Feminist Philosophy of Law
Feminist philosophy of law identifies the pervasive influence of patriarchy and masculinist norms on legal structures and demonstrates their effects on the material conditions of women and girls and those who many not conform to cisgender norms. It also considers problems at the intersection of sexuality and law and develops reforms to correct gender injustice, exploitation, or restriction. To these ends, feminist philosophy of law applies insights from feminist epistemology, relational metaphysics and progressive social ontology, feminist political theory, and other developments in feminist philosophy to understand how legal institutions enforce dominant gendered and masculinist norms. Contemporary feminist philosophy of law also draws from diverse scholarly perspectives such as international human rights theory, postcolonial theory, critical legal studies, critical race theory, queer theory, and disability studies.
Addressing the goals of feminist philosophy of law requires theory development, conceptual analysis, and conceptual revision. Promoting freedom and equality for women reflects a profound shift in basic assumptions about the nature of women and their proper place in the world: a shift from inequality to equality of the sexes, along with re-examination of what equality itself requires. It also requires re-examination of the understanding of sex, gender, and gender roles. Given the scope and detail of this change, feminist legal theory proceeds on multiple levels, from the pragmatic, concrete, and particular to the conceptual and ultimately visionary. Some of this writing appears in philosophy journals and monographs, but much also appears in journals in gender studies and feminism, generalist law reviews, and the many specialist law journals devoted to issues of gender and justice. This article begins with a brief overview of fundamental themes of feminist legal theory, followed by discussion of the evolution of views about needed institutional changes in several substantive areas of law: political equality, immigration, and citizenship; marriage, reproductive rights, and commodification of the body; protection from violence; and economic rights.
- 1. Fundamental Themes in Feminist Legal Philosophy
- 2. Formal Equality and Equal Citizenship
- 3. Marriage, Reproductive Rights, and Commodification of the Body
- 4. Violence Against Women
- 5. Equality in Social and Economic Life
- 6. Conclusion
- Academic Tools
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- Related Entries
In philosophy of law, as in feminist theory more generally, methods, presumptions, and approaches vary considerably. Radical, socialist and Marxist, postcolonial, transnational, relational, cultural, postmodern, dominance, difference, pragmatist, liberal, and neoliberal approaches to feminism are all represented in and provide differing contributions to feminist legal philosophy. Moreover, feminist legal theory has developed over time, with concerns such as equality, liberty, dominance and difference, and diversity and globalization prevailing at different points (Chamallas 2003).
Despite all these differences of focus, emphasis, or approach, certain themes are common. Normative assumptions include the equal moral worth of all human beings (and perhaps of some non-human animals as well) and the entitlement of beings of such moral worth to equal treatment under the law, however this might be understood. Feminist philosophers of law also share certain basic criticisms of traditional views of the nature of law and legal reasoning, of patriarchal assumptions as reflected in law, and of the problems that women have in securing equal justice under law (Smith, 1993, ch. 6). They are attuned to the ways that power in society is shaped by the shortcomings of various legal systems as well as to the complexities of improving these systems, including how to decide the meaning of equal treatment under law and how it might be achieved. For example, feminist philosophers of law may disagree about the extent to which law should attempt to prevent dominance within intimate relationships and is complicit in oppression if it does not. Neoliberal views emphasize liberty and consent; criticisms of neoliberalism include the practical difficulties of choice under circumstances of patriarchy or economic constraints. To take another example, difference feminists and liberal feminists struggle with the meaning of equality under law and whether achieving equality might in some circumstances require different treatment.
Many standard accounts of the nature of law hold that law presumes and reflects a world-view in which the goal is to achieve a set of presumptively coherent and stable propositions. Whether this aim is understood as “the rule of law” (see, e.g., the entry on Friedrich Hayek), as the “internal morality of law” (see, e.g., the discussion of Fuller in the entry on natural law theories), or as “the soundest theory of the settled law” (see, e.g., the discussion of Dworkin in the entry on interpretation and coherence in legal reasoning), or in other similar terms, legal systems embody comprehensive and generally long-standing conceptual systems. The coherence of any particular legal system can always be challenged, but on this approach an aspiration of any legal system is coherence. And (at a minimum) the appearance or illusion of coherence is maintained by requirements of consistency, including following precedent, treating like cases alike, and maintaining judicial impartiality.
Feminist critics point out that conceptualizing the rule of law in terms of coherence and consistency tends to reinforce and legitimate the status quo and existing power relationships (Scales 2006; MacKinnon 1989). Indeed, one primary purpose of law as traditionally understood is to promote stability and order by reinforcing adherence to predominant norms, representing them not only as the official values of a society, but even as universal, natural, and inevitable. Law is thus seen as setting the official standard of evaluation for what is normal and accepted—what is required, prohibited, protected, enabled, or permitted. It is accordingly represented as objective—for example, as compelled by precedent and not just a matter of opinion (see, e.g., MacKinnon 2006, 1989; Smith 2005, 1993; Rhode 1997; Minow 1991). Violations, wrongs, injustices, harms, or infractions are by definition deviations from law, and typically also deviations from the status quo. The status quo is the invisible default standard of law. From these observations, feminist philosophers of law have concluded that law makes systemic bias (as opposed to personal biases of particular individuals) invisible, normal, entrenched, and thus difficult to identify and to oppose (Minow 1991; Rhode 1989; MacKinnon 1989). Such systemic bias may be accepted not only by actors within the legal system such as judges but also by its victims as well as its beneficiaries. Primary tasks of feminist philosophy of law are to identify such bias wherever it occurs within the legal system, through methodologies such as genealogical analysis, conceptual analysis, or normative critique (e.g., Bartlett 1990; MacKinnon 1989).
Feminist philosophers of law judge the status quo thus enforced as patriarchal, reflecting ancient and almost universal presumptions of gender inequality. This is not a conceptual necessity; law need not be patriarchal. Law does, however, reflect power relationships within societies. Throughout history, and in virtually every society, men and women have been viewed not only as different, but also as unequal in status and in power. Women were typically cast as opposites to men within an overarching set of dichotomies: men considered rational, aggressive, competitive, political, dominating leaders; and women seen as emotional, passive, nurturing, domestic, subordinate followers. Versions of this set of assumptions have been widely and pervasively incorporated in long-standing institutions from politics and economic arrangements to educational and religious institutions, to aesthetic standards and personal relations—and law is no exception (MacKinnon 2006, 1989; Smith 2005, 1993; Olsen 1983).
A central task of feminist philosophy of law is articulating what equality requires against this background of patriarchy; however, feminists take differing approaches to this problem. For liberal feminists, a primary task is achieving the principle of procedural equality articulated by Aristotle that like cases should be treated alike and different cases differently in proportion to their differences. For other feminists, this focus on procedural justice raises the question of whether there are differences between men and women that the law may justifiably take into account. For many centuries men and women have been viewed as significantly different, and since they are different it has been thought appropriate and justified to treat them differently in law. Indeed, one of the reasons for the entrenchment of sexual inequality is precisely the observation that some differences between men and women are real: only women can become pregnant and bear children. Historically, feminists contend in a variety of ways, such differences were greatly exaggerated, as was their significance and the extent to which they could be attributed to biology rather than being socially constructed.
For feminist philosophers of law, an ongoing set of issues has concerned which differences, if any, law may take into account consistently with equal treatment. There are biological differences, such as pregnancy and birth. There are statistical differences: men are taller and stronger; women have longer life expectancies. There are historical differences: women but not men have been systematically subordinated because of their sex—unable to vote, to own property, or to enter into legal contracts. Women are much more at risk to be raped. Women are much more likely to be responsible for caregiving in the family. Women are likely to earn less for the same work, and likely to be segregated in jobs that pay less than work that is male dominated. The feminist challenge is whether and how to acknowledge certain differences without entrenching stereotypes, reinforcing detrimental customs, promoting sexist socialization, or incurring backlash (Rhode 1997; Minow 1991)—and without compromising equality.
This challenge identifies “dilemmas of difference” (Minow 1991), which occur when a decision is based on unstated norms that presume the status quo as universal and inevitable when in fact these norms reflect a particular point of view. The structure of a difference dilemma is this: there is a difference, such as that only women become pregnant or that an employer has a history of refusing to promote women. Taking this difference into account seems required for equal treatment: otherwise, women will face disadvantages that men will not. But taking this difference into account also seems to instantiate unequal treatment, giving women special benefits (time off work, fast-track promotions) men do not have. So it seems there is no way to achieve equality in the face of differences such as these.
