Heaven and Hell in Christian Thought

First published Tue Apr 23, 2013; substantive revision Fri Feb 17, 2017

Behind the various Christian ideas about heaven and hell lies the more basic belief that our lives extend beyond the grave (see the entry on afterlife). For suppose that our lives do not extend beyond the grave. In addition to excluding a variety of ideas about reincarnation and karma, this would also preclude the very possibility of future compensation of any kind for those who experience horrendous evil during their earthly lives. Indeed, despite their profound differences, many Christians (though perhaps not all) and many atheists can presumably agree on one thing at least. If a young girl should be brutally raped and murdered and this should be the end of the story for the child, then a supremely powerful, benevolent, and just God would not exist. An atheist may seriously doubt that any future compensation would suffice to justify a supreme being’s decision to permit such an evil in the first place. But the point is that even many Christians would concede that, apart from an afterlife, such an evil would constitute overwhelming evidence against the existence of God; some might even concede that such an evil would be logically (or metaphysically) inconsistent with his existence as well.

It is hardly surprising, then, that a belief in an afterlife should be an important part of the Christian tradition. Even if our lives do extend beyond the grave, however, the question remains concerning the nature of the future in store for us on the other side, and the various Christian views about heaven and hell are proposed answers to this question. According to a relatively common view in the wider Christian culture, heaven and hell are essentially deserved compensations for the kind of earthly lives we live. Good people go to heaven as a deserved reward for a virtuous life, and bad people go to hell as a just punishment for an immoral life; in that way, the scales of justice are sometimes thought to balance. But virtually all Christian theologians regard such a view, however common it may be in the popular culture, as overly simplistic and unsophisticated; the biblical perspective, as they see it, is far more subtly nuanced than that.

When we turn to the theological and philosophical literature in the Christian tradition, we encounter, as we would in any of the other great religious traditions as well, a bewildering variety of different (and often inconsistent) theological views. The views about hell in particular include very different conceptions of divine love, divine justice, and divine grace, very different ideas about free will and its role (if any) in determining a person’s ultimate destiny, very different understandings of moral evil and the purpose of punishment, and very different views about the nature of moral responsibility and the possibility of inherited guilt. There is also this further complication: in the Abrahamic family of monotheistic religions to which Christianity belongs (along with Judaism and Islam), theological reflection often includes an interpretation of various texts thought to be both sacred and authoritative. But the meaning of these texts, particularly when read in their original languages, is rarely transparent to all reasonable interpreters; that is, not even all who regard a relevant text as authoritative seem able to agree on its correct interpretation. Still, despite this bewildering diversity of theological opinion, there may be a relatively easy way to identify three primary eschatological views within the Christian religion and thus to organize the various ideas about heaven and hell around these three primary views.

1. Three Primary Eschatological Views

Let theism in general be the belief that a supremely powerful, supremely wise, and supremely good (loving, just, merciful) personal being exists as the Creator of the universe. Christian theism is, of course, more specific than that, and Christian theists typically make the following two-fold assumption: first, that the highest possible good for created persons (true blessedness, if you will) requires that they enter into a proper relationship (or even a kind of union) with their Creator, and second, that a life wholly apart from any implicit experience of God would be a terrifying evil (see note 11). As C. S. Lewis once put it, union with the divine “Nature is bliss and separation from it [an objective] horror” (1955, 232). Although most Christians would probably agree with this, some may want additional clarity on the nature of the union and the separation in question here. But in any case, whereas heaven is in general thought of as a realm in which people experience the bliss of perfect fellowship and harmony with God and with each other, hell is in general thought of as a realm in which people experience the greatest possible estrangement from God, the greatest possible sense of alienation, and perhaps also an intense hatred of everyone including themselves.

The ideas of heaven and hell are also closely associated with the religious idea of salvation, which in turn rests upon a theological interpretation of the human condition. Even the non-religious can perhaps agree that, for whatever reason, we humans begin our earthly lives with many imperfections and with no (conscious) awareness of God. We also emerge and begin making choices in a context of ambiguity, ignorance, and misperception, and behind our earliest choices lie a host of genetically determined inclinations and environmental (including social and cultural) influences. As young children, moreover, we initially pursue our own needs and interests as we perceive (or misperceive) them. So the context in which we humans emerge with a first person perspective and then begin developing into minimally rational agents virtually guarantees, it seems, that we would repeatedly misconstrue our own interests and pursue them in misguided ways; it also includes many sources of misery, at least some of which—the horror of war, horrifying examples of inhumanity to children, people striving to benefit themselves at the expense of others, etc.—are the product of misguided human choices. But other sources include such non-moral evils as natural disasters, sickness, and especially physical death itself.

Clearly, then, we all encounter in our natural environment many threats to our immediate welfare and many obstacles, some of our own making and some not, to enduring happiness. The Christian interpretation of this human condition thus postulates an initial estrangement from God, and the Christian religion then offers a prescription for how we can be saved from such estrangement; it teaches in particular that God is at work reconciling “the world” to himself (see 2 Cor. 5:19). But Christians also disagree among themselves concerning the extent and ultimate success of God’s saving activity among human beings. Some believe that God will positively reject unrepentant sinners after a given deadline, typically thought of as the moment of physical death, and actively punish them forever after; others believe that God would never reject any of his own loved ones even though some of them may freely reject him forever, thereby placing themselves in a kind of self-created hell; and still others believe that God’s love will triumph in the end and will successfully reconcile to himself all of those whom he has loved into existence in the first place. So one way to organize our thinking here is against the backdrop of the following inconsistent set of three propositions:

  1. All humans are equal objects of God’s unconditional love in the sense that God sincerely wills or desires to reconcile each one of them to himself and thus to prepare each one of them for the bliss of union with him.
  2. Almighty God will triumph in the end and successfully reconcile to himself each person whose reconciliation he sincerely wills or desires.
  3. Some humans will never be reconciled to God and will therefore remain separated from him forever.

If this set of propositions is logically inconsistent, as it surely is, then at least one proposition in the set is false. In no way does it follow, of course, that only one proposition in the set is false, and neither does it follow that at least two of them are true. But if someone does accept any two of these propositions, as virtually every mainline Christian theologian does, then such a person has no choice but to reject the third.[1] It is typically rather easy, moreover, to determine which proposition a given theologian ultimately rejects, and we can therefore classify theologians according to which of these propositions they do reject. So that leaves exactly three primary eschatological views. Because the Augustinians, named after St. Augustine of Hippo (354–430), believe strongly in both the sovereignty of God’s will (proposition (2)) and the reality of an everlasting separation from God (proposition (3)), they finally reject the idea that God’s unconditional (or electing) love extends to all humans equally (proposition (1)); because the Arminians, named after Jacobus Arminius (1560–1609) for his opposition to the Augustinian understanding of limited election, believe in both God’s equal love for all (proposition (1)) and the reality of an everlasting separation from God (proposition (3)), they finally reject the idea that God’s desire to win over all will be fully satisfied (proposition (2)); and finally, because the Christian universalists believe in both God’s equal love for all (proposition (1)) and the ultimate triumph of his loving will (proposition (2)), they finally reject altogether the idea of an everlasting separation from God (proposition (3)).

So here, then, are three quite different systems of theology. According to Augustinian theology, God’s sovereign will to save the objects of his redemptive love cannot be thwarted, but the scope of that love is restricted to a limited elect. According to Arminian theology, God’s redemptive love extends to all humans equally, but his will to save them all can be thwarted by factors, such as certain human choices, over which he has no direct causal control. And according to universalist theology, God’s redemptive love extends to all humans equally and his will to save everyone cannot be thwarted forever. Accordingly, a question that may now arise is, “Which system of theology best preserves the praiseworthy character and the glory of the divine nature?”

1.1 Postulating a Final and Irreversible Division within the Human Race

Some may already have observed that the third proposition in our inconsistent triad, namely

  1. Some humans will never be reconciled to God and will therefore remain separated from him forever,

is fairly unspecific concerning the fate of the wicked and the import of separation from God. For if we think of such separation as a state of being estranged or alienated from God, or if we think of it as simply the absence of a loving union with him, then (3) is equally consistent with many different conceptions of hell, some arguably milder than others. It is equally consistent, for example, with the idea that hell is a realm where the wicked receive retribution in the form of everlasting torment, with the idea that they will simply be annihilated in the end, with the idea that they create their own hell by rejecting God, and with the idea that God will simply make them as comfortable as possible in hell even as he limits the harm they can do to each other (see Stump 1986). This lack of specificity is by design. For however one understands the fate of those who supposedly remain separated from God forever, such a fate will entail something like (3). Alternatively, anyone who rejects (3) will likewise reject the idea of everlasting torment as well as any of the supposedly milder conceptions of an everlasting separation from God.

