hope, according to Schopenhauer, leads Kant to remain implicitly committed to a form of eudaimonism (Basis of Morality II, §3, 34).

Thus, even though Schopenhauer occasionally hints at positive aspects of hope, his overall evaluation of hope is negative. This is consistent with his view that life is filled with unavoidable frustration and suffering, and that suffering can be reduced only by getting rid of one’s desires. Ideally, this amounts to the “negation of the will to life” (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 1, [1818] 2010: 405). The “temptations of hope” (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 1, [1818] 2010: 419) function as obstacles for the negation of the will, whereas hopelessness can help to transform one’s mind and acquire “genuine goodness and purity of mind” (The World as Will and Representation, vol. 1, [1818] 2010: 420). Interestingly, Schopenhauer does have sympathies with the idea of salvation, which lies in the denial of the will (Schopenhauer [1818] 1958: 610), that is, he seems to subscribe to a kind of transcendent hope for an end of all suffering (Schulz 2002: 125). Even though he does not say so, one could characterize his view as a “hope for the end of hope”.

Nietzsche is perhaps the most famous critic of hope in the post-Kantian tradition. In the third preface to Zarathustra, he warns: “do not believe those who speak to you of extraterrestrial hopes!” (Zarathustra, [1883–85] 2006: 6) Similarly, in Beyond Good and Evil (1886) he opposes all notions of hope “in hidden harmonies, in future blessedness and justice” (Beyond Good and Evil, [1886] 2008: 562). In his interpretation of Pandora’s myth (Human, All Too Human, 1878: §71), he calls hope “the worst of all evils because it prolongs the torments of man”. However, a closer look reveals that, outside of his criticism of religious and metaphysical hopes, he also hints at a positive perspective on hope: “that mankind be redeemed from revenge: that to me is the bridge to the highest hope and a rainbow after long thunderstorms” (Zarathustra, [1883–85] 2006: 77). Nietzsche counts hope amongst the “strong emotions” (Nietzsche [1887] 2006: 103), next to anger, fear, voluptuousness and revenge. Furthermore, he repeatedly characterizes hope using the metaphor of a rainbow: “hope is the rainbow over the cascading stream of life” [“Die Hoffnung ist der Regenbogen über den herabstürzenden jähen Bach des Lebens”] (as cited in Bidmon 2016: 188). However, the metaphor of the “rainbow” is ambivalent. On the one hand, it is connected to Nietzsches vision of the “overman”: “Do you not see it, the rainbow and the bridges of the overman?” (Zarathustra, [1883–85] 2006: 36). On the other hand, however, the rainbow is elusive and withdraws itself—Nietzsche calls it an “illusory bridge” (Zarathustra, [1883–85] 2006: 175; see also Bidmon 2016: 188f.). In Beyond Good and Evil, he finally claims that we should “fix our hopes” in “new philosophers”, “in minds strong and original enough to initiate opposite estimates of value” (Beyond Good and Evil, [1886] 2008: 600). In Human all too human, he similarly envisages change of the social order as an object of hope:

[W]e are only reasonably entitled to hope when we believe that we and our equals have more strength in heart and head than the representatives of the existing state of things. (Human All Too Human, 1878: §443)

Reasonable hope is thus grounded in a trust in one’s capacity to bring about the desired outcome. However, Nietzsche adds that usually this hope amounts to “presumption, an over-estimation” (ibid.).