Countering a difference dilemma requires undermining the way the issue was initially formulated (more accurately, mal-formulated). Feminist critics of the view that pregnancy leave is a special benefit, for example, point out that the only way these benefits can be judged special is if the norm against which they are being evaluated is male. If the standard was female, or even human, such benefits could not be considered special (or even unusual) since they are far more commonly needed than, say, benefits for a broken leg, or prostate cancer (neither of which are considered special benefits). The underlying male standard is invisible because it is traditional for most workplaces, and pregnancy leave would require a change to these norms; but in the view of feminist critics, this underlying standard needs to be exposed as male because in fact it is not equal. (Rhode 1997; Minow 1991) Once male norms are recognized as only that—male norms—the presumption of difference must be corrected. If the need for correction is taken seriously, then legal recognition of difference cannot by itself imply unequal treatment. An assertion of difference is a factual assessment. Equality is a political (or moral) standard. One does not automatically follow from the other. Thus formulation of the debate in terms of sameness or difference must be transcended by understanding equality. (Smith 2005; Rhode 1997; Minow 1991).
Legal standards of reasonableness are another area where feminist philosophers of law strive to reveal male norms. In areas of the law from criminal law (would a reasonable person believe that the threat of harm was sufficient to require the use of force in self-defense?) to tort law (did the defendant exercise reasonable care?) to contract law (what are reasonable commercial standards of fair dealing?) to employment discrimination (was she reasonably offended by the conduct of others at work?), reasonableness standards play a major role in law. Traditionally, the standard was that of the average reasonable man, a formulation that overtly indicated its gendered nature. Today, the standard is more likely to be formulated as that of a reasonable person, but feminists continue to demonstrate how this standard reflects male norms. A particular area of current controversy is interactions with the police, where feminists join with many others such as the Black Lives Matter movement or disability rights groups to reveal the biases in what is judged reasonable for police to do and what responses to police conduct are thought to be reasonable (Cuevas and Jacobi 2016). Feminists have also proposed the standard of an average reasonable woman, which achieved one success in court, Ellison v. Brady, 924 F.2d 872 (9th Cir. 1991). However, the presence of a separate legal standard may be criticized as unfair or as fragmenting the law into a variety of subjective perspectives—although this conclusion is also subject to critique as an illustration of the difference dilemma. More recent feminist attention has been directed towards de-legitimating masculinist perspectives of reasonableness and achieving equality in the understanding of reasonableness (Chamallas 2010). Areas of law such as tort (Chamallas and Wriggins 2010) and contract (Threedy 2010) have been reassessed as reflecting bias in their structure, the types of claims they recognize, their understanding of injury, and the compensation they provide. To summarize, a persistent theme in feminist philosophy of law is uncovering how masculinist, ableist, or white norms are reflected in law.
Another central theme in feminist philosophy of law is the viability of the public/private distinction. For liberals, including liberal feminists, there remains a domain of private life that should be reserved for individual choice. Radical feminists raise the concerns that patriarchy and sexual dominance pervade private relationships and there are no clear lines to be drawn between actions that primarily affect the individual and actions that affect others more broadly. Legal structures that permit or reinforce dominance within intimate relationships are thus deeply problematic and must be overturned. One area where this debate has taken shape among feminists is the law of prostitution (see the discussion in the entry on feminist perspectives on sex markets); some liberals claim that when prostitution is fully voluntary, it should be legally permitted, and the role of law is to prohibit coercive forms of the practice. Other feminists argue that legalized prostitution simply allows sex trafficking to flourish in its shadow (Dempsey 2010) or more comprehensively that paid sex can never be fully voluntary (Miriam 2005). Other continuing areas of theoretical exploration among feminists are the weight and scope to be given to any distinction between the public and the private in reproduction, family structures, work arrangements, sexual relationships, domestic violence, and the like; these issues are discussed further in later sections of this essay.
Human rights theory is another central area of concern for feminist philosophers of law. By the end of the 20th century many societies had officially rejected sexual inequality in law, at least as a matter of basic human rights. Human rights are now said to apply equally to women and equal protection of the law is seen as applying equally to men and women (United Nations Convention on the Elimination of All Forms of Discrimination Against Women [CEDAW] 1979). Feminists hail these developments but remain concerned that in many societies commitments to human rights are shallow and laws reflecting patriarchal environments and cultures continue to thrive and flourish.
In addition, some feminists are directly critical of the role of rights. Feminists associated with the critical legal studies movement, for example, see rights as potentially masking underlying relationships of power and domination (Scales 1986). Other feminists, such as those associated with critical race theory, voice concerns that dominance feminists assume an essentialism that silences the voices of African-American women (Harris 1990) and that rights may provide crucial protection to victims of discrimination and oppression (Williams 1992). Similar debates concern rights in international law with liberal feminists defending the gains achieved through the international recognition of human rights and critical theorists joining with some third world feminists to decry the structural bias of international law and the role of rights in continuing to mask oppression (Engle 2005; Otto 2005).
Methodologically, feminist philosophy of law draws a great deal from feminist work in other areas of philosophy and has broken new ground as well. Feminist epistemological accounts of epistemic injustice and the social nature of knowledge are especially salient to many questions about and within law (McKinnon 2016). Trials, after all, depend on testimony. Fricker (2007) considers both testimonial injustice and hermeneutical injustice. Testimonial injustice occurs when people are discounted as credible because of stereotypes such as those rooted in sex or race; it may also occur when people are assessed as overly credible for similar reasons, likely to the detriment of the credibility accorded others (Medina 2013). For example, a woman’s testimony may be discounted in allegations of rape in the face of her assailant’s claim of consent. To take another example, claims of asylum seekers about threats they face in their home countries may be disbelieved. Hermeneutical injustice occurs when others do not even have the concepts to understand what someone is saying, as when a victim of sex trafficking claims she was coerced but police or immigration authorities can only visualize her as an economic migrant. Work of African-American feminists such as Dotson (2011) present especially powerful accounts of race-based epistemic injustice. An additional illustration of the importance of feminist epistemology is the development of understanding of first person standpoints. This work has informed discussions of victim protection, for example (Schroeder 1991).
Work in relational metaphysics has helped in analysis of how legal institutions should reflect connections among people, including care relationships (McClain 1992; West 1988). Many feminist writers in this tradition have taken pains to distance themselves from simplistic essentialist assumptions about the way women think or the role of women as caregivers, emphasizing instead the importance of context to understanding. Feminist theory has inspired and deployed new forms of legal realism—the view that law reflects its social context—to criticize the frequent formalism of approaches to law in terms of economic relationships and rational choice (Nourse & Shaffer 2009). Feminist scholarship on human rights—viewed in the abstract as universal—has also emphasized the importance of lived experiences in context (Halley et al. 2006). Debate about whether all forms of prostitution should be prohibited, or whether there is room for a liberal view that would distinguish coerced trafficking from voluntary sex work, is but one illustration of such scholarship. Legal archaeology, understood as exploration of cases in their full context, is a method developed by Threedy (2010) and others for criticizing the formalism of much legal analysis and revealing the extent to which gendered norms permeate legal doctrines such as defenses in contract law. Feminists interested in criticizing paradigms of rationality and breaking down supposed divisions between reason and emotion have questioned whether there is a too-ready willingness to reject emotions in supposedly non-gendered contexts such as the law of evidence where the rules are constructed to eliminate appeals to emotion as irrelevant—but a too-ready acceptance of emotion in contexts where women are stereotyped and disadvantaged, as with the Supreme Court’s assertion that the state has an interest in protecting women from partial birth abortion because they might later come to regret their decisions (Abrams & Keren 2010).
Intersectionality theory is an especially important recent development in feminist methodology of relevance to philosophy of law. Feminists using an analysis of intersections between race, sex, and other identity categories discern essentialist tendencies that gloss the complexities of identity in the work of both radical and liberal feminists (Crenshaw 2012, Harris 1990). Intersectionality theorizes how locations in multiple socially constructed categories such as gender, race, class, or disability affect how people live (Jones 2013, Haslanger 2012). Theorizing without intersectionality made women of color and other multiply oppressed people invisible; keeping categories such as race and sex separate made it more difficult to achieve justice for persons who were multiply oppressed. Intersectionality creates interlocking and superimposed axes of privilege or disadvantage (Haslanger 2012). An illustration can be found in ways that prison violence arguably tracks intersections between vulnerability and identity categories, with images of female vulnerability both reinforcing sexist thinking and contributing to the oppression inflicted by the racist carceral state (Gilson 2016).