Now when the Fifth General Council of the Christian church condemned the doctrine of universal reconciliation in 553 CE, it did not, strictly speaking, commit the institutional church of that day to a doctrine of everlasting conscious torment in hell. But it did commit the church to a final and irreversible division within the human race between those who will be saved, on the one hand, and those who will be hopelessly lost forever, on the other. So anyone who accepted the Council’s decision on this point, as most major theologians over the subsequent thousand years did, inevitably confronted an obvious question. If there is to be such a final and irreversible division within the human race, just what accounts for it? According to the Augustinians, the explanation lies in the mystery of God’s freedom to extend his love and mercy to a limited elect and to withhold it from the rest of humanity; but according to the Arminians, the explanation lies in our human free choices. Thanks to God’s grace, we ultimately determine our own destiny in heaven or hell.

These two very different explanations for a final and irrevocable division within the human race, where some end up in heaven and others in hell, also reflect profound disagreements over the nature of divine grace. Because the Augustinians hold that, in our present condition at least, God owes us nothing, they also believe that the grace he confers upon a limited elect is utterly gratuitous and supererogatory. As John Calvin put it, “For as Jacob, deserving nothing by good works, is taken into grace, Esau, as yet undefiled by any crime, is hated” (Calvin 1960, Bk. III, Ch. XXIII, sec. 12). But the Arminians reject such a doctrine as inherently unjust; it is simply unjust, they say, for God to do for some, namely the elect, what he refuses to do for others, particularly since the elect have done nothing to deserve their special treatment. The Arminians therefore hold that God offers his grace to all human beings, though many are those who freely reject it and eventually seal their fate in hell forever. But for their part, the Augustinians counter that this Arminian explanation in terms of human free will contradicts St. Paul’s clear teaching that salvation is wholly a matter of grace: “For by grace you have been saved through faith,” Paul declared, “and this [the faith] is not your own doing; it is the gift of God—not the result of works, so that no one may boast” (Eph. 2:8–9). The Augustinians also challenge the Arminians with the following question: if the ultimate difference between the saved and the lost lies in the superior free choices that the saved have made during their earthly lives, then why shouldn’t they take credit for this difference or even boast about it? Why shouldn’t they say, “Well, at least I’m not as bad as those miserable people in hell who were so stupid as to have freely rejected the grace that God offers to all.”

A universalist, of course, might insist that the Augustinians and the Arminians are both right in their respective criticisms of each other.

1.2 Restricting the Scope of God’s Love

We have seen so far that the Augustinians in effect reason as follows: God’s saving grace is irresistible in the end, and yet everlasting torment in hell will nonetheless be the terrible fate for some; therefore, God does not love all created persons equally and his (electing) love is thus limited in its scope. Augustine’s own interpretation of 1 Timothy 2:4 provides a nice illustration. He wrote: “the word concerning God, ‘who will have all men to be saved,’ does not mean that there is no one whose salvation he [God] doth not will … but by ‘all men’ we are to understand the whole of mankind, in every single group into which it can be divided … For from which of these groups doth not God will that some men from every nation should be saved through his only-begotten Son our Lord?” (Enchiridion, 103—italics added).

So it is not God’s will, Augustine claimed, to save every individual from every group and every nation; it is merely God’s will to save all kinds of people, that is, some individuals from every group and every nation. Augustine’s exegetical arguments for such an interpretation, however fantastic they may appear to non-Augustinians, need not concern us here. More important for our purposes is his pattern of argument, as illustrated in the following comment: “We could interpret it [1 Tim. 2:4] in any other fashion, as long as we are not compelled to believe that the Omnipotent hath willed something to be done which was not done”—and as long as we are not compelled to believe, he no doubt took for granted, that no one will be eternally damned. For if propositions (2) and (3) are both true, then proposition (1) is false and the scope of God’s love is restricted to a limited elect. It is as simple as that.

Nor should one suppose that this Augustinian understanding of limited election is totally bereft of contemporary defenders. One such contemporary defender, the Christian philosopher Paul Helm, has argued that God’s loving nature no more necessitates that he extend his redemptive love equally to all humans than it necessitates that he create them all with the same human characteristics. For why is it, Helm asks, “that some are strong, some weak, some male, some female, some healthy, some diseased, and so forth?” He then makes the following claim: “if it is possible for there to be differentiations in the created universe that are consistent with the attributes of God then it is presumably possible for there to be differentiations with regard to God’s redemptive purposes which are entirely consistent with the divine attributes” (Helm 1985, 53). How one evaluates such a claim will no doubt depend, at least in part, upon how one answers such questions as these: Would God’s willing that one person have black hair and another brown hair be compatible with his loving both of them equally and with his acting justly toward both of them? Would God’s willing that one person should come to a glorious end and another to a horrific end be compatible with his loving both of them equally and with his acting justly toward both of them?

In response to similar questions, Jeff Jordan has challenged the whole idea, which he acknowledges to be widely accepted among theistic philosophers, that “God’s love must be maximally extended and equally intense” (Jordan 2012, 53). According to Jordan, such maximally extended love would be a deficiency in any human who manifested it; hence, it should not be numbered among God’s perfections or great-making properties. Neither is it possible, he appears to argue, that God should love equally all of the persons whom he has in fact created. For “if God has deep attachments [with some of them], it follows that he does not love all [of them] equally. And being a perfect being, God would have loves of the deepest kind” (Jordan 2012, 67). Jordan thus asks in a later article, “What if ... it is not possible in-principle [even for God] to love every person uniformly to the same degree?” And in support of his contention that this is indeed impossible, Jordan argues, first, that people in fact have incompatible interests, second, that two “interests are incompatible just in case attempts to bring about one of them require that the other be impeded,” and third, that love of the deepest kind “has as a necessary constituent identifying with the interests of one’s beloved” (Jordan 2015, 184).

Two critical problems arise at this point. First, why suppose that the deepest love for others (in the sense of willing the very best for them) always requires identifying with their own interests? According to Jordan, a person’s interest is merely “a desire or goal had by that person—something that a person cares about” (Jordan 2012, 62, n. 26). But in that sense of “interest,” God’s deepest love for a person surely requires that he actually oppose or impede some of that person’s interests. Why else would Christians believe that God often chastises or corrects those whom he loves? And second, why suppose that God cannot identify with incompatible interests anyway? Indeed, why cannot a single individual identify with incompatible interests (or conflicting desires) of his or her own? Jordan himself offers the following explanation of what it means to identify with an interest: “Identifying with an interest we might understand as, roughly, caring about what one’s beloved cares about because one’s beloved cares about it” (Jordan 2015, 184). But why, then, cannot a loving mother, for example, care deeply about the incompatible interests (or immediate desires) of her two small children as they squabble over a toy and care about these incompatible interests, however trivial they might otherwise have seemed to her, precisely because her beloved children care about them? The impossibility of her satisfying such incompatible interests hardly entails the impossibility of her identifying with them in the sense of caring deeply about them.[2] Accordingly, what a proponent of limited election needs at this point is to specify a clear sense of “to identify with” such that (a) it is impossible for God to identify with incompatible interests and (b) an equally deep love for all created persons would nonetheless require that he be able to identify with at least some of their incompatible interests.

In any case, the vast majority of Christian philosophers who have addressed the topic of hell in recent decades and have published at least some of their work in the standard philosophical journals do accept proposition (1) and also reject, therefore, any hint of Augustinian limited election. However ephemeral and changeable such a consensus may be, the contemporary consensus does seem to be that God’s redemptive love extends to all humans equally (see, for example, Buckareff and Plug 2005, Knight 1997, Kronen and Reitan 2011, Kvanvig 1993, Murray 1998, Seymour 2000b, Stump 1983, Swinburne 1983, and Walls 1998). For a more thorough examination and critique of Jordan’s specific arguments, see Parker 2013 and Talbott 2013; and for Jordan’s reply to some of this criticism, see Jordan 2015.