Camus follows Nietzsche in declaring (religious) hope the worst of all evils (Judaken and Bernasconi 2012: 264). His critique of hope is linked to the idea that the human existence is “absurd”. The “elusive feeling of absurdity” (Camus 1955: 12) is characterized by a discrepancy: the human mind asks fundamental questions about the meaning of life, but “the world” does not provide answers. Camus’ understanding of the absurd is best captured in the image of Sisyphus, who exemplifies life’s absurdity in his “futile and hopeless labor” (Camus 1955: 119). The assumption that life is absurd goes hand in hand with the denial of religious hope for salvation. In his early writing Nuptials ([1938] 1970), Camus opposes religious ideas about the immortal soul and hope for an afterlife. In fact, “[h]ope is the error Camus wishes to avoid” (Aronson 2012). Even though Camus is often regarded as an “existentialist”, he distances himself from this movement. One reason is precisely his disagreement with the account of hope of the existentialists, Kierkegaard in particular, of which he says that “they deify what crushes them and find reason to hope in what impoverishes them. That forced hope is religious in all of them” (Camus 1955: 32).

As already mentioned, one kind of hope that Camus flatly rejects is religious hope for a life beyond death. A second kind of hope, primarily discussed in The Rebel, is the hope founded on a great cause beyond oneself, i.e., “hope of another life one must ‘deserve’” (Camus 1955: 8). The problem with hoping for social utopias, according to Camus, is that they tend to be dictatorial. A further reason to reject such hopes seems to be that they distract from the life of the senses, from the here-and-now and from appreciating the beauty of this life. We also do not need hope to cope with the hardships of life and death: instead of hoping for a life after death (or committing suicide), one should be conscious of death as “the most obvious absurdity” (Camus 1955: 59) and “die unreconciled and not of one’s own free will” (Camus 1955: 55). Sisyphus exemplifies the attitude of lucidity and consciousness that Camus recommends. Even though he does not hope for a better future,—or rather because he does not hope for a better future—“[o]ne must imagine Sisyphus happy” (Camus 1955: 123).

Despite his criticism of hope, Camus states that it is (nearly) impossible to live without hope, even if one wishes to be free of hope (Camus 1955: 113). Presumably this claim is only descriptive, stating a fact about human psychology. However, in a letter to his friend and poet René Char, Camus called The Rebel a “livre d’espoir” [book of hope] (Schlette 1995: 130). On that note, it has recently been suggested that Camus allows for a positive view of hope—a kind of “étrange espoir” [strange hope] that is directed towards the possibilities inherent in the present (Schlette 1995: 134) and that is characterized by humanism and solidarity with all human beings (Bidmon 2016: 233).

Whereas the positive role of hope in Camus is at best hidden, it surfaces prominently in the writings of Marcel. At the heart of Marcel’s account of hope is the distinction between “‘I hope…’, the absolute statement, and ‘I hope that…’” (Marcel [1952] 2010: 26). Marcel is mostly interested in a general, absolute hope, which he conceives as “the act by which […] temptation to despair is actively or victoriously overcome” (Marcel [1952] 2010: 30f.). One way in which Marcel characterizes the “mystery” (Marcel [1952] 2010: 29) of hope is by alluding to the connection between hope and patience (Marcel [1952] 2010: 33). Hope implies the respect for “personal rhythm” (ibid.) and “confidence in a certain process of growth and development” (Marcel [1952] 2010: 34). Marcel takes up the question of the rationality of hope in asking whether hope is an illusion that consists in taking one’s wishes for reality (Marcel [1952] 2010: 39). He answers that this objection against the value of hope applies primarily to hopes that are directed towards a particular outcome (“to hope that X”), but it does not apply when hope transcends the imagination. Because the person who hopes simpliciter does not anticipate a particular event, her hope cannot be judged with regard to whether it is likely to be fulfilled. Marcel illustrates this with the example of an invalid (Marcel [1952] 2010: 40). If this person hopes that he will be healthy at a certain point in time, there is the danger of disappointment and despair if it does not happen. However, absolute hope, Marcel explains, implies a “method of surmounting”: the patient has true hope, if he realizes that “everything is not necessarily lost if there is no cure” (Marcel [1952] 2010: 40). Being a “theistic Existentialist” (Treanor and Sweetman 2016) like Kierkegaard, Marcel ultimately connects this possibility of absolute hope to the existence of god. Absolute hope is necessarily connected to faith in God and is a “response of the creature to the infinite Being to whom it is conscious of owing everything that it has” (Marcel [1952] 2010: 41).