The mid-twentieth century women’s movement—so-called second wave feminism—began as a liberation movement (see the entry on feminist political philosophy). The idea was that women are entitled to be free and equal citizens—as free as men to participate in their societies, to pursue their ambitions and determine their own lives. A starting place for achieving equal citizenship was political equality. Despite the facts that political equality had been defended by the Seneca Falls Convention in 1848 and by and Harriet Taylor Mill in the “Enfranchisement of Women” in 1851, and that women’s suffrage had been achieved in the United States and in many other countries by the early 20th century, at mid-century political equality remained a radical idea that led to some radical legal reform. And it remains a deeply contested concept nearly 75 years later.
While the basic right to political equality is taken for granted in many societies today and is explicit in the norms of international law (CEDAW 1979), in some cultures women are still not equal citizens. Some are unable to vote, hold office, attend school, engage in business, or travel about freely. Some do not control their own reproductive lives, access to their bodies, the opportunity to pursue any life ambition other than marriage, or who their marriage partner will be. Some women have little control over any major decisions about their lives. In some societies they are banned by law from making all or some such decisions, and thereby are rendered dependent on those who can.
One of the most fundamental goals of global feminist jurisprudence is to oppose and reform barriers to women’s participation in the public sphere. The basic premise is that unequal citizenship constitutes second-class status that cannot be justified. Equal citizenship is a presumptive value in the modern world. Problematically, in law the burden of justification typically lies with the reformer and precedent favors the status quo (MacKinnon 2006).
International recognition of human rights has been particularly important as a means to achieve equal citizenship. Feminist legal scholars have been pursuing issues of women’s human rights internationally for many years, at least since the United Nations was officially formed in 1945. CEDAW, adopted in 1979, sets the international human rights standard against gender discrimination. Especially since the 1980s, these efforts have been aided by mass communication, international travel, and the Internet (Rhode & Sanger, 2004). International conferences have promoted dialogue and exchange of ideas on issues ranging from honor killing to labor law. Some international groups (both NGOs and government-sponsored) are specifically focused on (what are often called) women’s issues, such as violence against women and girls, women’s economic viability, or women’s health and reproductive issues (see, e.g., the links in the Other Internet Resources Section to CRLP, Futures without Violence, Gendercide Watch, Human Rights Watch, National Network to End Domestic Violence, Wild for Human Rights, and WomenWatch). The collection of data by social scientists is more accurate and inclusive than ever in history, thus providing better foundations for analysis. Finally, collaborative research and comparative analysis of diverse legal systems and social customs have been increasing for at least thirty years, and in virtually every society more women are available to engage in these efforts and more men have become interested in them (see Jain 2005; Rhode & Sanger 2005; Stark 2004; Sen 1995; Peters & Wolper 1995)
Beyond equal citizenship, feminist jurisprudence also criticizes legal or political structures that would put disproportionate burdens on women or children seeking to live or to become citizens in countries other than their country of origin. Here, feminists reveal how asylum or refugee policies may be based on male models of what constitutes persecutions, discounting forms of structural injustice that disproportionately burden women (e.g. Parekh 2012; Freedman 2008).
The cumulative result of these efforts has been to globalize both the issues and the approaches to them. Providing a global perspective encourages conditions favorable to the conceptual revision needed for legal reform. As nations join and sign international conventions and treaties that increasingly include rights for women, feminists are supplied with a foundation from which to argue that local laws must comply with these international commitments. For example, signing the Declaration on the Elimination of Violence Against Women implies that a nation is committed to enacting and enforcing laws against violence toward women. Ratifying the U.N. Declaration of Political and Civil Rights implies that a nation is committed at a minimum to universal suffrage and more generally to equal citizenship. Becoming a state party to CEDAW affirms support for equal human rights and for elimination of all forms of discrimination against women. Although a number of states expressed reservations in their acceptance of CEDAW, the US did not. Thus, international law and treaty commitments can be used to argue for national or local legal reform (Schneider 2004; Peters & Wolper 1995).
Yet even if the goal of stated legal equality is achieved, law provides no protection unless it is enforced. Feminist legal critics have argued that laws and treaties that exist on paper frequently are ignored in fact when they apply to women and contradict local customs and beliefs (Husseini 2007; MacKinnon 2006). An additional concern is that formal acceptance of treaties may mask failures to implement treaty requirements (Hathaway 2005)
Moreover, the meaning of equal citizenship beyond equal political participation remains contested. An initial liberal feminist approach was to argue strictly for formal equality, that is, to deny that any sexual difference was ever relevant to legal doctrine. This strategy, often called the assimilation model, was an effective strategy for challenging overt legal restrictions on women and legally enforced exclusion (Taub & Williams 1993; Smith 1993; Bartlett & Kennedy 1991). For example, in the US feminist lawyers argued successfully that statutes treating women differently for purposes such as estate administration or age of majority violated constitutional equal protection, following the initial lead of Ruth Bader Ginsburg as director of the ACLU Women’s Rights Project in Reed v. Reed (404 U.S. 71 (1971)). At its most comprehensive, this was the approach of US feminists seeking passage of the unsuccessful Equal Rights Amendment (ERA) to the Constitution, an amendment that would have put sex on the same fundamental legal footing as race.
Achievement of equal citizenship viewed as the removal of explicit legal barriers leaves open whether equality requires more. Even in the United States, much legal room remains for continuing controversy. The effort to establish full constitutional equal protection through the ERA foundered on assertions that differences matter to issues as diverse as military service, child support, or bathroom utilization (Mayeri 2011; Frug 1992). This argument fueled conservative opposition to the ERA, but these issues were raised in different forms for feminists as well. Feminists emphasizing class differences and labor rights were concerned that hard-won benefits for women could be jeopardized. Critical race theorists were concerned that formal equality for women failed to understand the complex intersectionality of discrimination against women of color (Mayeri 2011). Critics of patriarchy insisted that histories of discrimination were central to understanding the functioning of male norms in social institutions from the family to employment to political structures. At present, in US constitutional law what equal protection requires when sex is a category has not been modeled on the strict scrutiny accorded race as a category; sexual differences concretized in law must only pass a level of heightened scrutiny as to their rationale to garner constitutional acceptance.
Across the globe, there are similar debates about what more is required beyond formal equality of citizenship. CEDAW’s (1979) requirement for the elimination of “all forms” of discrimination against women has been a framework for these debates (IWRAW-AP 2012). These debates are complicated, however, by concerns that at least certain ways of understanding human rights norms incorporate so-called western values and are incompatible with legitimate cultural differences. Whether theories of rights can be formulated in a manner that accommodates cultural differences has been given considerable attention by feminist political philosophers (Mookherjee 2009; Ackerly 2008) and is centrally relevant to the understanding of international human rights norms and their role in law.
Nowhere than in marriage is the legal bias towards the status quo more apparent. Yet in many jurisdictions across the globe, same sex marriage is now legally recognized. The U.S. Supreme Court held in Obergefell v. Hodges that prohibitions of same sex marriage violate constitutional guarantees of due process and equal protection (576 U.S. ___ (2015)). Liberal feminists and many others have hailed this decision as a significant victory. Nonetheless, concerns remain about the decision’s scope. In many jurisdictions, a couple’s marriage may be protected but they will not be protected against decisions of their employer to fire them or of their landlord to evict them. It is also unclear whether people will be able to refuse them services on religious grounds; the Supreme Court will decide this issue during its 2017-2018 term.
Still further critics argue that extension of marriage to same sex couples merely entrenches a fundamentally inegalitarian relationship. The view that equality requires extending the institution of marriage to same-sex partners, if it is to be available to opposite-sex partners, is a liberal view. In the eyes of critics of liberal marriage, marriage itself must be rethought, if gendered inequalities are to be overcome (Brake 2014). Valorizing marriage also potentially harms those whose relationships take other, less valued forms, such as asexual relationships, polyamorous relationships, or care networks (Brake 2014). To the extent that marriage institutionalizes problematic forms of dominance, it would seem a mistake to extend it at all—or at least to extend it without significant substantive changes in the institution (Kim 2010). Assimilationist paradigms both recognize the pain of exclusion but fail to problematize the role marriage plays in institutionalizing inequality (Robson 2002).