2. The Augustinian Understanding of Hell

Behind the Augustinian understanding of hell lies a commitment to a retributive theory of punishment, according to which the primary purpose of punishment is to satisfy the demands of justice or, as some might say, to balance the scales of justice. And the Augustinian commitment to such a theory is hardly surprising. For based upon his interpretation of various New Testament texts, Augustine insisted that hell is a literal lake of fire in which the damned will experience the horror of everlasting torment; they will experience, that is, the unbearable physical pain of literally being burned forever. The primary purpose of such unending torment, according to Augustine, is not correction, or deterrence, or even the protection of the innocent; nor did he make any claim for it except that it is fully deserved and therefore just. As for how such torment could be even physically possible, Augustine insisted further that “by a miracle of their most omnipotent Creator, they [living creatures who are damned] can burn without being consumed, and suffer without dying” (City of God, Bk. 21, Ch. 9). Such is the metaphysics of hell, as Augustine understood it.

It would be unfair, however, to imply that all Augustinians, as classified above, accept Augustine’s own understanding of an eternal torture chamber. For many Augustinians view the agony of hell as essentially psychological and spiritual in nature, consisting of the knowledge that every possibility for joy and happiness has been lost forever. Hell, as they see it, is thus a condition in which self-loathing, hatred of others, hopelessness, and infinite despair consumes the soul like a metaphorical fire. Still, virtually all Augustinians agree with Jonathan Edwards concerning this: whatever the precise nature of the suffering, “In hell God manifests his being and perfections only in hatred and wrath, and hatred without love” (Edwards 1738, 390). In fact, according to Edwards, the damned never were an object of God’s electing love in the first place: “The saints in glory will know concerning the damned in hell, that God never loved them, but that he hates them, and [that they] will be for ever hated of God” (Edwards 1834, sec. III). So why are Christians required to love even those whom God has always hated? Because, says Edwards, we have no way of knowing in this life who is an object of God’s eternal love and who is an object of his eternal hatred. “We ought now to love all, and even wicked men” because “we know not but that God loves them” (sec. III). In the next life, however, “the heavenly inhabitants will know that [the damned] … are the objects of God’s eternal hatred” (sec. II). Edwards and other Augustinians thus hold that the damned differ from the saved in one respect only: God has freely chosen not to lavish his grace upon them in the same way that he does lavish it, in their view, on the elect.

So why, one may wonder at this point, do the Augustinians believe that anyone—whether it be Judas Iscariot, Saul of Tarsus, or Adolph Hitler—actually deserves unending torment as a just recompense for their sins? The typical Augustinian answer appeals to the seriousness or the heinous character of even the most minor offense against God. In Cur Deus Homo (or Why God Became Man), a classic statement of the substitution theory of atonement, St. Anselm illustrated such an appeal with the following example. Suppose that God were to forbid you to look in a certain direction, even though it seemed to you that by doing so you could preserve the entire creation from destruction. If you were to disobey God and to look in that forbidden direction, you would sin so gravely, Anselm declared, that you could never do anything to pay for that sin adequately. As a proponent of the retributive theory, Anselm first insisted that “God demands satisfaction in proportion to the extent of the sin.” He then went on to insist that “you do not make satisfaction [for any sin] unless you pay something greater than is that for whose sake [namely God’s] you ought not to have sinned” (Cur Deus Homo I, Ch. 21). Anselm’s argument, then, appears to run as follows: Because God is infinitely great, the slightest offense against him is also infinitely serious; and if an offense is infinitely serious, then no suffering the sinner might endure over a finite period of time could possibly pay for it. So either the sinner does not pay for the sin at all, or the sinner must pay for it by enduring everlasting suffering (or at least a permanent loss of happiness).

But what about those who never commit any offense against God at all, such as those who die in infancy or those who, because of severe brain damage or some other factor, never develop into minimally rational agents? These too, according to Augustine, deserve to be condemned along with the human race as a whole. “For … the whole human race,” he insisted, “was condemned in its apostate head by a divine judgment so just that even if not a single member of the race [including, therefore, those who die in infancy] were ever saved from it, no one could rail against God’s justice” (Enchiridion, 99).[3] Registering his agreement with Augustine, Calvin likewise wrote: “Hence, as Augustine says, whether a man is a guilty unbeliever or an innocent believer, he begets not innocent but guilty children, for he begets them from a corrupted nature” (Calvin 1536, Bk. II, Ch. I, sec. 7 —italics added). Augustine and Calvin both believed, then, that God justly condemns some who die in infancy; indeed, if their innocence required that he unite with them, then the ground of his decision to do so would lie in them and not in his own free decision to do whatever he pleases in this matter.[4] With respect to the unborn twins Jacob and Esau, Augustine thus wrote: “both the twins were ‘by nature children of wrath,’ not because of any works of their own, but because they were both bound in the fetters of damnation originally forged by Adam” (Enchiridion, 98).

As these remarks illustrate, the Augustinian understanding of original sin implies that we are all born guilty of a heinous sin against God, and this inherited guilt relieves God of any responsibility for our spiritual welfare. In Augustine’s own words, “Now it is clear that the one sin originally inherited, even if it were the only one involved, makes men liable to condemnation” (Enchiridion, 50—italics added). Augustine thus concluded that God can save whomsoever he wills and also damn whomsoever he wills without committing any injustice at all. “Now, who but a fool,” he declared, “would think God unfair either when he imposes penal judgment on the deserving or when he shows mercy to the undeserving” (Enchiridion, 98). For the Augustinians, then, the bottom line is that, even as our Creator, God owes us nothing in our present condition because, thanks to original sin, we come into this earthly life already deserving nothing but everlasting punishment in hell as a just recompense for original sin.

Although this Augustinian rationale for the justice of hell has had a profound influence on the Western theological tradition, particularly in the past, critics of Augustinian theology, both ancient and contemporary, have raised a number of powerful objections to it.

2.1 Retributivist Objections

One set of objections arises from within the retributive theory itself, and here are three such objections that critics have raised. First, why should the greatness of the one against whom an offense occurs determine the degree of one’s personal guilt? According to most proponents of the retributive theory, the personal guilt of those who act wrongly must depend, at least in part, upon certain facts about them. A schizophrenic young man who tragically kills his loving mother, believing her to be a sinister space alien who has devoured his real mother, may need treatment, they would say, but a just punishment seems out of the question. Similarly, the personal guilt of those who disobey God or violate the divine commands must likewise depend upon the answer to such questions as: Have they knowingly violated a divine command?—and if so, to what extent are they responsible for their own rebellious impulses? To what extent do they possess not only an implicit knowledge of God and his will for them, but a clear vision of the nature of God? To what extent do they see clearly the choice of roads, the consequences of their actions, or the true nature of evil? Even many Augustinians admit the relevance of such questions when they insist that Adam’s sin was especially heinous because he supposedly had special advantages, such as great happiness and the beatific vision, that his descendants do not enjoy. If Adam’s sin was especially heinous because he had special advantages, then the sins of those who lack his special advantages must be less heinous; and if that is true, if some sins against God are less heinous than others, then the greatness of God cannot be the only, or even the decisive, factor in determining the degree of one’s personal guilt or the seriousness of a given sin (see Adams 1975, 442; Kvanvig 1993, 40–50; and Talbott 2014, 140–148).

Second, virtually all retributivists, with the notable exception of the Augustinian theologians, reject as absurd the whole idea of inherited guilt. So why, one may ask, do so many Augustinians, despite their commitment to a retributive theory of punishment, insist that God could justly condemn even infants on account of their supposedly inherited guilt? Part of the explanation, according to Philip Quinn, may lie “in a homuncular view of human nature itself” (Quinn 1988, 99) or in what some philosophers might label as a simple category mistake. A good illustration of the homuncular view, as Quinn calls it, might be the following chapter heading in Anselm’s Cur Deus Homo: “What it was that man, when he sinned, removed from God and cannot repay” (I, Ch. 23). The implication of such language, which we also find in Augustine, Calvin, and a host of others, is that humankind or human nature or the human race as a whole is itself a person (or homunculus) who can act and sin against God. Perhaps that explains how Augustine could write: “Man … produced depraved and condemned children. For we were all in that one man, since we were all that one man who fell into sin” (City of God, Bk. XIII, Ch. 14). And perhaps it also explains how Calvin could write: “even infants themselves, while they carry their condemnation with them from the mother’s womb, are guilty not of another’s fault but of their own” fault (Calvin 1536, Bk. II, Ch. I, sec. 8). The reasoning here appears to run as follows: Humankind is guilty of a grievous offense against God; infants are instances of humankind; therefore, infants are likewise guilty of a grievous offense against God. But most retributivists would reject this way of speaking as simply incoherent. Whether one agrees with it or not, one can at least understand the claim that Adam’s sin had disastrous consequences for all his progeny in that they inherited many defects, deficiencies, and degenerate dispositions. One can also understand Calvin’s claim that, as a result of original sin, “our own insight … is utterly blind and stupid in divine matters” and that “man’s keenness of mind is mere blindness as far as the knowledge of God is concerned” (Calvin 1536, Bk. II, Ch. II, sec. 19). One can even understand the claim that we are morally responsible for doing something about our inherited defects, provided that we have the power and the opportunity to do so. But the claim that we are born guilty is another matter, as is the claim that we are all deserving of everlasting punishment on account of having inherited certain defects or deficiencies. Most retributivists would regard such inherited defects as excusing conditions that decrease, rather than increase, the degree of one’s personal guilt. So even though the Augustinians accept the idea of divine retribution, they appear at the same time to reject important parts of the retributive theory of punishment.