2.6 Pragmatism

Even though hope rarely features explicitly in pragmatist writings, it has been suggested that pragmatist accounts of hope can be found in the works of William James and John Dewey (Fishman and McCarthy 2007; Green 2008; Koopman 2006, 2009; Rorty 1999; Shade 2001). As Patrick Shade notes, the issue of hope is “implicit in most pragmatic philosophies”, as it is related to central pragmatist topics, such as meliorism and faith, and particular hopes for social progress (Shade 2001: 9f.).

Indeed, James’ concept of faith in The Will to Believe is closely linked to hope. In his essay, James aims to offer a “justification of faith, a defense of our right to adopt a believing attitude in religious matters” (James [1897] 2015: 1). Even though his primary subject is religious faith, he points out that a structural similar justification of faith or trust can be applied to social questions. It can be rational to believe that the other is trustworthy or likes us, even though we may not be able to prove it. Three criteria have to be fulfilled for faith to be rational: the question cannot be decided scientifically, the belief may be true, and we are better off (even now) if we believe. In his argument, James draws a link to the concept of hope when claiming that the skeptic or agnostic attitude is not more rational than the attitude of faith. The skeptic holds “that to yield to our fear of its being error is wiser and better than to yield to our hope that it may be true” (James [1897] 2015: 27). James criticizes this attitude: “what proof is there that dupery through hope is so much worse than dupery through fear?” (James [1897] 2015: 27).

In Dewey’s writings, the topic of hope has been connected to his account of meliorism (Shade 2001: 139). Meliorism is

the idea that at least there is a sufficient basis of goodness in life and its conditions so that by thought and earnest effort we may constantly make things better. (Dewey [1916] 1980: 294)

Dewey distinguishes meliorism from optimism: Meliorism

attacks optimism on the ground that it encourages the fatalistic contentment with things as they are; what is needed is the frank recognition of evils, not for the sake of accepting them as final, but for the sake of arousing energy to remedy them. (ibid.)

The object of hope or meliorism, for Dewey, is first and foremost democracy, which is “the simple idea that political and ethical progress hinges on nothing more than persons, their values, and their actions” (ibid.: 107).

3. The Standard Account and the Rationality of Hope

The contemporary debate about hope in analytic philosophy is primarily concerned with providing a definition of hope, explicating standards of rationality and explaining the value of hope. The debate takes as its starting point what has been called the “orthodox definition” (Martin 2013: 11) or the “standard account” (Meirav 2009: 217), which analyses hope in terms of a wish or desire for an outcome and a belief concerning the outcome’s possibility. R.S. Downie is representative of this position:

There are two criteria which are independently necessary and jointly sufficient for ‘hope that’. The first is that the object of hope must be desired by the hoper. […] The second […] is that the object of hope falls within a range of physical possibility which includes the improbable but excludes the certain and the merely logically possible. (Downie 1963: 248f.)

Similarly, J. P. Day writes:

A hopes that p” is true iff “A wishes that p, and A thinks that p has some degree of probability, however small” is true. (Day 1969: 89)

The desire-condition captures the fact that the subject is attracted to the outcome. Concerning the belief-condition, there is general agreement that we cannot hope for what we believe to be either impossible or certain. For a descriptive account of hope, only the belief of the hoping person about the possibility of the object is relevant, independently of whether this belief is true: a person can hope for an object she believes to be possible even if the object is in fact impossible. While most accounts employ the idea that a hoping person holds a positive belief to the effect that the outcome is possible, the most minimal position would require only the absence of the belief that the outcome is impossible (or certain) (see Pettit 2004: 153 for both formulations).

Most authors implicitly assume that the hoped-for event is in the future. In ordinary usage however, people often express hopes regarding past events of which they do not have complete knowledge. An example is the hope that someone did not suffer excessively when they died. While some authors consider this use of language to be parasitic on the future-directed case (McGeer 2004: 104), others argue that these are genuine cases of hope (Martin 2013: 68).