Reproductive autonomy is another particularly telling example of the ongoing force of gender norms. Feminists plausibly contend that women cannot be free and equal citizens if they do not control their own bodies. Much feminist research has detailed the history and debated the implications of current laws and policies that have allowed or constrained women’s reproductive freedom (see, e.g., Peach 2002; Rhode 1997). Paternalistic attitudes towards women have been identified as shaping the structure of the Supreme Court’s Roe v. Wade (410 U.S. 113 (1973)) decision and subsequent efforts by states to regulate or restrict abortion in the name of protecting women’s health (Appleton 2011; Laufer-Ukeles 2011). Even feminists who personally oppose abortion, or who are critical of some abortions (e.g., those evidencing disability discrimination) typically argue that abortion should still be legal. Some argue that controlling one’s own body is a necessary condition for any other freedom (see, e.g., Peach 2002; Estrich 2001; Rhode 1997; Olsen 1993). Yet together with paternalistic attitudes about the need to protect women from their emotionality and irrationality in the reproductive process, traditional views of women’s reproductive roles have shaped law and policy. Laws permitting abortion remain under attack; many U.S. jurisdictions now have laws targeting abortion providers (TRAP laws), although in Whole Woman’s Health v. Hellerstedt (579 U.S. ___ (2016)) the U.S. Supreme Court struck down Texas’s TRAP laws as impermissibly burdening women’s rights without providing corresponding benefit for women’s health. Feminists point out that analyses of whether such statutes place undue burdens on women’s rights in terms of formal legal barriers manifest legal formalism that conceals the reality of ongoing oppression or inequality of opportunity. The Hellerstedt decision rejected such formalism in favor of an analysis of the actual benefits and burdens of the Texas laws by a slim 5–3 majority after Justice Scalia’s death, but with the addition of Justice Gorsuch one further appointment to the Court could tip this balance.
The abortion issue also raises questions about how law should deal with issues of deep moral disagreement within society. In the United States, the protection of women’s reproductive freedom from restriction by government was initially based on the right to privacy and is now understood in terms of liberty. First applied to reproduction in the 1965 case of Griswold v. Connecticut (381 US 479 (1965)), the constitutional right to privacy was understood to protect individuals from state interference with certain decisions affecting their private lives, particularly decisions about marriage, family, sexual intimacy, and procreation. Griswold was jurisprudentially controversial because the right to privacy is not explicitly stated in the Constitution. Feminists have argued that originalist approaches to constitutional interpretation that would restrict constitutional meaning to the understandings in place at the time constitutional provisions were adopted are jurisprudentially problematic in their entrenchment of the norms of the patriarchy of the day (e.g. Case 2014) More recent decisions about abortion rights have been framed in terms of fundamental liberties that may not be unduly burdened (e.g., Planned Parenthood of Southeastern Pennsylvania v. Casey (505 U.S. 833 (1992))).
On the other side of the abortion debate from women’s reproductive liberty is the question of the fetus. Roe v. Wade’s extension of the right to privacy to a woman’s decision to terminate a pregnancy by elective abortion set off a firestorm of protest and debate that remains robust over forty years later. Even the language used to state the issues is contested. Labeling the fetus a “pre-born infant” or a “person”—as some of the attempts to pass so-called personhood amendments have tried to do—begs exactly the question of what if any moral claims the fetus might have (e.g. Francis, ed. 2017, part IV). Many feminists hold nuanced views on these questions. For example, disability rights feminists may argue that while abortion rights should be protected, abortion decisions that are based on inadequate or biased information about disabilities are problematic. Black feminists may interrogate whether abortion policies or support for women and families are racially biased, implicitly or even explicitly. Many feminists also agree that the state has an interest in protecting the fetus to the extent that it will be born alive—that is, that the state has an interest in protecting continuing pregnancies against fetal harm, including harm inflicted by the pregnant woman herself—although feminists also recognize that this interest must not be seen to legitimize problematic coercive or paternalistic interferences with pregnant women’s liberty.
In its more recent cases the US Supreme Court has held that the state interest in protecting potential life may begin at the moment of conception even though the mother’s interest outweighs it (Planned Parenthood v. Casey, 505 US 833 (1992)). The Court’s continuing jurisprudence bears out initial feminist concerns that saw this formulation as the tip of a wedge (e.g. Peach 2002). For example, the 2007 decision of Gonzales v. Carhart (550 U.S. 124 (2007)) upheld the constitutionality of the Partial Birth Abortion Ban Act of 2003. The Act bans what it terms partial birth abortion—language freighted with the imagery of a live-born person—except when necessary to save the life of the mother. In the decision, the Court weighed substantial state interests in protecting the health of the mother and in preserving fetal life as interests present all along during pregnancy against the burden placed on the woman’s right of reproductive liberty. Opponents of the Act claimed that its partial birth label concealed the extent of its restriction on pre-viability abortion choices. The decision has spurred state efforts to enact the TRAP laws described above. These state statutes have placed increasing burdens on abortion providers; many have closed and abortion is practically unavailable for women in many areas of the United States despite the Supreme Court’s decision in Whole Woman’s Health v. Hellerstedt.
Feminists also criticize the US Supreme Court’s reasoning in support of the state interest in protecting potential life. One concern is the scope of the supposed interest, such as whether it extends to the sale or distribution of contraceptive devices that prevent implantation after fertilization, or that even are claimed to do so in rare cases. Another concern is how any interest in protecting fetal life from the moment of conception can be supported in a secular, liberal state. If the answer is that there is some special status accorded to the human embryo or fertilized egg that requires its protection from the moment it is fertilized, feminists argue, this is best characterized as a religious view. If so, religious beliefs are being imported into state laws and the US Constitution that have a disproportionate impact upon women. The vague references to protecting potential life, so central to all the Supreme Court’s decisions on this complex issue, obscure these critical implications and are problematic on many grounds. Even in a modern, secular, liberal state that is explicitly committed to individual freedom, women’s fundamental liberties can be obscured and mystified by language and action that uphold and impose longstanding restrictive modes of thought and custom that may not always be recognized as religious in origin but that have no other plausible explanation. Such restrictions are often expressed in and defended by the use of religious language (such as sacred-ness or sanctity) that is applied to controversial religious doctrines as though they were settled, basic and uncontroversial.
Some societies explicitly incorporate religious law into their legal systems, operate dual systems, or are expressly theocratic. Others are secular but faced with strong customary elements. To some extent all societies face the problem of customary resistance to reform, as illustrated by the abortion debates in the United States. In nations with strong religious or customary influences on law, feminists may face difficult issues of how to interpret religious law into language more favorable to women’s freedom, how to call upon international human rights norms, and/or how to interpret the language of customary law in a way that enables it to absorb feminist reforms over time (Quriashi 2011). This is a special case of the general problem of entrenchment. It may involve several different ways of challenging the religious establishment on matters of interpretation that are (traditionally) considered settled or fundamental. Some customary doctrines arguably have no particular basis in religious texts, although they are treated as though they do (e.g., when life begins). Furthermore, some doctrines have a very general religious basis (e.g., women should be modest) but are interpreted to require far more severe or detailed customs (e.g., women must be entirely covered whenever they are in public). A further strategy points out that all religious interpretation is selective, so it must be determined whether a passage of text should be considered basic and eternal, or whether it was simply a reflection of particular customs or attitudes relevant to a particular time in history (e.g., adultery and blasphemy are capital offenses). Some innovative work has been done on these issues, for example, by exploring the distinction between shari’a (eternal) law and fiqh (custom or jurisprudence) in Islam, and by considering the interplay of dual systems (Quriashi 2011; Mir-Hosseini 2005; Reed & Pollitt 2002; Jeffrey & Basu 1998). These approaches emphasize interpretive methods; a further approach calls on the separation between law and morality endorsed by legal positivism to disentangle traditionalist moral beliefs from the requirements of law.