Third, if, as Anselm insisted, even the slightest offense against God is infinitely serious and thus deserves a permanent loss of happiness as a just recompense, then the idea, so essential to the retributive theory, that we can grade offenses and fit lesser punishments to lesser crimes appears to be in danger of collapsing. Many Christians do, it is true, speculate that gradations of punishment exist in hell; some sinners, they suggest, may experience greater pain than others, and some places in hell may be hotter than others. Augustine even tried to ameliorate his views concerning the fate of unbaptized infants by suggesting that “such infants as quit the body without being baptized will be involved in the mildest condemnation of all” (On Merit and the Forgiveness of Sins, and the Baptism of Infants, Bk. I, Ch. 21 [available online]). But many retributivists would nonetheless respond as follows. If all of those in hell, including the condemned infants, are dead in the theological sense of being separated from God forever, and if this implies a permanent loss of both the beatific vision and every other conceivable source of worthwhile happiness, then they have all received a punishment so severe that the further grading of offenses seems pointless. We would hardly regard a king who executes every law-breaker, the jaywalker no less than the murderer, as just; nor would we feel much better if, in an effort to fit the punishment to the crime, the king should reserve the more “humane” forms of execution for the jaywalker. Once you make a permanent and irreversible loss of happiness the supposedly just penalty for the most minor offense, the only option left for more serious offenses is to pile on additional suffering. But at some point piling on additional suffering for more serious offenses seems utterly demonic, or at least so many retributivists would insist; and it does nothing to ameliorate a permanent loss of happiness for a minor offense or, as in the case of non-elect babies who die in infancy, for no real offense at all.

All of which brings one to what Marilyn McCord Adams and many others see as the most crucial question of all. How could any sin that a finite being commits in a context of ambiguity, ignorance, and illusion deserve an infinite penalty as a just recompense? (See Adams 1993, 313).

2.2 Challenging the Retributive Theory Itself

Another set of objections to the Augustinian understanding of hell arises from the perspective of those who reject a retributive theory of punishment. According to Anselm and the Augustinians generally, no punishment that a sinner might endure over a finite period of time can justly compensate for the slightest offense against God. Anselm thus speculated that if no suffering of finite duration will fully satisfy the demands of justice, perhaps suffering of infinite duration will do the trick. But the truth, according to many critics, is that no suffering and no punishment of any duration could in and of itself compensate for someone’s wrongdoing. In the right circumstances punishment might be a means to something that satisfies the demands of justice, but it has no power to do so in and of itself. The Victorian visionary George MacDonald thus put it this way: “Punishment, or deserved suffering, is no equipoise to sin. It is no use laying it on the other scale. It will not move it a hair’s breadth. Suffering weighs nothing at all against sin” (MacDonald 1889, 510). Why not? Because punishment, whether it consists of additional suffering or a painless annihilation, does nothing in and of itself, MacDonald insisted, to cancel out a sin, to compensate or to make up for it, to repair the harm that it brings into our lives, or to heal the estrangement that makes it possible in the first place.[5] Neither does it justify God’s decision to permit the wrongdoing in the first place.

So what, theoretically, would make things right or fully satisfy justice in the event that someone should commit murder or otherwise act wrongly? Whereas the Augustinians insist that justice requires punishment, other religious writers insist that justice requires something very different, namely reconciliation and restoration (see, for example, Marshall, 2001). Only God, however, has the power to achieve true restoration in the case of murder, for only God can resurrect the victims of murder as easily as he can the victims of old age. According to George MacDonald, whose religious vision was almost the polar opposite of the Augustinian vision, perfect justice therefore requires, first, that sinners repent of their sin and turn away from everything that would separate them from God and from others; it requires, second, that God forgive repentant sinners and that they forgive each other; and it requires, third, that God overcome, perhaps with their own cooperation, any harm that sinners do either to others or to themselves. Augustinians typically object to the idea that divine justice, no less than divine love, requires that God forgive sinners and undertake the divine toil of restoring a just order. But MacDonald insisted that, even as human parents have an obligation to care for their children, so God has a freely accepted responsibility, as our Creator, to meet our moral and spiritual needs. God therefore owes us forgiveness for the same reason that human parents owe it to their children to forgive them in the event that they misbehave. Of course, precisely because they do forgive their children, loving parents may sometimes punish their children and even hold the feet of a child to the proverbial fire when this seems necessary for the child’s own welfare. And if the time should come when loving parents are required to respect the misguided choices of a rebellious teenager or an adult child, they will always stand ready to restore fellowship with a prodigal son or daughter in the event of a ruptured relationship.

We thus encounter two radically different religious visions of divine justice, both of which deserve a full and careful examination. According to the Augustinian vision, those condemned to hell are recipients of God’s justice but are not recipients of his mercy; hence justice and mercy are radically different (even inconsistent) attributes of God.[6] But according to an alternative religious vision, as exemplified in the work of George MacDonald 1889 and J.A.T. Robinson 1968, God’s justice and mercy are the very same attribute in this sense: his justice is altogether merciful even as his mercy is altogether just.

3. Free–will Theodicies of Hell

Unlike the Augustinians, Arminian theologians emphasize the role that free will plays in determining one’s eternal destiny in heaven or hell; they also accept the so-called libertarian understanding of free will, according to which freedom and determinism are incompatible. Because not even an omnipotent being can causally determine a genuinely free choice, the reality of free will, they say, introduces into the universe an element that, from God’s perspective, is utterly random in that it lies outside of his direct causal control. Accordingly, if some person should freely act wrongly—or worse yet, freely reject God’s grace—in a given set of circumstances, then it was not within God’s power to induce this person to have freely acted otherwise, at least not in the exact same circumstances in which the person was left free to act wrongly. So in that sense, our human free choices, particularly the bad ones, are genuine obstacles that God must work around as he tries to bring his loving purposes to fruition. And this may suggest the further possibility that, with respect to some free persons, God cannot both preserve their freedom in relation to him and prevent them from continuing forever to reject him freely. As C. S. Lewis, an early 20th Century proponent of such a theodicy, once put it, “In creating beings with free will, omnipotence from the outset submits to the possibility of … defeat. … I willingly believe that the damned are, in one sense, successful, rebels to the end; that the doors of hell are locked on the inside” (Lewis 1944, 115).

The basic idea here is that hell is essentially a freely embraced condition and the self-imposed misery it entails rather than a forcibly imposed punishment;[7] and because freedom and determinism are incompatible, the creation of free moral agents carries an inherent risk of ultimate tragedy. Whether essential to our personhood or not, free will is a precious gift, an expression of God’s love for us; and because the very love that seeks our salvation also respects our freedom, God will not prevent us from separating ourselves from him, even forever, if that is what we freely choose to do. So even though the perfectly loving God would never reject anyone, sinners can reject God and shut him out forever; they not only have the power as free agents to reject God for a season, during the time when they are mired in ambiguity and subject to illusion, but they are also able to cling forever to the illusions that make such rejection possible in the first place.

