Episteme and Techne
Epistêmê is the Greek word most often translated as knowledge, while technê is translated as either craft or art. These translations, however, may inappropriately harbor some of our contemporary assumptions about the relation between theory (the domain of ‘knowledge’) and practice (the concern of ‘craft’ or ‘art’). In our era, the paradigm of theory is pure mathematics, that has no obvious application to practical problems of, e.g., engineering. As well, theoretical physics sometimes has a tenuous relation to confirming/disconfirming experimentation. At the other end of the spectrum is craft, for example, carpentry, which is so enmeshed in material application that it resists any general explanation but must be learned by practice. As a consequence, theory and practice even seem irreconcilable. Outside of modern science, there is sometimes skepticism about the relevance of theory to practice because it is thought that theory is conducted at so great a remove from the facts, the province of practice, that it can lose touch with them. Indeed, at the level of practice, concrete experience might be all we need. Finally, if the practical is widened to include more than the way we the physical world but also the way we lead our lives, the relation between theory and practice has another problematic aspect. Within science, theory strives for a value-free view of reality. As a consequence, scientific theory cannot tell us how things should be or how to lead our lives. This contrast presents another aspect of the difference between theory and practice; pure theory is removed from ethical investigation and the practice of living requires it.
However, in what follows we will see that some of the features of this contemporary distinction between theory and practice are not found in the relation between epistêmê and technê. Others are found in a somewhat refracted fashion. As we move chronologically from Xenophon to Plotinus, we go from an author who does not distinguish between the two terms, to an author who has little use for technê because it is so far from what he considers to be real. It is in Aristotle that we find the basis for something like the modern opposition between epistêmê as pure theory and technê as practice. Yet even Aristotle refers to technê or craft as itself also epistêmê or knowledge because it is a practice grounded in an ‘account’ — something involving theoretical understanding. Plato — whose theory of forms seems an arch example of pure theoretical knowledge — nevertheless is fascinated by the idea of a kind of technê that is informed by knowledge of forms. In the Republic this knowledge is the indispensable basis for the philosophers’ craft of ruling in the city. Picking up another theme in Plato’s dialogues, the Stoics develop the idea that virtue is a kind of technê or craft of life, one that is based on an understanding of the universe. The relation, then, between epistêmê and technê in ancient philosophy offers an interesting contrast with our own notions about theory (pure knowledge) and (experience-based) practice. There is an intimate positive relationship between epistêmê and technê, as well as a fundamental contrast.
- 1. Xenophon
- 2. Plato
- 3. Aristotle
- 4. The Stoics
- 5. Alexander of Aphrodisias
- 6. Plotinus
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Xenophon’s only sustained discussions of epistêmê and technê are in two of his Socratic works, Memorabilia and Oeconomicus. The Memorabilia recounts conversations which Socrates held on a variety of topics; the Oeconomicus is a conversation largely devoted to one, i.e., the art of running a successful estate and household. In these works, knowledge is intimately tied to knowing how to do things, especially the more organized kind of knowing-how designated by technê. There is no distinction between epistêmê as theoretical knowledge and technê as mere craft or skill. Socrates explicitly identifies as technai such activities as playing the harp, generalship, piloting a ship, cooking, medicine, managing an estate, smithing, and carpentry; by association with these technai, we can include housebuilding, mathematics, astronomy, making money, flute playing, and painting. Without marking any difference, he also calls many of these activities epistêmai.
At the beginning of Memorabilia, Xenophon, in fact, portrays Socrates as uninterested in the abstract investigations of the physical philosophers. Socrates, he says, eschewed the investigation of the kosmos; he preferred looking into human affairs. Besides, humans cannot understand the universe, as shown by the inability of those who engage in these kinds of study to agree (I.i.11–14). In fact, towards the end of the work, Xenophon says that Socrates held that the study of geometry should be pursued to the point where one could measure a parcel of land he meant to buy; study of more complicated figures he disparaged because he did not see the use of it (IV.vii.3). If after this introduction we did not expect to find a very great difference between epistêmê and technê, we would not be disappointed.
Almost all occurrences of the word ‘epistêmê’ show its close connection to skill, practice, and technê. In a jocular vein, Critoboulos says he wants to gain the knowledge (epistêmê) which will allow him to win over those with good souls and beautiful bodies (II.vi.30). Socrates compares the knowledge (epistêmê) of justice to the knowledge of letters, i.e., a skill (IV.ii.20). As well, the verb epistasthai — the root of epistêmê — carries the sense of knowing how to do something. The stronger know how to use (chrêsthai) the weaker like slaves (II.i.12–13). If one does not know how to pilot (mê epistamenô(i) kubernân) a ship — a technê — both he and his ship will be lost (II.vi.38). One must learn the crafts (technai) of war from one who knows them (epistamenon) (II.i.28). Socrates says that some of the sub-skills of generalship — which elsewhere he calls a technê — come by nature and others come through knowledge (epistêmê) (III.i.6–7). The difference is between what is not acquired and what is acquired; but we find no distinction — as in Plato — between what is acquired by teaching and what is acquired by training. Thus Xenophon does not make the Platonic distinction between theoretical instruction and learning by practice (cf. Meno 70a–b).