Another question in this context concerns the concept of possibility that is at issue: It seems clear that we cannot hope for the logically impossible, but can we hope for the physically impossible, e.g., that the dead will rise tomorrow? Downie, for example, holds that logical possibility is not enough (Downie 1963: 249), whereas Chignell does not exclude the possibility of hope for something which is physically impossible (Chignell 2013: 201ff.). Whatever the answer to this question, all views (except Wheatley 1958) allow for cases of hope in which the outcome is extremely improbable; in other words, no lower bound to the probability is required for hoping (Meirav 2009: 219).

Similarly, few authors doubt that the desire and belief component to which the orthodox definition refers are necessary conditions for hope (although Segal and Textor 2015 deny this). However, convincing objections have been raised against the idea that the standard definition provides sufficient conditions for hope. Ariel Meirav (2009) and Philip Pettit (2004) raise the most important objections.

Meirav argues that the standard definition fails to distinguish hope from despair: two people can have identical desires and beliefs about the possibility of an outcome, and yet one of them may hope for the outcome while the other despairs of it. According to Meirav’s “External Factor Account” (Meirav 2009: 230), hope also involves an attitude towards an external factor (e.g., nature, fate, God) on which the realization of the hoped-for end causally depends. “If one views the external factor as good, then one hopes for the prospect. If one views it as not good, then one despairs of it” (Meirav 2009: 230). Meirav links this definition to a claim about the rationality of hope: the rationality of hope depends on the rationality of the belief in the goodness of an external factor (Meirav 2009: 233).

Another concern is that the standard account fails to explain how hope can have special motivating force in difficult circumstances, especially when the probability of the desired outcome is low (Pettit 2004; Calhoun forthcoming). This objection is based on the idea that hope is closely connected to our agency. Victoria McGeer claims that even in cases where we cannot bring anything about to promote the hoped-for end, hope is “a way of positively and expansively inhabiting one’s agency”, and our “energy is […] oriented toward the future” (McGeer 2004: 104). In order to capture the motivating power of hope, Pettit distinguishes the “superficial” kind of hope described by the orthodox definition from a more “substantial” hope (Pettit 2004: 154). He construes substantial hope as acting on a belief that the agent does not really hold:

Hope will consist in acting as if a desired prospect is going to obtain or has a good chance of obtaining, just as precaution consists in acting as if this were the case with some feared prospect. (Pettit 2004: 158)

However, this definition seems to render hope an intrinsically irrational attitude because it appears to require the hopeful person to act as if she had a false belief. In typical cases, a hopeful person does not describe herself as acting as if the chances were higher, but as taking the chances as they are as good enough to try (Martin 2013: 23).

Cheshire Calhoun argues that “in hope we live under some kind of as-if idea of the future”. Whereas Pettit suggests that act as if the prospect has a good chance of obtaining and Martin as if the prospect is merely possible, Calhoun argues that hope involves a view of the future in terms of success. The third component of hope besides desire and belief, according to her, is “a phenomenological idea of the determinate future whose content includes success.” This phenomenological idea, she argues, has motivational effect independently of the agent’s desires. This component is not a fully reason-responsive state, as it has non-rational sources like habituation to success or failure.