But why suppose it even possible that a free creature should freely reject forever the redemptive will of a perfectly loving and infinitely resourceful God? In the relevant literature over the past several decades, advocates of a free–will theodicy of hell have offered at least three quite different answers to this question:

  1. Perhaps the most commonly expressed answer concerns the possibility of an irrevocable decision to reject God forever. Jerry Walls thus describes the damned as those who have made a decisive choice of evil (see Walls 1992, Ch. 5), Richard Swinburne suggests that “once our will is fixed for bad, we shall never [again] desire or seek what we have missed” because we have made an “irrevocable choice of character” (Swinburne 1989, 199), and R. Zachary Manis interprets Kierkegaard, whose view he defends, as suggesting that the “damned are so filled with hatred … so motivated by malice and spite … that they will to remain in their state of torment, all for the sake of demonstrating that they are in the right, and that God is in the wrong” (Manis 2016, 290).
  2. Another proposed answer rejects altogether the traditional idea that those in hell are lost without any further hope of restoration. Buckareff and Plug (2005) have thus argued from the very nature of the divine perfections (including perfect love) that God will always have “an open-door policy towards those in hell—making it [always] possible for those in hell to escape” (39); and similarly, Raymond VanArragon has argued that those in hell continue to reject God freely only if they retain the power to act otherwise and hence also the power to repent and be saved (see VanArragon 2010). Because the damned never lose forever their libertarian freedom in relation to God’s offer of salvation, in other words, and never lose forever the psychological possibility for genuine repentance, there is no irreversible finality in the so-called final judgment.[8] Still, the possibility remains, according to this view, that some will never avail themselves of the opportunity to escape from hell.
  3. A third proposed answer rests upon a Molinist perspective, according to which God’s omniscience includes what philosophers now call middle knowledge, which includes far more than a simple foreknowledge of a person’s future free actions. It also includes a perfect knowledge of what a person would have done freely in circumstances that do not even obtain. So with respect to his decision whether or not to create a given person and to place that person in a given set of circumstances, God can base this decision in part on his knowledge of what the person would do freely if created and placed in these precise circumstances—or if, for that matter, the person were placed in any other possible set of circumstances as well. From this Molinist perspective, William Lane Craig has defended the possibility that some free persons are utterly irredeemable in this sense: nothing God can do—that is, no revelation he might impart, no punishment he might administer, and no conditions he might create—would ever induce them to repent freely or successfully reconcile them to him (Craig 1989). Craig himself calls this dreadful property of being irredeemable transworld damnation (184).

Each of these answers illustrates in its own way how an argument for some controversial philosophical (or theological) thesis can often include a premise that is no less controversial, or sometimes even more controversial, than the thesis its proponents aim to support. And perhaps Craig’s defense of eternal damnation from a Molinist perspective provides a particularly instructive illustration of this common feature of such arguments. For Molinism itself is highly controversial (see Perszyk 2011 for a review of some of the current controversies), and many theistic philosophers who accept the possibility of an everlasting hell nonetheless have serious reservations about the idea of middle knowledge (see, for example, Walls 1992, 37–44). But even if one should accept this idea and should concede, at least for the sake of argument, that transworld damnation is a coherent concept, a natural question to ask in the present context would be, “Why suppose it even possible that a morally perfect God would create a person (or instantiate the individual essence of someone) who suffers from transworld damnation?” By way of an answer, Craig insists on the possibility that some persons would submit to God freely only in a world in which others should damn themselves forever; it is even possible, he insists, that God must permit a large number of people to damn themselves in order to fill heaven with a larger number of redeemed. Craig himself has put it this way:

It is possible that the terrible price of filling heaven is also filling hell and that in any other possible world which was feasible for God the balance between saved and lost was worse. It is possible that had God actualized a world in which there are less persons in hell, there would also have been less persons in heaven. It is possible that in order to achieve this much blessedness, God was forced to accept this much loss (1989, 183).

As this passage illustrates, Craig accepts at least the possibility that, because of free will, history includes an element of irreducible tragedy; he even accepts the possibility that if fewer people were damned to hell, then fewer people would have been saved as well. So perhaps God knows from the outset that his triumph will never be complete no matter what he does; as a result, he merely does the best he can to minimize his defeat, to cut his losses, and in the process to fill heaven with more than he might otherwise have managed to save. (For a critique of this reply, see Talbott 1992; for Craig’s rejoinder, see Craig 1993; and for a critique of Craig’s rejoinder, see Seymour 2000a.)

Be all of that as it may, one’s assessment of the three answers above will depend upon one’s understanding of moral freedom and the role it plays, if any, in someone landing in either heaven or hell. The first two answers also represent a fundamental disagreement concerning the existence of free will in hell and perhaps even the nature of free will itself. According to the first answer, the inhabitants of hell are those who have freely acquired a consistently evil will and an irreversibly bad moral character. So while in hell, these inhabitants do not even continue rejecting God freely in any sense that requires the psychological possibility of choosing otherwise. But is such an irreversibly bad moral character even metaphysically possible? Not according to the second answer, which implies that a morally perfect God would never cease providing those in hell with opportunities for repentance and providing these opportunities in contexts where such repentance remains a genuine psychological possibility. Benjamin Matheson, however, criticizes the second answer on the ground that “we ought to treat Heaven and Hell symmetrically; so if there’s an open door policy on Hell, then there should also be an open door policy on Heaven.” But the whole idea of escapism with respect to “Heaven is incoherent,” he argues, “and therefore escapism is not a plausible response to the problem of Hell” either (Matheson 2014, 200). All of which points once again to the need for a clearer understanding of the nature and purpose of moral freedom.

3.1 The Limits of Possible Freedom

Given the New Testament imagery associated with Gehenna, the Lake of Fire, and the outer darkness—where there is “weeping and gnashing of teeth”—the question is not how someone in a context of ambiguity, ignorance, and misperception could freely choose separation from God over submission to him; the question is instead how someone could both experience such separation (or the unbearable misery of hell, for example) and freely choose to remain in such a state forever. This is not a problem for the Augustinians because, according to them, the damned have no further choice in the matter once their everlasting punishment commences. But it is a problem for those free will theists who believe that the damned freely embrace an eternal destiny apart from God, and the latter view requires, at the very least, a plausible account of the relevant freedom.

Now it will come as no surprise to anyone familiar with Jonathan Kvanvig’s earlier work (Kvanvig 1993) that in a later work he would again adopt “a libertarian account of human freedom in order to provide a complete response to” the problem of hell (Kvanvig 2011, 54). In the same work he also speaks for many libertarians, though by no means for all of them, when he assumes “that some formulation of the Principle of Alternative Possibilities (PAP) correctly describes this notion of [libertarian] freedom (the principle claims that in order to act freely one must be able to do otherwise)” (48).

Note, however, that his sentence in parentheses implies only that PAP is a necessary condition of the relevant freedom; and even if that should be true, it would hardly follow that PAP provides a complete (or even an adequate) description of it. For consider again the example, introduced in section 2.1 above, of a schizophrenic young man who kills his loving mother, believing her to be a sinister space alien who has devoured his real mother; and suppose this time that he does so in a context in which he categorically could have chosen otherwise (perhaps because he worries about possible retaliation from other sinister space aliens). Why suppose that such an irrational choice and action, even if not causally determined, would qualify as an instance of acting freely? It is hardly enough to point out that the young man has acted in accordance with his own will in this matter. For that would be true even if his will were the product of sufficient causes that existed in the distant past. Or suppose, if you prefer, that someone should be at least partly responsible for having become cognitively impaired—as when, for example, a teenager foolishly experiments with powerful drugs and ends up with a scrambled brain and an utterly deluded and irrational set of beliefs. Whatever the explanation for such cognitive impairment, at some point moral freedom is no longer possible, not even in cases where someone retains the power of contrary choice. Either our seriously deluded beliefs, particularly those with destructive consequences in our own lives, are in principle correctable by some degree of powerful evidence against them, or the choices that rest upon them are simply too irrational to qualify as free moral choices.

Such examples illustrate why it is not enough merely to specify a single necessary condition of moral freedom—namely that a choice is free in the relevant sense only if it is not causally determined by factors outside the choosing agent’s control—and then simply to leave it at that, as if there were no other necessary conditions of free choice, which there surely are. For not just any uncaused event, or just any agent caused choice, or just any randomly generated selection between alternatives will qualify as a free choice for which the choosing agent is morally responsible. Moral freedom also requires a minimal degree of rationality on the part of the choosing agent, including an ability to learn from experience, an ability to discern normal reasons for acting, and a capacity for moral improvement. With good reason, therefore, do we exclude small children, the severely brain damaged, paranoid schizophrenics, and even dogs from the class of free moral agents. For, however causally undetermined some of their behaviors might be, they all lack some part of the rationality required to qualify as free moral agents.[9]

Now consider again the view of C. S. Lewis and many other Christians concerning the bliss that union with the divine nature entails and the objective horror that separation from it entails, and suppose that the outer darkness—a soul suspended alone in nothingness, without even a physical order to experience and without any human relationships at all—should be the logical limit (short of annihilation) of possible separation from the divine nature. Within the context of these ideas, two consequences seem to follow. The first is a dilemma argument for the conclusion that a freely chosen eternal destiny apart from God is metaphysically impossible. For either a person S is fully informed about who God is and what both union with him and separation from him entail, or S is not so informed. If S is fully informed and should choose a life apart from God anyway, then S’s choice would be utterly and almost inconceivably irrational; such a choice would fall well below the threshold required for moral freedom. And if S is not fully informed, then God can of course continue to work with S, subjecting S to new experiences, shattering S’s illusions, and correcting S’s misjudgments in perfectly natural ways that do not interfere with S’s freedom. Beyond that, for as long as S remains less than fully informed, S is simply in no position to reject the true God; S may reject a caricature of God, perhaps even a caricature of S’s own devising, but S is in no position to reject the true God himself. Therefore, in either case, whether S is fully informed or less than fully informed, it is simply not possible that S should reject the true God freely (see Talbott 2007, 455),.