Since the adoption under the Affordable Care Act of the requirement that contraception methods approved by the U.S. Food and Drug Administration be included in group health plans without cost-sharing, many have voiced religious objections to providing this coverage. Feminists argue that contraceptive use declines with costs and that ready access to contraception is an important part of women’s ability to control their bodies. They also point out how the burdens of contraception and contraceptive failure fall on women rather than men. Objectors contend that contraception should be a matter of private choice rather than a government requirement, that at least some contraceptives are problematic as abortifacients (although this contention is contested for contraceptive methods such as the intrauterine device), and that rights of conscientious objection should be respected. Here, too, philosophy of law considers the role of law in resolving these disputes.
Commodification of the body especially in reproduction is a topic of extensive discussion among feminist philosophers of law. As reproductive technologies have become increasingly sophisticated, pressures for women to sell their oocytes or to be paid to bear children for others have mounted. Some liberal theorists urge that if paid sex, paid surrogacy, paid gamete donation, and the like can be achieved voluntarily, these are legitimate forms of economic opportunity. To prohibit them is to deprive some people—primarily women—of opportunities that might be of value to them and to deprive the biologically and the socially infertile of the ability to form families. Indeed, if all forms of sexuality, including marriage, were viewed on the model of economic relationships, some argue, equality for women would be furthered (Ertman 2001). Feminists critical of this liberal position argue that commodification may misperceive the nature of the body in human life by understanding it as the subject of property—despite the all-too-apparent reality that alternatives to commodification may be worse (Radin 1996). Relatedly, some contend that commodification of the body in practices such as paid surrogacy is inherently exploitative (Dickenson 2007).
Many liberal feminists, too, are opposed to a variety of commodification practices. Some argue that abolition of even voluntary prostitution is necessary to protect victims of sex trafficking, as legalized prostitution may mask continued flourishing of trafficking in its shadow (Dempsey 2010). Others are concerned about the possibility of genuinely voluntary consent in circumstances of poverty or limited opportunities for many women. Several countries that have legalized prostitution, such as the Netherlands and Germany, have engaged in vigorous debates about whether legal prostitution is a voluntarily chosen occupation for many, whether legalization has bettered the circumstances for prostitutes, and whether legalization has been coupled with enhanced enforcement of laws against sex trafficking or other sex crimes. Other countries, such as Sweden, have banned prostitution altogether, spurred by feminist critique of the practice.
Related to the concerns about commodification of the body are criticisms of what are seen as questionable technological imperatives, even apart from the economic incentives that may be driving them. Some feminists contend that practices such as pre-implantation genetic diagnosis, transplants of mitochondrial DNA, or gene editing are far riskier both physiologically and ethically than proponents admit (e.g. De Melo-Martin 2016). These feminists point out that long-term evidence of safety is lacking and that there may be unanticipated deleterious consequences of these techniques. These practices may portend far-reaching changes in our understanding of individual identity and what it is to be human. Whether law in the form of prohibitions or regulations should be imposed on these practices, or whether they are a matter for individuals to decide for themselves, is deeply contested. Some liberal feminists, for example, argue that individual’s choices about the reproductive risks they are willing to take should be respected, especially when they are striving to avoid disease in their potential offspring.
An ongoing theme in all these debates about marriage, reproduction, and the body has been the extent to which these issues should be understood in terms of protecting liberty, and how much they should be understood in terms of achieving equality. For liberal feminists, the extent to which women may exercise uncoerced choice over their bodies and their private lives is key. If women choose marriages in which they are dependent economically, make choices about how many children they will have, and elect to spend their lives in uncompensated domestic labor, those decisions should be respected as long as they are not coerced. For other feminists, what is critical is the extent to which even apparently free choices are exercised against a backdrop of economic inequality or patriarchal dominance. For these feminists, economic dependency and norms of dominance call into question the possibility of genuinely free choice.
No individual is entitled to inflict gratuitous harm upon another and no one should have to live in fear. These are among the few uncontroversial principles accepted in all moral systems and form the core of the criminal law in every society. Keeping peace and order has long been considered a fundamental justification for the very existence of the state or legal authority. Many philosophers have explicitly supported this idea, even those who argue for limitations on the state. J.S. Mill, for example, argued that the only legitimate reason for interference by the state in the affairs of individuals is to prevent one person from harming another. Thomas Hobbes argued that peace (i.e., personal security) is the ultimate political value for which a rational individual would sign on to the social contract justifying state power to protect the security of every man from the potential threat of every other (see the entry on Hobbes’ moral and political philosophy). And Montesquieu defined political liberty as the tranquility of mind that comes from not being subject to fear for one’s safety. To achieve such tranquility of mind he proposed the separation of (governmental) powers to retard the abuse of power that could so threaten the security of citizens. From Confucius and Lao Tzu to Mohammed or Gandhi, and from the Ten Commandments to the Code of Hammurabi, personal security—freedom from fear—is a value that the state is expected to secure and maintain.
Until the 20th century, however, these commitments did not protect women from a frequent source of danger, their intimates: husbands, lovers, relatives, friends, or employers. Indeed, for much of history these common threats to the personal security of women were not recognized as harms at all that it was the business of the state to address. Instead, they were frequently taken to be inevitable, a matter of right, or justifiable. Not surprisingly, a great deal of feminist legal scholarly attention and reform effort has been directed to revealing and changing the many ways in which law fails to protect women and girls against forms of violence such as rape (including date rape and marital rape), domestic abuse, sexual harassment, and other types of abuse. Although some countries do not collect official data and the nature and incidence of such violence varies widely by culture, many studies indicate that no society is exempt from these forms of violence. The 2012 United Nations Millennium Development Goals Report observed that although equal numbers of boys and girls are now attending school across the globe, violence against women continues to undermine progress towards all goals.
In legal theory about gendered violence, the possibility of separating the public from the private sphere is critical. Historically law did not address injuries inflicted by intimates. So, while the single greatest civil purpose of law has been to keep men from violating one another (the only greater being to repel foreign invasion), much violation of women by men has been considered as a private matter beyond the purview of law. Domestic chastisement was once considered legitimate discipline of one’s wife and marital rape was excluded from the definition of rape in many criminal law statutes. Feminists criticized the presumption that such behavior among intimates was beyond the purview of the criminal law and these limitations have largely been overcome, at least in the United States and Europe.
Many other problematic aspects of rape law have also been revised in light of feminist critiques. Historically, rape by an acquaintance was not seen as “real rape” (Estrich 1987) but as more likely consensual sex. Acquaintance rape was made virtually impossible to prove by strict corroboration requirements and other rules of evidence. Another hurdle to proof of rape presented by the rules of evidence was the requirement of active resistance: victims who did not actively resist—including those who were most terrorized or who feared harm from resistance—were judged to have consented to whatever happened to them, or at least to have reasonably appeared to their attackers as consenting (McGregor 2007). Victims also were discouraged from pursuing complaints by evidence rules that permitted them to be examined about past sexual histories, thus forcing them to reveal intimate private matters and subjecting them to judgment as immoral themselves. Victims who delayed reporting alleged rapes, perhaps out of shame or fear, were considered not to have made a fresh complaint and thus to be less credible. Many of these rules have been formally overturned but it is less clear whether as a practical matter they continue to infect decisions such as whether to prosecute, how to examine witnesses, or how to assess the credibility of witnesses.
Contemporary discussions of the definition and proof of rape continue to struggle with questions such as what consent to sex really means. Some feminists have argued that there is a domain of wrongful sex that is different from rape; Cahill (2016), for example, argues that sex that occurs within context of structural injustice is unjust sex that may be within a gray area of ambiguity. She distinguishes cases in which the woman is less than fully willing, cases in which the woman’s will is clearly overcome, and cases in which the victim cannot fully consent due to incapacity. What distinguishes these types of cases, Cahill says, is how the victim’s sexual agency is deployed. She characterizes as unjust sex in the gray area in which the woman’s sexual agency is actively sought but undermined for example in circumstances in which her consent is simply expected or in which it is difficult for her to express unwillingness. Subtle discussions such as this illuminate why some rape cases are so difficult for law to handle, as law deals in bright line determinations such as whether conduct was criminal. Allegations of rape in contexts in which one of the parties is under the influence of drugs or alcohol also place pressure on the idea of agency in the context of sex. Heyes (2016) explores the phenomenology of agency and the harms of assaults involving victims who are semiconscious or unconscious.