In a recent proposal, Adrienne Martin aims to remedy the faults of the standard definition in yet a different way and gives an account of hope’s rationality. Similar to Walker (Walker 2006: 48), Martin holds that hope should not be analyzed in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions, but rather as a “syndrome” with paradigmatic marks (Martin 2013: 62). These marks involve two more elements in addition to belief and desire or attraction: First, the agent must see or treat her belief about the possibility of the outcome’s occurring as licensing hopeful activities, i.e., as not advising against some specific activities. Second, the agent must treat her attraction to the outcome as a practical reason to engage in the activities characteristic of hope. Martin calls her account the Incorporation Thesis, which refers to the fact that the hoping person incorporates the desire-element into her rational scheme of ends. On Martin’s account, the rationality of hope is primarily a practical question. Whereas the attraction to the outcome is (on her view) not subject to rational norms at all, the belief in the outcome’s possibility is responsive to theoretical reasons pertaining to the possibility of the outcome. However, whether one sees the belief in the possibility as licensing hopeful activities and, consequently, whether one takes one’s attraction as a practical reason to engage in hopeful activities is governed by norms of rational end promotion (Martin 2013: 51). In this respect, her account is similar to Pettit’s position, which emphasizes the instrumental value hope has for the pursuit of our ends (Pettit 2004: 161).

A further dimension of value is suggested by Luc Bovens’ (1999) theory. He argues that in cases where hoping has no instrumental value (because we cannot contribute to bring about the desired state), hope can still have intrinsic value. In Bovens’ view, this intrinsic value pertains to hope because hoping involves mental imaging. This characteristic of hope is responsible for its intrinsic value in three respects: First, hope has intrinsic value because mental imaging is pleasurable in itself (Bovens 1999: 675f.). Second, hope has epistemic value because it increases one’s self-understanding. Third, hope has intrinsic worth because it is constitutive of love towards others and towards oneself, which are intrinsically valuable activities. It is in virtue of mental imaging that hope is intimately connected to love, because spending mental energy in thinking about the well-being of another person is constitutive of loving her.

Another approach to the value of hope has been developed using the framework of virtue epistemology. Nancy Snow (2013) proposes three respects in which hope can be understood as an intellectual virtue: (1) hope motivates the pursuit of epistemic ends such as knowledge; (2) hope imparts qualities to the epistemic agent, such as resilience, perseverance, flexibility, and openness, that further the successful pursuit of those ends; and (3) hope functions as a kind of method in the pursuit of intellectual projects. (For a critical assessment of Snow’s approach, see Cobb 2015.)

It must also be mentioned that the standard account does not exhaust the meaning of “hope” as it has been treated in the philosophical tradition, in particular as it does not allow for indeterminate hopes. For example, Marcel’s distinction between “hope that” and hope without a determinate object has recently been taken up (with or without explicit reference to Marcel) by otherwise different accounts. Joseph Godfrey calls hope without object “fundamental hope” and bases his account on an analysis of Bloch, Kant and Marcel (Godfrey 1987). Patrick Shade’s pragmatist theory distinguishes particular hopes and hopefulness as “an openness to possibilities that are meaningful and promising for us” (Shade 2001: 139). Jonathan Lear similarly describes “radical hope” as a sense of a future in which “something good will emerge” (Lear 2008: 94), even though all particular hopes were destroyed, and Matthew Ratcliffe takes such radical hope as an example for “pre-intentional hope”, which is

a kind of general orientation or sense of how things are with the world, in the context of which intentional states of the kind “I hope that p” are possible. (Ratcliffe 2013: 602)

4. Analyses of Hope in the Psychological Literature

Psychologists and psychoanalysts have systematically investigated hope since the 1950s (Frank 1968). In many of these first studies, hope was seen as a combination of the perception of an outcome as important for an agent to achieve and as having a certain probability (Stotland 1969). While this understanding of hope deviates from the standard philosophical account (see section 3) by requiring a minimal probability, it continues to play a major role in the current psychological literature.

A very influential psychological approach to hope is Charles Snyder’s hope theory (for an overview, see Rand and Cheavens 2009). Snyder defines hope as follows:

Within a goal-setting framework, we propose that there are two major, interrelated elements of hope. First, we hypothesize that hope is fueled by the perception of successful agency related to goals. The agency component refers to a sense of successful determination in meeting goals in the past, present, and future. Second, we hypothesize that hope is influenced by the perceived availability of successful pathways related to goals. (Snyder et al. 1991: 570)

On this basis, Snyder and others have developed a “hope scale” that measures several components of agency and pathways perception (ibid.).