A second consequence of the above ideas is an obvious asymmetry between heaven and hell. According to Benjamin Matheson (see section 3 above), a libertarian freedom to escape from hell is possible only if a libertarian freedom to escape from heaven is likewise possible. But even if one should accept that claim, an important asymmetry would remain. For suppose that some person S meets the minimal degree of rationality that moral freedom requires. Whereas S’s having experienced the bliss of union with the divine nature in heaven could never, all by itself, provide S with an incentive to escape from it, as Matheson himself points out (see 2014, 201), S’s having experienced the objective horror of separation from that nature in hell would inevitably provide S with at least some incentive to escape from the resulting horror. So, for this reason alone, a perfectly loving God would have every reason to treat escapism with respect to hell very differently than he would escapism with respect to heaven (see also Morgan Luck’s example in 2016, 400).

Finally, by way of a reply to the above dilemma argument and in defense of his own free–will approach to hell—which, by the way, in no way excludes the possibility that some inhabitants of hell may eventually escape from it—Jerry Walls concedes that “the choice of evil is impossible for anyone who has a fully formed awareness that God is the source of happiness and sin the cause of misery” (Walls 1992, 133). But Walls also contends that, even if those in hell have rejected a caricature of God rather than the true God himself, it remains possible that some of them will finally make a decisive choice of evil and will thus remain in hell forever. He then makes a three-fold claim: first, that the damned have in some sense deluded themselves, second, that they have the power to cling to their delusions forever, and third, that God cannot forcibly remove their self-imposed deceptions without interfering with their freedom in relation to him (Walls 1992, Ch. 5).

For more detailed discussions of these and related issues, see Swinburne 1989 (Ch. 12), Craig 1989 and 1993, Talbott 1992, 2001b, 2004, and 2007, Walls 1992 (Ch. 5), 2004a, and 2004b, Kronen and Reitan 2011 (142–146), and Manis 2016. See also section 4.2 below for more on the issue of human freedom.

3.2 The Limits of Permissible Freedom

In addition to a question about the limits of possible freedom, there is a further question about the limits of permissible freedom. Consider the two kinds of conditions under which we humans typically feel justified in interfering with the freedom of others (see Talbott 1990a, 38). We feel justified, on the one hand, in preventing one person from doing irreparable harm—or more accurately, harm that no human being can repair—to another; a loving father may thus report his own son to the police in an effort to prevent the son from committing murder. We also feel justified, on the other hand, in preventing our loved ones from doing irreparable harm to themselves; a loving father may thus physically overpower his daughter in an effort to prevent her from committing suicide.

Now one might, it is true, draw a number of faulty inferences from such examples as these, in part because we humans tend to think of irreparable harm within the context of a very limited time-frame, a person’s life on earth. Harm that no human being can repair may nonetheless be harm that God can repair. It does not follow, therefore, that a loving God, whose goal is the reconciliation of the world, would prevent every suicide and every murder; it follows only that he would prevent every harm that not even omnipotence can repair, and neither suicide nor murder is necessarily an instance of that kind of harm. So even though a loving God might sometimes permit murder, he would never permit one person to annihilate the soul of another or to destroy the very possibility of future happiness in another; and even though he might sometimes permit suicide, he would never permit his loved ones to destroy the very possibility of future happiness in themselves either. The latter conclusion concerning suicide is no doubt the more controversial, and Jonathan Kvanvig in particular has in fact challenged it (see Kvanvig 1993, 83–88 and Talbott’s rejoinder in 2014, 178–180). But whatever the resolution of this particular debate, perhaps both parties can agree that God, if he exists, would deal with a much larger picture and a much longer time-frame than that with which we humans are immediately concerned.

So the idea of irreparable harm—that is, of harm that not even omnipotence can repair—is critical to the argument concerning permissible freedom. It is most relevant, perhaps, in cases where someone imagines sinners freely choosing annihilation (Kvanvig), or imagines them freely making a decisive and irreversible choice of evil (Walls), or imagines them freely locking the gates of hell from the inside (C. S. Lewis). But proponents of the so-called escapism understanding of hell can plausibly counter that hell is not necessarily an instance of such irreparable harm, and Raymond VanArragon in particular raises the possibility that God might permit his loved ones to continue forever rejecting him in some non-decisive way that would not, at any given time, harm them irreparably (see VanArragon 2010, 37ff; see also Kvanvig 2011, 52). Here it is important to note how broadly VanArragon defines the term “rejecting God” (see 2010, 30–31)—so broadly, in fact, that any sin for which one is morally responsible would count as an instance of someone rejecting God. He thus explicitly states that rejecting God in his broad sense requires neither an awareness of God nor a conscious decision, however confused it may be, to embrace a life apart from God. Accordingly, persistent sinning without end would never result, given such an account, in anything like the traditional hell, whether it be understood as a lake of fire, the outer darkness, or any other condition that would reveal the full horror of separation from God (given the traditional Christian understanding of such separation).

But here is perhaps the most important point of all. If people are free to continue rejecting God forever, it seems to follow, given VanArragon’s own understanding of libertarian freedom, that they will also have infinitely many opportunities over an unending stretch of time to submit to God freely. And that leads directly to Eric Reitan’s argument against the latter idea (see Kronen and Reitan 2011, Ch. 8). For consider this. Although it is logically possible, given the normal philosophical view of the matter, that a fair coin would never land heads up, not even once in a trillion tosses, such an eventuality is so incredibly improbable and so close to an impossibility that no one need fear it actually happening. Similarly, in working with some sinner S (shattering S’s illusions and correcting S’s ignorance), God could presumably bring S to a point, just short of actually determining S’s choice, where S would see the choice between horror and bliss with such clarity that the probability of S repenting and submitting to God would be extremely high. Or, if you prefer, drop the probability to .5. Over an indefinitely long period of time, S would still have an indefinitely large number of opportunities to repent; and so, according to Reitan, the assumption that sinners retain their libertarian freedom together with the Christian doctrine of the preservation of the saints yields the following result. We can be just as confident that God will eventually win over all sinners (and do so without causally determining their choices), as we can be that a fair coin will land heads up at least once in a trillion tosses.

A possible reply to Reitan’s argument, as just briefly summarized, is that our free choices can sometimes create a hardened character, which in turn places constraints on future free choices. But either the hardened character of those in hell removes forever the psychological possibility of their choosing to repent, or it does not. If it does remove that psychological possibility, then they do not continue rejecting God freely in VanArragon’s libertarian sense; and if it does not remove that psychological possibility, then Reitan’s argument remains pertinent. Beyond that, the most critical issue at this point concerns the relationship between free choice, on the one hand, and character formation, on the other. Our moral experience does seem to provide evidence that a pattern of bad choices can sometimes produce bad habits and a bad moral character, but it also seems to provide evidence that a pattern of bad choices can sometimes bring one closer to a dramatic conversion of some kind. So why not suppose that a pattern of bad choices might be even more useful to God than a pattern of good choices would be in teaching the hard lessons we sometimes need to learn and in thus rendering a dramatic conversion increasingly more probable over the long run?[10] For more on this issue, see Swinburne 1989 (Ch. 12), Sennett 1999, Murray 1999, the rejoinder to Murray in Kronen and Reitan 2011 (170–177) and the discussion of character formation in Talbott 2010 (9–13).

4. The Universalist Rejection of Everlasting Separation

Theists who accept the traditional idea of everlasting punishment, or even the idea of an everlasting separation from God, must either reject the idea that God wills or desires to save all humans and thus desires to reconcile them all to himself (see proposition (1) in section 1 above) or reject the idea that God will successfully accomplish his will and satisfy his own desire in this matter (proposition (2)). But a theist who accepts proposition (1), as the Arminians do, and also accepts proposition (2), as the Augustinians do, can then reason deductively that almighty God will triumph in the end and successfully reconcile to himself each and every human being. From the perspective of an interpretation of the Christian Bible, moreover, Christian universalists need only accept the exegetical arguments of the Arminian theologians in support of (1) and the exegetical arguments of the Augustinian theologians in support of (2); that alone would enable them to build an exegetical case for a universalist interpretation of the Bible as a whole.