Difficulties about consent and proof attend other forms of violence against women as wll. Incest, like rape, was always illegal but rarely admitted, let alone prosecuted. Prosecutors were all too willing to drop charges when women chose not to press them, potentially confusing respect for the victim’s choices with her fear of embarrassment or coercion. And sexual harassment (like sex discrimination) simply did not exist as legal claims until the 1960s or later (MacKinnon & Siegel 2004; MacKinnon 1979). So it is clear not only that equal protection of law for women was not recognized until recently, but also that the force of law was used to back male dominance. If a man were attacked on the street he could pursue his attacker in the courts of law. If a woman were attacked in her home she had no legal cause of action as it was considered a private matter. Many feminist critics contend that in important respects such domestic violence amnesia continues to characterize how law functions (Dempsey 2009). This is true in both criminal law and the law of private damages, according to these critics (Chamallas & Wriggins 2010).
Over the past 30 years or so, many jurisdictions across the globe have enacted major improvements in formal legal protections against violence once considered private. Rape laws have been reformed to varying degrees in many societies, although even the best arguably still have far to go (McGregor 2005; Estrich 2001; Taslitz 1999; Schulhofer 1998). For example, most western nations no longer require corroboration of rape by witnesses. In many jurisdictions, consent is no longer presumed from the absence of resistance and far stricter requirements for the relevance of evidence are in place. Feminist lawyers have worked hard to secure these legal reforms and they represent important achievements. International law too has recognized the rape of women in war as a crime against humanity (see the United Nations International Tribunal for the Former Yugoslavia page on Crimes of Sexual Violence), and prosecutions for this crime have recently taken place for the first time in history. Sexual harassment and sex discrimination are now rather widely recognized as wrongful behavior and legal causes of action in a variety of forms.
Despite this significant progress in formal law, crime statistics continue to verify that violence against women remains a problem of major proportions. Reporting rates are low. Conviction rates in no sense reflect a full commitment to punishing these crimes on a par with punishment of other crimes (Estrich 2001; Schulhofer 1998). The result of such enforcement failure, feminists contend, is that in practice men have almost the same powers over women that were historically enshrined in law. A woman may no longer be legally required to remain with a husband who beats her, but if she has nowhere to go, no income or employment opportunities but children to support, then her restriction is in practice the same as it was in the past (see Gendercide Watch; WomenWatch). Given long-standing customs of subordination, the traditional disparity of power, and the typical difference in size and strength between men and women, the threat of physical harm and the differential exercise of economic and political power are sufficient to maintain male dominance unless the law intercedes to counteract these forces (Husseini 2007; Manderson 2003; Schneider 2000; Rhode 1997). Both in the US and elsewhere, immigrant or undocumented women may be particularly vulnerable both to their partners and to enforcement failures.
So, why hasn’t the law interceded more successfully? Feminist theorists give different answers to this question. Liberal feminists may focus on biased attitudes of police officers, prosecutors, and judges, the majority of whom are male. Other feminists point to persistent economic inequality between women and men, with resulting dependency that makes it difficult for women to leave abusive relationships or to resist harassment. For example, Schultz (2003) argues that opposition to sexual harassment should not be identified with opposition to sex in the workplace but instead with opposition to practices that tend to exclude women from jobs and with a vision of genuine equality at work.
Dominance feminists offer the more radical critique that the pervasiveness, seriousness, and tenacity of male threats and the inadequacy of official responses reflect the patriarchal construction of gender itself on a model of dominance and submission. That is, the law reflects a way of thinking on which masculinity means strength, forcefulness, aggressiveness, and domination and femininity means delicacy, resistance, submission, and subordination. The distinction between persuasion and force appears as a fine line that is easy to cross. If the distinction between normal sexual behavior and rape turns on a last minute decision by a woman to stop resisting and submit, then it will hardly be surprising if rape turns out to be both very pervasive and widely denied (McGregor 2005; MacKinnon 1989). Furthermore, if the very concept of masculinity is not just strength but domination, then resorting to violence to enforce female subordination is a clear correlate of the model. If standards of reasonableness—what it is reasonable to expect partners to understand, to ask, and to do—are male, the boundaries of acceptable behavior will look very different than if judgments of reasonableness are understood to be gendered—and, largely, male. Finally, if the natural relation between the sexes is taken to be both hierarchical and adversarial, then a male dominated legal system formulated by men from a male perspective is bound to protect the interests of men at the expense of women whenever the two conflict or are perceived to conflict. Thus, the patriarchal construction of gender makes domination the model of masculinity and rape (or at least power and submission) the model of sex (MacKinnon & Siegel 2004; Estrich 2001, 1987; Schneider 2000; Schulhofer 1998; MacKinnon 1989).
This dominance critique has been widely misunderstood, however. Critics of the dominance approach characterize it as condemning all sex and indicting all men as rapists, but this criticism is to some extent unfair. A few exaggerated claims made by some feminists, highly publicized in the early 1970s, did condemn all sex. But in a more enduring sense the dominance critique relies on several observations that illustrate the truth of feminist claims about the entrenchment of patriarchy as the status quo and the domination model of sexuality. Many feminists claim that the use of sex to dominate is pervasive, affecting how people think and interact in all cultures (Schneider 2000; MacKinnon 1989). Critics interpret this observation as a claim that every sexual act is an act of domination (or rape), an inference that does not follow from the general observation about the role of sex in oppression. Part of the reason for reinterpretation is that once again feminists are arguing against the norm. If feminists are correct that domination is the patriarchal model of sexuality and patriarchy is the status quo, then it is not surprising if they appear to be arguing against all sex itself, at least according to anyone who cannot envision an alternative model of sex.
Initially, feminists were divided in how to address the dominance model of sexuality in law and society. Focusing on causes or influences, some feminists attempted to challenge media stereotypes, an approach for which they were criticized as censors. Some challenged the fashion and beauty industry with miniscule impact while suffering considerable personal ridicule for their efforts. Some focused on opposing pornography (especially violent pornography) as the symbol of the dominance model and developed model anti-pornography statutes for jurisdictions to enact (see the entry on pornography and censorship). When one jurisdiction—Indianapolis—did enact a statute providing injunctive relief and a damages remedy for violent pornography, it was quickly held to be an unconstitutional violation of free speech (American Booksellers v. Hudnut, (771 F.2d 323 (7th Cir. 1985)). That the feminist message of opposing female subordination was criticized as a Victorian condemnation of immoral sex, some feminists contended, illustrated the deep entrenchment of the domination model. Instead, feminists suggested developing better models of masculinity (MacKinnon & Siegel 2004; Estrich 2001; Rhode 1997). More recently, many feminists have explored the role of structural injustice in maintaining gender oppression (e.g. Parekh 2011))
Conflicts continue to this day over the permissible limits on free speech, both where sex is involved and more generally. The development of video and robotic technologies that allow highly realistic simulations of degrading or violent sexual acts have placed additional challenges to regulatory efforts, as these depictions do not require human performance and thus do not directly harm individuals creating the depictions. Some argue that viewing these materials should be criminalized because this conduct is wrongful and it can be the proper object of the criminal law to punish wrongdoing even when it does not harm others directly (Danaher 2017). Feminists have pointed out that drawing the line for state intervention at direct harm to others hews closely to problematic distinctions between the public and the private drawn by Millian liberals. Bracewell (2016) observes in addition that the earlier ordinances advocated by MacKinnon and others proposed damage remedies and injunctive relief rather than criminalization; the carceral turn against violent speech is more readily aligned with liberalism’s delineation of the proper role of the state as harm-prevention. Indeed, the U.S. Supreme Court decision striking down California’s statute imposing civil fines for the sale of violent video games to minors rested on the liberal view that content-based regulation of speech is impermissible, Brown v. Entertainment Merchants Association, 564 U.S. 786 (2011).
Finally, feminist legal scholars have proposed legislation and trial practice procedures that would treat domestic violence as part of a systematic cultural environment that discriminates against women (Schneider 2000). These proposals are regularly undermined by (well meaning) therapeutic models that treat domestic violence as individual psychological problems of anger management or substance abuse or the like, rather than as part of a widespread social problem. Medical approaches often depersonalize the issue as family dysfunction. The male perpetrator seems to disappear and responsibility fades as though the harm were caused by a disease rather than by a violent man, a responsible human agent. Clearly countering entrenched acceptance of male violence against women will take long-term, concerted effort. Impressive gains have been made, but much more is needed (MacKinnon 2006; Husseini 2007; Manderson 2003; Schneider 2000; Hassan 1998).