Socrates emphasizes that learning an epistêmê — what we would call a field of knowledge — entails care, diligence, and practice. He says that idleness does not put knowledge worthy of mention into the soul; one must also have care or diligence (epimeleia) for doing fine and good deeds (II.i.20). Free men (actually gentlemen farmers) who are not idle but exercise diligence (epimelomenous) in those useful things they understand (epistantai) are happiest; work and application (epimeleian) help men to learn what they need to know and to remember what they learn (II.vii.7–8). Near the beginning of the Memorabilia, Socrates argues against those who say that a just man can never become unjust. Rather, he says, those who do not train the soul (askountas) cannot carry out the functions of the soul (I.ii.19–20). Diligence and training, then, are the basis of these skills, not a theoretical grasp of principles.
Even at his most theoretical, Xenophon’s Socrates shows a practical bent. Saying that those who know what each virtue is can expound these to others, he gives definitions for the virtues. A pious man, for instance, knows the laws respecting the worship of the gods and thus worships the gods lawfully; and, in general, the man who knows what is lawful with respect to the gods (ta peri tous theous nomima eidôs) is pious (IV.vi.1–4). The pious man, then, is defined by informed religious practice. The most abstract definition would seem to be that of wisdom. Claiming the wise are wise by knowledge (epistêmê(i)), Socrates says wisdom is knowledge. Next, however, he cautions that no one can know all things; so a person is wise to the extent that he knows (IV.vi.7). Knowledge, then, can be accumulated. Since knowledge is divided into various skills, such as managing an estate and generalship, and their subdivisions, the wise man would appear to be someone who acquires as much of this kind of knowledge as possible. If so, he is a person of wide accomplishments, not someone with a theory about the universe.
Throughout the Memorabilia, Xenophon weaves the theme of the craft of ruling (basilikê technê). This craft is the finest of virtues and technai, by which men, public and private, become capable of ruling and benefiting other men and themselves (IV.ii.11). Kings and rulers are not simply those who are chosen but those who know how to rule (tous epistamenous archein). In this regard they are compared to others who exercise a technê, such as ship’s pilots (III.ix.10–11). A good king does not just manage his own life well but also that of the ones he rules and he is the cause of their happiness (III.ii.2–3). However, he also argues that rulers have a more pleasant life than those who are ruled. His interlocutor, Aristippus, takes him to be claiming that the ruling craft is happiness. In answer, Socrates describes the life of what is obviously a gentleman, capable of winning good friends and subduing enemies, fit in body and soul to manage his household, to help his friends, and serve his country (II.i.19–20). These constitute the happy life of the gentleman; they also make him able to make others happy (IV.i.2–3). Although ruling is associated with happiness (eudaimonia), Socrates is not tempted to generalize about happiness; instead of an account of happiness, he enumerates the activities of a flourishing member of the dominant class.
In the Oeconomicus, Socrates uses knowledge (epistêmê) and craft (technê) interchangeably to refer to the practical undertakings of a gentleman, called in Greek kalos k’agathos — literally one who is fine and good. He opens the work with the question whether estate management (oikonomia) is the name of a type of knowledge (epistêmê) like medicine, smithing, and carpentry. Then he asks whether he and his interlocutor can say what the function (ergon) of estate management is, just as they can say what are the functions of these other technai (I.1–2). When he uses epistêmê in what follows, the focus of his discussion is some aspect of estate or household management. He refers indifferently to the knowledge (epistêmê) and the craft (technê) of estate management and of farming; the latter includes sub-skills such as breeding stock (V.3) casting seed (XVII.7) and the planting of trees (XIX.1). However, there is a distinction between illiberal arts (banausikai technai) and those worthy of a gentleman. The latter are the craft of war (polemikê technê) and that of farming (geôrgia). The illiberal arts confine one to the workshop and narrow one’s interests to his own welfare; the crafts of war and farming give one a wider scope so that he can attend to his friends and city (IV.2–4; VI.5–9). In fact, farming is the mother and nurse of the other technai (V.17). However, knowledge by itself is not sufficient to prosper. There are those who have the knowledge and resources to increase their estates but are unwilling to do so (I.16). Others, like Socrates’ respondent Critoboulos, might gain such knowledge but do not have the wealth necessary to make use of it (II.11–13). Still, Socrates says, knowledge is not sufficient to profit but one also needs care and diligence in order to put his knowledge into effect (XX.2–6). This unused knowledge is not untried theory but neglected skill.