Several objections have been raised against this analysis of hope. One is that the “perception of agency” relates both to the past and the future and therefore measures a general trait of hopefulness rather than the hope for specific outcomes. As a response, psychologists have developed further “domain-specific” hope scales (Lopez et al. 2000: 61). A second question concerns the issue of whether Snyder’s definition of hope is sufficiently distinct from optimism (see Miceli and Castelfranchi 2010; Aspinwall and Leaf 2002). Snyder wants to distinguish hope from optimism by linking hope to beliefs about self-efficacy (Snyder 2002; Magaletta and Oliver 1999) and reserving the term “optimism” only for generalized expectancies about positive outcomes. However, the ordinary use of the term is better captured by the idea that hope can be upheld even if one does not assign a high probability to the outcome.

5. Hope in Political Philosophy

While the political importance of hope as a psychological state is acknowledged by pre-modern and modern philosophers and while religious hope for a life after death is a major topic in medieval political philosophy, the emergence of a modern worldview that conceives of history as contingent and thus conceives of the future as a space for potential fundamental change, also changes the significance of hope.

While this connection can be most clearly seen in Kant’s analysis of the role of hope in our relation to human history (see section 2.4), Hannah Arendt makes a related point in passing in the Human Condition. According to Arendt, the “natality” of human beings allows them to make new beginnings in their actions and thus subvert the tendency of the public space to disintegrate into routinized behaviour. Therefore, “natality” is a precondition of genuine political action and a necessary condition for the possibility of hope (Arendt 1958: 247). The capacity of hope and the capacity to act politically are thus essentially intertwined.

In modern political philosophy, hope is significant for both the Marxist and the pragmatist-liberal (see section 2.6) tradition of thought. Both traditions have produced thinkers—Ernst Bloch and Richard Rorty, respectively—who accord hope a central place in their political thought. In contemporary political philosophy, hope is not a central topic, but there are interesting attempts to assess its significance for liberal ideal and nonideal theory (see White 1991; Smith 2005b; Moellendorf 2010).

5.1 Ernst Bloch

Bloch‘s The Principle of Hope is certainly not only the most radical attempt to build a critical political philosophy on a highly unorthodox theory of hope, it also constitutes a decisive break with standard analyses of hope found in the philosophical tradition.

Regarding the nature of hope, Bloch argues that it has both an affective component (as the opposite of fear) and a cognitive component (being the opposite of remembrance) through which it anticipates a state of affairs that not only does not yet exist, but that also is not yet cognitively completely available to the subject. On the affective side, Bloch describe affects as a subclass of drives which are the basic material of his (psychoanalytically inspired) psychology. In contrast to basic drives, affects are self-reflexive in two ways: when agents become conscious of their affects this can add to the motivating power of the latter (Fink-Eitel 1988: 323); and through the consciousness of its affects, the subject becomes also capable of reflecting upon itself. Among the affects, we can distinguish between “filled” emotions (which have as their object something which is already completely available in the lifeworld of the agent) and “expectant emotions” (Erwartungsaffekte) that relate to something not yet available, among them hope and fear. In this schema, hope is a positive expectant emotion (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:111), and in contrast to the negative affects, to which we are subject involuntarily, it is something in regard to which we have a degree of freedom. Bloch therefore claims that, as a free, future-directed form of anticipation, hope is the most human of all affects (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:74).

In regard to the cognitive component, Bloch describes hope as providing new forms of access to reality in a way that defies short summary. In general, however, one can say that hope is always related to the “not-yet-conscious” that in turn reflects “objective possibilities”. The terms “not-yet conscious” and “preconscious” (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:115) are part of an oppositional reading of classic psychoanalysis that, according to Bloch, understands the unconscious predominantly as encompassing thoughts which are no longer conscious or repressed (ibid.), but neglects the possibility that some unconscious thoughts are not yet capable of being conscious. This also leads Bloch to introduce a future-directed counterpart to the concept of repression (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:128). Whereas repressed memories are repressed by forces within the subject, resistance to not-yet conscious thought is to found in the very material or content of that thought, namely objective, future possibilities—events or outcomes that are, by definition, not yet achieved and habitualized and thus not available in the lifeworld for the subject’s conceptualization. This resistance to conscious reflection is also always partly due to socio-economic causes; not all projects are equally achievable in all historical moments and thus their becoming fully available to consciousness is blocked by their (present) impossibility (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:130).