4.1 Divine Grace and the Inclusive Nature of Love

One argument in support of proposition (1) contends that love (especially in the form of willing the very best for another) is inclusive in this sense: even where it is logically possible for a loving relationship to come to an end, two persons are bound together in love only when their purposes and interests, even the conditions of their happiness, are so logically intertwined as to be inseparable. If a mother should love her child even as she loves herself, for example, then any evil that befalls the child is likewise an evil that befalls the mother and any good that befalls the child is likewise a good that befalls the mother; hence, it is simply not possible, according to this argument, for God to will the best for the mother unless he also wills the best for the child as well.

For similar reasons, Kenneth Einar Himma has argued that some widespread moral intuitions, “together with Christian exclusivism and the traditional doctrine of hell, entail that it is morally wrong for anyone to have children” (Himma 2011, 198). That argument seems especially forceful in the context of Augustinian theology, which implies that, for all any set of potential parents know, any child they might produce could be one of the reprobate whom God has hated from the beginning and has destined from the beginning for eternal torment in hell. The title of Himma’s article, “Birth as a Grave Misfortune,” would seem to describe such cases perfectly. (See Bawulski 2013 for a reply to Himma and Himma 2016 for Himma’s rejoinder.)

In any event, Arminians and universalists both regard an acceptance of proposition (1) as essential to a proper understanding of divine grace. Is God being gracious to an elect mother, they might ask, when he makes the baby she loves with all her heart the object of his “sovereign hatred” and does so, as the Augustinians say he did in the case of Esau, even before the child was born or had done anything good or bad? As the Arminians and the universalists both view the matter, the Augustinians have embraced a logical impossibility: the idea that God could extend his love and compassion to one person even as he withholds it from some of that person’s own loved ones. They therefore reject the doctrine of limited election on the ground that it undermines the concept of grace altogether. Where they disagree, of course, is over the issue of whether the objects of God’s love can resist his grace forever. Whereas Arminians hold that, given the reality of free will, we humans can, if we so choose, resist God’s grace forever, universalists tend to believe that, even though we can resist God’s grace for a while, perhaps even for a substantial period of time (while mired in ignorance and ambiguity), we cannot resist it forever. So the issue between these two camps, the Arminians and the universalists, finally comes down to the question of which position has the resources for a better account of human freedom and of God’s respect for it (see, for example, the exchange between Walls 2004 and Talbott 2004). Or, to put the question in a slightly different way, which position, if either, requires that God interfere with human freedom (or human autonomy) in morally inappropriate ways? As the following section should illustrate, the answer to this question may be far more complicated than some might at first imagine.

4.2 Universalism and Human Freedom

A widely held assumption among free–will theists is that no guarantee of universal reconciliation is even possible apart from God’s willingness to interfere with human freedom in those cases where someone persists in rejecting God and his grace. Indeed, Jonathan Kvanvig goes so far as to describe universalism as a “view, according to which God finally decides that if one has not freely chosen Heaven, there will come a time when one will be brought to Heaven against one’s will. One will experience, in this sense, coercive redemption at some point” (Kvanvig 2011, 14). But in fact, no universalist—not even a theological determinist—holds that God sometimes coerces people into heaven against their will. For although many Christian universalists believe that God provided Saul of Tarsus, for example, with certain revelatory experiences that changed his mind in the end and therefore changed his will as well, this is a far cry from claiming that he was coerced against his will. If God has middle knowledge, moreover, then that already establishes the possibility that God can bring about a universal reconciliation without in any way interfering with human freedom.

Because so many philosophers now reject the idea of middle knowledge, however, the more interesting question for these philosophers is whether a God without middle knowledge would be required, under certain conditions, “to override our freedom”in order to “secure our presence in Heaven” (kvanvig 2011, 52). Is that true? Not according to one of the more surprising arguments for universalism, which has the following conclusion: only by interfering with human freedom in morally inappropriate ways could God protect us from those metaphysical realities that will inevitably teach us, provided we are rational enough to qualify as free moral agents, the true meaning of separation from God. But to understand this argument, one must first come to appreciate two very different ways in which God might interfere with human freedom.

Suppose that a man is standing atop the Empire State Building with the intent of committing suicide by jumping off and plunging to his death below. One obvious way in which God could interfere with the man’s freedom in this matter would be simply to cause him to change his mind; that would effectively prevent the suicide from occurring. But there is another, less obvious, way in which God could interfere with the man’s freedom to commit suicide; God could permit him to leap from the building and then cause him to float gently to the ground like a feather; that too would effectively prevent the suicide from occurring. So one is not free to accomplish some action or to achieve some end, unless God permits one to experience the chosen end, however confusedly one may have chosen it; and neither is one free to separate oneself from God, or from the ultimate source of human happiness as Christians understand it, unless God permits one to experience the very life one has chosen and the full measure of misery that it entails.

Given the almost universal Christian assumption that separation from God (in the outer darkness, for example) would be an objective horror, it looks as if even God himself would face a dilemma with respect to human freedom: Either he could permit sinners to follow their chosen path, or he could prevent them from following it and from opting for what he knows (but they may not yet know) is an objective horror. If he should perpetually prevent them from following their chosen path, then they would have no real freedom to do so; and if he should permit them to follow it—to continue opting for what he knows will be an objective horror—then their own experience, provided they are rational enough to qualify as free moral agents, would eventually shatter their illusions and remove their libertarian freedom in this matter. So in neither case would sinners be able to retain forever their libertarian freedom to continue separating themselves from the ultimate source of human happiness. (For an expanded statement of this argument, see Talbott 2001b, 429–433, and Talbott 2014, 195–198.)

If this argument should be sound, it would seem to follow that, no matter how tenaciously some sinners might pursue a life apart from God and resist his loving purpose for their lives, God would have, as a sort of last resort, a sure-fire way to shatter the illusions that make their rebellion possible in the first place. To do so, he need only honor their own free choices and permit them to experience the very life they have confusedly chosen for themselves. Why interfere with someone’s freedom, after all, at the very point where honoring that freedom would in fact teach a hard lesson and therefore do the most good? Would that not be utterly incompatible with God’s moral character?

However one might answer such a question, the universalist understanding of the nature and scope of God’s irresistible grace is very different from the Augustinian understanding. For the universalists not only reject the Augustinian idea that God restricts his irresistible grace to a limited elect; they also hold that God’s judgment of sin—his permitting sinners to experience the very condition of separation they have confusedly chosen—is itself an expression of his boundless mercy and therefore part of what makes his grace irresistible. If, as a last resort, God should allow a sinner to live for a while without even an implicit experience of the divine nature,[11] the resulting horror, they believe, will at last shatter any illusion that some good is achievable apart from him; and such a discovery will in the end elicit a cry for help of a kind that, however faint, is just what God needs in order to begin and eventually to complete the process of reconciliation.

In sum, opponents of universalism must either restrict God’s redemptive love to a limited elect or admit that God’s love will suffer an ultimate defeat in the sense that his own desire for the human race as a whole, as expressed in places like 1 Timothy 2:4, will never be satisfied. Because the Arminians and the universalists agree that God could never love an elect mother even as he, at the same time, rejects her beloved baby, they both agree that the first alternative is utterly impossible. But because the issues surrounding the idea of free will are so complex and remain the source of so much philosophical controversy, perhaps they can also agree that a free–will theodicy of hell is the best philosophical account currently available for a doctrine of everlasting separation from God.

5. Heaven: Two Critical Issues

Rarely are theists very specific about what heaven will supposedly be like, and there are no doubt good reasons for that. For most theists, even those who believe in revelation, would deny that we have much information on this matter. But two issues have typically arisen in the relevant philosophical literature: first, whether the misery of loved ones in hell would undermine the blessedness of those in heaven, and second, whether immortality of any kind would ultimately lead to tedium, boredom, and an insipid life.

5.1 Concerning the Misery of Loved Ones in Hell

Assuming that love ties people’s interests together in the way described in section 4.1 above, one might then wonder how God could preserve the happiness of those in heaven who know that some of their own loved ones are suffering forever in hell. For the question inevitably arises, “How could anyone remain happy knowing that a genuine loved one, however corrupted, is destined to be miserable forever”. When a reporter asked the mother of Ted Bundy, a serial murderer of young women, whether she could still support a son who had become a monster, her answer provided a poignant illustration of the problem. “Of course I support him,” she declared, as her eyes filled with tears and her body literally began shaking. “He is my son. I love him. I have to support him.” She obviously did not support his monstrous crimes, and neither did she even object to the severity of his punishment. But still, one wonders how this suffering woman—a committed Christian, by the way—could ever achieve supreme happiness knowing that the son she continued to love was destined to be lost forever without any future hope of redemption.