Unequal treatment in social and economic life—in schools, public accommodations, employment, housing, insurance, pensions, investment, sports, the environment, and more—has been another target of feminist legal critique. Here, too, the question has been what equal treatment under law requires in the face of differences, including supposed biological differences, histories of discrimination, and entrenched social institutions. The law has developed from the removal of outright barriers—male-only public universities, for example—to non-discrimination, to consideration of what conditions and practices adversely affect women to the extent of generating inequalities that ought to be addressed in law.
In the US from the 1940s on, courts gradually began to enforce the Equal Protection clause of the 14th Amendment to apply strict scrutiny to state-imposed categorizations based on race; later on, constitutional law began to address whether race and sex could be analogized or even coupled for purposes of analysis (Mayeri 2011). In 1963, the US Congress passed the Equal Pay Act, amending the Fair Labor Standards Act to prohibit unequal pay on the basis of sex for “equal work on jobs the performance of which requires equal skill, effort, and responsibility, and which are performed under similar working conditions,” 29 U.S.C. §206(d) (2012). (Congress, in a dispute about comparable worth, left open the interpretive question of whether this statute requires the same pay for the same work or equal pay for substantially equivalent jobs, a comparable worth standard.) The Civil Rights Act of 1964 followed the next year, explicitly establishing rights not to be discriminated against on the basis of race, sex, religion or national origin in areas that included employment (Title VII), education (Title IX) and governmental benefits. Many nations have similar laws (phrased in varying language) and these have been or could be of considerable benefit to women, especially where bias is overt and provable.
Unfortunately, in much of the world today discrimination is far from overt, but no less effective for its increased subtlety. In some ways progress toward equality has been substantial in many parts of the world. But in other respects advances have been slow, even in progressive nations. Enshrining equality in law is a far different matter from implementing it in practice. Women have been active participants in the public sphere in large numbers in many societies for thirty years or more. Yet the great majority of women remain clustered in the bottom or middle ranks in otherwise male dominated professions, or segregated into traditionally female fields. Politics remain strongly male dominated. And the top echelons of business are still a male preserve: the so-called glass ceiling (Kellerman & Rhode 2007; Fineman & Dougherty 2005; Estrich 2001). Despite increased educational, political and employment opportunities for women, the feminization of poverty (Pearce 1978) continues to increase while equality of power remains elusive. Changes in divorce law and the law of alimony and child support have been factors in poverty’s feminization (Smock, Manning & Gupta 1999), raising questions for feminist theory about whether equality requires re-institution of protectionist laws. In employment, women consistently earn less for comparable work in the same field, and female dominated occupations are consistently paid less than male dominated ones, even when the male occupations require less education and involve less responsibility (Kellerman & Rhode 2007; Allen 2005; Fineman & Dougherty 2005; Roberts 2002; Estrich 2001; Williams 2001; Rhode 1997). For feminist legal scholars, the overarching question is what roles the law should play in response.
One set of issues concerns the effects of bias that cannot be demonstrated to be intentional discrimination: bias that is unrecognized or implicit but that is bias nonetheless. In employment and other areas of social and economic life, supposedly objective rules may be applied differently to men and women. For example, a woman may be told the company does not allow part time work, but a man may be allowed to cut back in order to pursue some valued activity, such as holding political office. And women are often graded or evaluated lower on the basis of gender alone, without the recognition that this is what is taking place. Symphony orchestras famously discovered that the number of women musicians selected rose dramatically when applicants auditioned anonymously from behind a screen (Goldin & Rouse 2000). One use of statistical evidence in antidiscrimination law in the US is to raise inferences of unrecognized bias, hence discrimination, in situations such as this.
A further set of issues concerns how law should address the disparate impact of apparently sex-neutral policies. Even without explicit or implicit bias, many longstanding policies may affect men and women differently. Policies discouraging or prohibiting part time work, when consistently applied to both men and women, may still have quite different consequences for parents with primary responsibility for child care, thus disadvantaging women disproportionately. As Williams (2010) points out, the US continues to have a workplace structured on the basis of the norms of the 1950s, assuming a breadwinner husband and a wife at home taking care of the children. Flexible work schedules, predictable shifts, consistent start and stop times, day time work, or part time work at hourly rates or with benefits proportionately equivalent to those of full time workers simply are not available to much of the workforce in the US or elsewhere. Moreover, the US, unlike other advanced industrial societies, has no general statutory requirement for paid family leave.
These many policies pose classic dilemmas of difference and can be deconstructed by understanding the male norms they assume, as discussed in Section 1. Employment policies concerning pregnancy are notorious examples warranting separate mention. At one point, the U.S. Supreme Court concluded that failure to cover pregnancy under state or employer disability insurance programs was not discrimination on the basis of sex, as it differentiated between pregnant persons and non-pregnant persons. (Geduldig v. Aiello, 417 U.S. 484 (1974); General Electric Co. v. Gilbert, 429 U.S. 125 (1976)). Since pregnancy did not affect all women, denying pregnancy benefits did not discriminate against women on the basis of sex, or so the reasoning went, although these policies would certainly have different impacts on women than on men. Men and women were being treated the same: neither received pregnancy benefits. So men did not receive any benefits that women did not receive. And women did not receive any benefits that men did not receive. The logical implication was that requiring a benefits program to include pregnancy benefits for women would entitle them not to equal rights, but to special rights; not to equal treatment but to special treatment (Olsen 1995; Smith 1993; Bartlett & Kennedy 1991). Feminists were stunned by this argument—after all, only women can become pregnant—and the US Congress enacted the Pregnancy Discrimination Act several years later. The most recent battleground over apparently neutral rules has been the recognition of exceptions for employers with religious objections from providing contraceptive coverage for their employees.
In addition, some policies that differentiate based on sex may be perceived as just or as beneficial to women. Affirmative action policies designed to root out the lingering effects of prior discrimination are an example of policies differentiating on the basis of sex that may be regarded as just. Other policies have been seen justified on a variety of grounds, including benefits to society, benefits to women, or distributive justice. In the US, these have included excluding women from jury duty based on their supposed responsibilities in the home, giving survivor’s benefits to widows but not to widowers, and creating single-sex schools. To some critics, all of these policies violate formal equality. To feminists, underlying issues for achieving equality include determining whether any of these policies enforce stereotypes, entrench prejudice, or treat anyone unfairly—and whether law should be used to challenge them as a result.
Moreover, sex is not the only ground of legally actionable discrimination. Some critical race theorists, queer theorists, disability theorists, and other feminist legal philosophers have both clarified and complicated the issue of equality and difference by pointing to discrimination based on race, class, ethnicity, sexual orientation, disability and age (Mayeri 2011; Nussbaum 2006; Allen 2005; Crenshaw 1996, 1989; Valdes 1995; Matsuda 1987). As discussed above, the scholarship on intersectionality creates complex pictures of identity and the structure of discrimination. For example, employment discrimination against women of color may not be simply a matter of race-plus or sex-plus, but a phenomenon of interaction between these and possibly other categories. Some feminists have pointed out as a problem in particular of liberal feminism that much of its focus is directed to the concerns of white, middle class, professional women (Williams 2011, 1997, 1992; Roberts 2002; Crenshaw et al. 1996).
For all these reasons, women remain at a serious disadvantage both at work and at home (Williams 2010; Fineman & Dougherty 2005; Roberts 2002; Okin 1995). In the workplace it has been noted that despite the many forms of discrimination described above, many women are able to progress quite well as long as they function as perfect workers (i.e. as men). These women also have the greatest legal resources to combat discrimination, which shows that the workplace has changed little and that the standard of evaluation is still male (Williams 2010; Fineman 2004; Estrich 2001). This precludes women from being mothers and still being treated as equals in the workplace. Many instances of discrimination appear to start when a woman becomes a mother, even if her work product has not changed. And many women find themselves in the double bind of being disliked and disapproved of as bad mothers or discounted and disrespected as uncommitted workers. This has been identified as discrimination and is often legally actionable. Joan Williams (2001) has called this additional barrier the “maternal wall” and adds it to the glass ceiling as a form of illegal discrimination. But it remains difficult to prove and difficult to counteract. Feminist philosophers of law have offered a variety of proposals for counteracting it (Allen 2005; Fineman 2004; Estrich 2001; Williams 2001; Rhode 1997). Some societies handle the coordination of family and work better than others, and some progress has been made in some places; but the burdens of domestic labor in the private sphere remain greatly undervalued and largely invisible, and the stereotype of the domestic and nurturing mother is deeply entrenched.