The content or material of the not-yet-conscious is defined by what Bloch calls the “Front”. This concept is related to Bloch’s processual metaphysics according to which objective tendencies and possibilities in reality interact with “closed” matters of fact, such that the moment of potentiality surpassing into actuality always opens up opportunities for the interventions of active decision-making. The right way to relate to these “Front” opportunities is, according to Bloch, “militant optimism”, i.e., not a mere assumption that things will develop in a desirable direction, but an active relation to real tendencies with the goal to realize them (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:201).

Arguing from these premises, Bloch develops an integrated theory in which hope is not merely a subjective combination of desires and beliefs about probabilities or facts, but rather a reflection of metaphysical possibilities in the world and part of a range of human capacities that make it possible to relate to that which is not yet, but which is already prefigured in the objective potentials of reality. In the Principle of Hope, Bloch offers a wide-ranging overview of historical and current forms in which hope, optimism and utopia have been and are captured by visions of potential states of affairs—the list of topics discussed ranges from medial representation of desires, social and geographic utopias to literary and artistic ways in which the possible can be captured and philosophical theories of the goods.

The theoretical framework in which these analyses are embedded and in the service of which they are employed, is a revised form of Marxism. Bloch’s Marxism relies on a dialectical materialism which has two aspects that Bloch calls the “cold” and the “warm stream”: the first designates the materialist insight that all historical developments are conditioned and constrained by concrete, existing material conditions, “strict determinations that cannot be skipped over” (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:208), whereas the second acknowledges the processual constitution of reality which is adequately captured by hope and expectation. On this version of Marxism, hope becomes a central element of the stance of the social theorist and critic. In particular, Bloch understands Marx’s account of a unity between theory and practice in the Theses on Feuerbach to suggest a social theory that occupies the “horizon of the future” (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: I:285) and a materialism which centrally integrates hope. This materialism, Bloch argues in the final pages of The Principle of Hope, can overcome the division between powerless fantasy and a mechanical determinism which underlies mere predictions of the future and guide political action that is directed towards a real, material, objective possibility—classless society—which is, at the same time, still acknowledged to be dependent on human decision (Bloch [1954–59] 1986: III:1372). Such activity, according to Bloch, must be guided by militant optimism or hope. Political hope is thus not only valuable, it is also necessary to achieve social change for the better.

5.2 Richard Rorty

While Rorty agrees with Bloch that hope, rather than knowledge about historical inevitability or moral truth, is an appropriate basis for progressive political theory, the argument that he develops for this claim could not be more different from the one Bloch advances. Whereas Bloch tries to underpin both his descriptive analysis of hope and the dialectic materialism that is to guide political action with a metaphysical vocabulary that aims to identify the ultimate reality to which hope refers, Rorty arrives at his endorsement of hope as an important element in contemporary liberal politics through a rejection of political models that are based on the idea of (perhaps privileged) knowledge or insight.

In Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature, Rorty identifies hope as a central element of a hermeneutic rather than an epistemological approach to philosophy:

Hermeneutics sees the relations between various discourses as those of strands in a possible conversation, a conversation which presupposes no disciplinary matrix which unites the speakers, but where the hope of agreement is never lost so long as the conversation lasts. This hope is not a hope for the discovery of antecedently existing common ground, but simply hope for agreement, or, at least, exciting and fruitful disagreement. (Rorty 1979: 318)

As Rorty also emphasizes in later writings, this hope is not based on any foundations—such as knowledge about probabilities—rather, it is an attitude by which interlocutors express both their commitment to certain forms of future interaction and their belief in its possibility. Although Rorty never provides a formal analysis of hope (the closest he comes to such a definition is his approving reference to Dewey’s analysis of hope as “the ability to believe that the future will be unspecifiably different from, and unspecifiably freer than, the past”, Rorty 1999: 120), his use of the term is consistent with the standard definition. In this sense, “political deliberation presupposes hope” (Rorty 2002: 153). He adds to this definition an important ethical component, however, insofar he focusses on forms of hope that concern intersubjective interactions: to approach others with the hope for agreement is an expression of the liberal virtue of civility (Rorty 1979: 318).

The concept of hope gradually becomes more important throughout Rorty’s work. In Contingency, Irony and Solidarity, Rorty contrasts two forms of liberalism: The “liberal metaphysician” expects social cooperation to be based on scientific or philosophical insight that penetrates individual idiosyncrasy and aims at the adoption of a universal, final vocabulary that then leads to solidarity. By contrast, the “liberal ironist” renounces the idea of a final vocabulary. By acknowledging that only the contingent overlap between “selfish hopes” can be a source of solidarity (Rorty 1989: 93), a liberal ironist also must give up the idea that there is something intrinsically, universally human that will provide a source of solidarity. Instead, we have to engage in an attempt to create solidarity out of shared experiences and interests (Rorty 1999: 87).

Rorty sees the pragmatists, and Dewey in particular (see section 2.6), as the theorists who have best captured these different aspects of hope. On the epistemic dimension, they embrace a form of hope that “doesn’t need reinforcement from ‘the idea of a transcendental or enduring subject’” (Rorty 1982: 206) or “backup from a philosophy of history” (Rorty 1998: 243). On the political dimension, pragmatist experimentalism allows for liberal hope—a hope for a “global, cosmopolitan, democratic, egalitarian, classless, casteless society” (Rorty 1999: xii)—without grounding it in a historical teleology or an abstract utopianism. This liberalism also succeeds in capturing the attractive aspects of both Christianity and Marxism without succumbing to their metaphysical vices.

The most interesting aspect of Rorty’s theory is that the main virtue he ascribes to hope (compared to knowledge) as a basis for politics is that it “does not require foundations” (Rorty et al. 2002b: 58) , and certain hopes may even be “unjustifiable” (Rorty 1982: 208). As Nicholas Smith (2005a) notes, Rorty does not intend this to designate an unjustified hope (hope for which there is no adequate justification, although such justification is possible). Rather, he must either mean a form of hope for which the question of justification does not arise or a form of hope that is strictly unjustifiable in the same sense as hope for the impossible. While there are traces of the latter sense to be found in Rorty’s work (Smith 2005a: 94), he consistently seems to use the former meaning in his political writings. But the absence of a need for a metaphysical justification of hope does not imply that we cannot make a distinction between more or less reasonable forms of hoping. As Smith (2005a: 95) further argues, Rorty acknowledges that hopelessness is always based on the absence of a narrative of political progress. For this reason, if such a narrative is available, this seems to provide rational support for political hope.


The works of Thomas Aquinas are cited according to the Corpus Thomisticum (available online) as follows: SsS for Scriptum super Sententiis, and ST for Summa Theologiae.

Kant’s works are cited according to the Akademie Edition (AE): Königliche Preußische (later Deutsche) Akademie der Wissenschaften (ed.), 1900–, Kants gesammelte Schriften, Berlin: Georg Reimer (later Walter De Gruyter), except for the Critique of Pure Reason. The latter is cited using the standard A- and B-edition pagination. Quoted translations of Kant are included in the list of sources below.

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Work on this entry was supported by the Hope and Optimism Project.

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Claudia Bloeser <bloeser@em.uni-frankfurt.de>
Titus Stahl <titus.stahl@rug.nl>

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