Such considerations have led some, including the 19th Century theologian Friedrich Schleiermacher, to argue that the misery of those in hell would undermine altogether the blessedness of the redeemed in heaven (see Schleiermacher 1830, 721–722; Kronen and Reitan 2011, 80–89; and Talbott 1990b, 237–241). But others have argued that God could always shield forever the redeemed in heaven from painful memories of the lost in hell. William Lane Craig thus raises the possibility that God could simply “obliterate” from the minds of the redeemed “any knowledge of lost persons so that they experience no pangs of remorse for them” (Craig, 1991, 306). Given the widespread theological view, which Craig seems to accept, that billions of people will eventually be lost forever, one issue here concerns how much of some people’s minds, particularly those whose entire family is lost forever, God would have to wipe out in order to accomplish such a strategy. Another concerns how God, as an infinitely loving being, might expunge the infinitely more painful memories from his own mind. But the main issue to be resolved here is whether blissful ignorance qualifies as a worthwhile form of happiness at all.

As a matter of historical fact, in any case, some of the most influential theologians in the Western tradition, including some who are widely admired as heroes of faith, have not only made an eternal torture chamber an important part of their teaching about hell; they seem also to have gloried in the idea that the torments of those writhing in hell forever will increase the joy of those in heaven. Jonathan Edwards thus wrote: “When the saints in glory … shall see how miserable others of their fellow-creatures are, who were naturally in the same circumstances with themselves; when they shall see the smoke of their torment, and the raging of the flames of their burning, and hear their dolorous shrieks and cries, and consider that they [the saints] in the mean time are in the most blissful state and shall surely be in it to all eternity; how will they rejoice!” (Edwards 1834, sec. II [available online]). Remarkably, Edwards was also a theological determinist who held that God determined from the beginning to bring a huge number of people to a horrific end and did so for the precise purpose of increasing the joy of the elect in heaven. He even insisted, contra Craig, that the inhabitants of heaven and hell will be acutely aware of each other’s condition; so even as the torments of former loved ones in hell will contribute to the joy of those in heaven, so the joy of former loved ones in heaven will contribute to the psychological torment of those in hell. He thus made the following kind of warning an important part of his preaching: “How will you bear to see your parents, who in this life had so dear an affection for you, now without any love to you … How will you bear to see and hear them praising the Judge, for his justice exercised in pronouncing this sentence, and hearing it with holy joy in their countenances, and shouting forth the praises and hallelujahs of God and Christ on that account?” (sec. IV).

As horrifying as such descriptions are apt to appear to someone such as Ted Bundy’s mother, perhaps all parties can agree on one thing at least. If justice were to require that one suffer eternally for sins that God himself causally determined, then such suffering would have to be a source of satisfaction, if not outright bliss, on the part of any fair-minded person witnessing it. But since, as they say, one person’s modus ponens is another’s modus tollens,[12] a critic of Edwards will simply reply in the following way. No fair-minded person would find satisfaction in someone’s experiencing eternal torment as punishment for even the worst of sins, particularly in the case of sins that God himself has causally determined; therefore, such torment is not what justice requires. According to Edwards’s own theology, moreover, he was no less deserving of eternal torment himself than are those who suffer in hell. Schleiermacher and many others therefore find it hard to understand how those who receive special favor in this regard could be so deliriously happy in the knowledge that some of their own loved ones do not receive a similar special favor.[13]

5.2 Concerning the Supposed Tedium of Immortality

A second issue concerning heaven that sometimes arises is whether everlasting bliss is even a possible state of affairs. Bernard Williams has suggested “that immortality would be, where conceivable at all, intolerable” (in Fischer 1993, 73). Commenting on a play by Karel Capek about a women who at age 42 receives immortality and by age 342 no longer wants to live, Williams wrote: “Her trouble was, it seems, boredom: a boredom connected with the fact that everything that could happen and make sense to one human being of 42 had already happened to her” by age 342 (82).

Such a statement is reminiscent of a quotation often attributed to Charles H. Duell, who became commissioner of the U.S. patent office in 1898. According to legend, Duell declared that everything that can be invented has already been invented; and even though this wonderful story is probably apocryphal, it nonetheless illustrates in a humorous way the possible consequences of an impoverished imagination. It would hardly take even 30 years, depending upon the circumstances, for a given life to become dull and insipid. But the idea that a healthy person could exhaust all the possibilities for adventure and meaningful experience in a mere 300 years will strike many as simply preposterous. A mere 300 years is virtually nothing, it is true, when compared to a life without end. So the real issue is whether it is logically possible that an unending life (in which one retains one’s identity as the same person) should be filled with unending joy and ever increasing opportunities for novel and meaningful experiences.

Addressing this very issue, John Martin Fischer writes: “Remember [the possibility] that certain … of one’s family and friends also have the relevant sort of immortality. It seems to me that under such circumstances one could live an attractive life characterized by a desirable mix of fulfilling activities” (Fischer 1993, 10—his italics). Might not an unending life even increase the possibilities for such a desirable mix? A favorite symphony not heard for a hundred years or so might be experienced as utterly fresh and exciting. And even if we set aside anything that might raise a controversy about personal identity, the mere discovery of an unexpected means of traversing our extravagant universe, with its billions of galaxies and billions of star systems within each of them, might open up—for adventurous spirits anyway—incredible possibilities for new and exciting experiences. Nor should we ignore the further possibility of experiencing infinitely many other realms and universes that are not spatially contiguous with our own. Pursuing Fischer’s idea of a desirable mix even further, a longer life could also increase the chances for the experience of boredom itself to fit into a larger context of meaningful experience. In caring for her baby, for example, a mother typically performs many mundane tasks that might seem utterly tedious were it not for the joy of interacting with her baby and of watching it grow and flourish. Similarly, St. Paul found even the tedium of prison to be tolerable, so he claimed, because he saw it as part of a larger story that he believed to be both true and glorious. So why allow, many religious people would ask, an impoverished imagination to exclude the very possibility of an over-arching story arc perpetually giving fresh meaning to our individual lives?

Still, all of that having been said, Williams’s view concerning the inevitably tedious nature of an unending life is not that far removed from the religious view that in our present unperfected condition we are not yet fit for eternity and not yet capable of experiencing the most worthwhile forms of happiness; indeed, given our present condition, some would claim, we might even turn heaven itself into a hellish experience. And if that be true, then the task of rendering someone fit for eternal joy may be far more complicated, even for an omnipotent being, than one might have imagined. As many religions including Christianity teach, we must first learn to love properly before we can experience enduring happiness, and this requires that we also be purged of all selfish tendencies, all lust for power over others, every temptation to benefit ourselves at the expense of others, and anything else that might separate one person from another. Right here, of course, is where Williams would question whether a suitably transformed person would be the same individual as the unperfected person that existed previously. But none of our moral imperfections, a religious person might retort, can coherently be numbered among our essential properties—as if we could never progress morally and never learn to become more loving persons. So here, perhaps, is the sum of the matter from a religious perspective: the more self-absorbed we become, the more tedious and dreary our lives inevitably become over time. But the more outwardly focused we become in loving relationships, the more joyful and meaningful our lives also become over time.

In any case, the controversies associated with Williams’s understanding of immortality are also relevant to the problem of evil. For the same considerations that lead some to wonder whether immortality would eventually become dreadfully boring may also lead some of the religious to consider favorably the following hypothesis. For all we know, an environment such as the one we live in—an environment in which one encounters real threats and dangers of a temporary kind, where one person’s temporary welfare may depend upon the choices of others and upon natural forces over which one has limited or no control, where a quest for truth and genuine discoveries about the glories of God’s creation are possible, and where moral failure would likely provide ample opportunities for repentance, forgiveness, and atonement—for all we know, such an environment is an important part of the process whereby God renders us fit for eternal joy. Although the problem of evil is the subject of another entry (see the entry on The Problem of Evil), the relevant point for the topic of heaven is just this: one need not think of heaven (or the coming age, as the Gospel writers sometimes refer to it) as a static ethereal realm in which there is nothing to do. One might instead suppose that God will never stop creating additional persons to love and additional realms for us to experience and that we will always have important roles to play, as Paul hinted in Ephesians 2:7, in this ongoing process of creation and revelation.


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