The economic disadvantages of women at work are reinforced by domestic disadvantages, either as a formal matter of family law or in the implicit biases in how apparently neutral rules are applied. While most societies idealize the role of the mother, her domestic work is consistently undervalued or unpaid. As a result, often when mothers seek divorce, child custody, and property settlements they are gravely disadvantaged (Fineman 2004; Williams 2001; Weitzman 1992, 1987). In some societies the de-valued status of wives and daughters leaves them without inheritance, property, or even without adequate food, health care, or education (Carr et al. 1996; Okin 1995; Sen 1995; Chen 1995,1983). Many feminist legal scholars have offered proposals for revising some family laws with some modest success. Some have suggested pay scales for traditional domestic duties and alternative models for custody suits and property settlements (Williams 2001; Jain 1995; Olsen 1983). And some feminists have analyzed the domestic ideal itself, suggesting an alternative legal model of the family. Martha Fineman (2004, 1995) has argued that the state has no reason to reinforce and privilege the sexual family—the sexual relation between a man and a woman that is the traditional basis of marriage as a legal institution. Rather, the care-giving relation is what should be encouraged and supported by the state. One problem with the care-giving role is that it makes the care-giver dependent on another source of income, typically and traditionally a breadwinner. It is this dependent status of the care-giver that needs to be addressed in law and public policy, assuming that care-giving is a positive and indeed a crucial role in human life. According to this view, the myth of autonomy is an unfortunate side effect of a male perspective that tends to make the private domestic sphere both invisible and de-valued (Fineman 2004, 1995). And this issue is further complicated by the intersection of gender with race and class (Roberts 2002).
This de-valuation and invisibility has contributed directly to the feminization of poverty, which is now a problem of global proportions. Global poverty is getting worse, and increasingly women bear the brunt of it. Two billion people (about one out of three) live in extreme poverty on less than two dollars a day. About 800 million go to bed hungry every night, and eight million die from poverty related causes each year. More than seventy per cent of them (nearly three fourths) are female. So serious are the effects of extreme poverty on women (and girls) that the World Health Organization has named it a disease (“extreme poverty,” coded Z59.5) and called it “the world’s most ruthless killer” (Jain 2005, p. 138).
The reasons for the feminization of poverty are complex and differ in important respects by culture. Some women are poor because their society is poor—devastated by natural disasters or war and social turmoil, or sapped by corrupt officials or colonial powers. Some are refugees, and some are sick, old, or disabled. Many of the poor are children. It has been noted that extreme poverty for both men and women is attributable to a variety of entrenched traditional structures such as class or caste hierarchies, ethnic or religious discrimination and unequal land distribution (Carr, Chen & Jhabvala 1996). And often these long term structural problems are aggravated by globalization, world markets, economic restructuring and such recent trends in the world economy. Women’s poverty results from all these factors: being part of a poor family, village, or region, but is compounded by the subordination of women within the family, community or social structure at large. When poverty is bad it is worse for women. When food and medicine are short the most deprived are women and girls. Norms of seclusion—exclusion from inheritance, lack of credit, lack of training and education—all disadvantage women and girls. In all societies the poorest women carry compounded burdens of discrimination by race, class, caste or religion as well as sex discrimination (Roberts 1995; Chen 1995; Crenshaw 1989; Matsuda 1987).
Many programs have been proposed and initiated to alleviate this problem. Women’s unions and cooperative associations have been formed. New models of credit and lending are being tested. The UN, various NGOs and Women’s Organizations, as well as national and local organizations, have been working to increase opportunities for literacy and employment for women and girls (Jain, 2005; Carr, Chen & Jhabvala 1996; Nussbaum & Glover 1995). Pioneers of micro-lending Muhammad Yunus and the Grameen Bank received the Nobel Peace Prize in 2006. Yet poverty and polarization are increasing in many societies. Many feminists are now of the view that reform of economic and social institutions is critical to the well being of women. The sharp distinction between public and private labor needs to be recognized as an artificial one (Fineman and Dougherty 2005). As noted by Chen, “so long as policy-makers make the artificial distinction between the farm and the household, between paid work and unpaid work, between productive and domestic work, women will continue to be overlooked” (1983, p. 220). Thus, the interaction between private labor and the public good must be, and is beginning to be, acknowledged. For example, Chen (2011) argues, contributions of unpaid labor should be included in estimates of GDPs; contributions of work in the informal sector (which tends to be dominated by women and low income men) is increasingly being included in national and institutional studies potentially affecting economic policy; and unpaid domestic labor is now sometimes considered as having monetary value in court cases.
Some feminists have concluded that, like the dominance model of sexuality, the domestic model of women’s unpaid labor may not be addressed by denouncing it directly. It may also require incremental erosion by addressing its causes and effects. That is, it must gradually be replaced with a better model. According to Chen (1995, 1983), for example, (ideological) arguments for the equality of women in rural India and Bangladesh were met with great resistance, but when the approach was revised to provide pragmatic assistance for economic development to poor women that substantially improved their lives (and thus the lives of their families) resistance substantially decreased. Dreze and Sen (1989, p. 58) have noted “considerable evidence that greater involvement in outside work does tend to go with less anti-female bias in intra-family distribution.” Respect for women arguably increases as their independence increases.
Communist societies that purported to institute equality for women from the top down, so to speak, failed to accomplish their goal precisely by overlooking the obvious conflict between the perfect mother and the perfect worker. For example, commentators such as Li (1995) contend that in China the Communist model of equality superimposed a thin veneer of equal gender relations over 5,000 year old patriarchal customs that strongly socialized women to the roles of obedient and deferential wife and daughter. Combining these norms with Communist women’s equal obligations as workers created double obligations for women without any real recognition of the double role as a double burden (Li 1995). Some feminists have noted that the Soviet Communist idea of gender equality and its post-communist development created a triple burden, as women were expected to function in three roles: wife and mother; good worker or professional; and social activist (Petrova 1993). And today, as women enter the public sphere around the globe, they carry the burdens of the private sphere with them, because the institutional structure has not been changed to accommodate social and economic evolution or to recognize the value of traditional women’s work (Fineman 2004, 1995).
Many feminists have concluded at this point that it is critical to mainstream women into the public sphere, thereby increasing their visibility as economic contributors and, thus, their control over their own lives. It is crucial to weaken the public/private distinction to make the general work environment more hospitable to parents and caregivers in general. And it is imperative to continue to raise feminist consciousness: to identify the bias of male norms, and yet to attend to the contextual surroundings necessary for an accurate assessment of complex human relations, as well as pragmatic solutions to longstanding entrenched inequality. Law is a critical tool in this effort (Stark 2004; Williams 2000; Okin 1995).
Law furthers social stability but may entrench norms of oppression. Law can also be a necessary means for reform. Law can be an anchor to the past or an engine for the future. Each function has its place. Feminist legal philosophy is an effort to examine and reformulate legal doctrine to overcome entrenched bias and enforced inequality of the past as it structures human concepts and institutions for the future.
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How to cite this entry. Preview the PDF version of this entry at the Friends of the SEP Society. Look up this entry topic at the Internet Philosophy Ontology Project (InPhO). Enhanced bibliography for this entry at PhilPapers, with links to its database.
- Center for Reproductive Rights Worldwide (CRLP)
- Center for WorkLife Law
- Feminism and Legal Theory Project
- Futures without Violence
- Gendercide Watch
- Human Rights Watch
- Intimate Partner Violence, Special Report, U.S. Dept. of Justice, Office of Justice Programs, Bureau of Justice Statistics, November 2012
- 9 to 5: Winning Justice for Working Women
- National Network to End Domestic Violence
- Wild for Human Rights
- Women’s Institute for Leadership Development
- Crimes of Sexual Violence, at the United Nations International Tribunal for the Former Yugoslavia webpage.
The authors would like to thank Samara Casewell for assistance with the original bibliography. As of March 2013, Leslie Francis has taken over updating this entry which was originally written by Patricia Smith.