In Plato’s dialogues the relation between knowledge (epistêmê) and craft or skill (technê) is complex and surprising. There is no general and systematic account of either but rather overlapping treatments, reflecting the context of different dialogues. Nevertheless, Plato emphasizes certain characteristics of both that demonstrate a sustained and consistent engagement with the two concepts.
Throughout the dialogues characters frequently cite technê as a way of illustrating important points in their philosophical conversations. Some crafts mentioned are medicine, horsemanship, huntsmanship, oxherding, farming, calculation, geometry, generalship, piloting a ship, chariot-driving, political craft, prophecy, music, lyre-playing, flute-playing, painting, sculpture, housebuilding, shipbuilding, carpentry, weaving, pottery, smithing, and cookery. Each of these activities is associated with the word technê, e.g., medicine with the iatrikê technê. Each is also associated with a practitioner, e.g., medicine with a physician (iatros). Other crafts are mentioned but without practitioners, e.g., arithmetic, flute-making, and sorcery. Socrates uses medicine much more than any other technê; other crafts repeatedly mentioned, albeit less frequently than medicine, are house-building, weaving, political craft, music, shoemaking, piloting a ship, generalship, prophecy, carpentry, farming, horsemanship, flute-playing. To our contemporary ears this list is quite various; it is hard to think that they all have any interesting characteristics in common. Such crafts, or technai, as farming and building have concrete, inanimate products. Horse training and huntsmanship care for animate but non-human beings. Medicine cares for the health of humans. Calculation has neither a concrete product nor does it provide care.
In some dialogues, craft (technê) and knowledge (epistêmê) seem interchangeable in much the same way as in Xenophon’s Socratic dialogues. In the Charmides (165c) Socrates says that medicine, i.e., the physician’s craft (iatrikê technê), is the knowledge (epistêmê) of health. In Euthydemus (281a) Socrates says that what guides right use of materials in carpentry is the knowledge of carpentry (techtonikê epistêmê). In Ion (532c) Socrates tells the rhapsode Ion that he is not able to talk about Homer with craft and knowledge. In Protagoras (356d-e) Socrates refers to measuring as both a craft and a kind of knowledge.
However, Plato’s interest in technê is not innocent. He uses the notion as a way of explicating central themes, such as virtue, ruling, and the creation of the cosmos. As a consequence, he develops a complex account of technê. First of all, a craft has a function (ergon); this is what it characteristically does or what it characteristically accomplishes. In fact, crafts are differentiated by their specific functions (erga)(Rep. 346a). A similar idea is assumed in the exchange between Dionysiodorus and Socrates (Euthydemus 301c), as it is by Socrates in Euthyphro (13d) and Ion (537c). While the ergon of a craft is its goal, the goal is frequently identified with a result separate from the activity of the craft. In the Euthydemus (291e) the goal (ergon) of medicine is health just as food is the goal (ergon) of farming. When in the Charmides (165e) Critias denies that calculation has an ergon, in the way that a house is the ergon of building or a garment of weaving, Socrates answers that nevertheless calculation is about the odd and the even. His answer suggests the possibility of a technê whose goal is not a separate result — an idea to be found in the Statesman. Still in the Gorgias (453e–454a) Socrates argues that calculation produces as its ergon persuasion about the amount of the odd and the even — a result separate from the activity of calculation.
As the concept of technê develops, the role of reflective knowledge is emphasized. Whereas technê is associated with knowing how to do (epistasthai) certain activities, epistêmê sometimes indicates a theoretical component of technê. For example, the physician knows how to care for the sick (Rep. 342d), to prescribe a regimen (Rep. 407d), to provide for the advantage of the body (Rep. 341e), to make someone healthy (Charm. 174c), to make someone vomit (Laws 933b). However, the epistêmê associated with craft means more than simply how to do certain activities. The physician knows or recognizes (gignôskein) health by medical knowledge (epistêmê) (Charm. 170c). Since health is the goal of the medical craft, the physician understands the goal of the craft. Plato emphasizes this knowledge as a distinct aspect of the craftsman’s skill. Sometimes this aspect is theoretical in the root sense of theôria — looking. In the Cratylus (389a–b) Socrates talks about the carpenter who makes the weaver’s shuttle; he looks to (blepôn) something whose nature is to weave. This latter seems to be a material model because Socrates supposes what would happen if it were to break. In that case, the carpenter looks to the form (eidos) of shuttle, that which is shuttle (ho estin kerkis). In the Gorgias (503d-e) all craftsmen work not at random but look toward the goal of their craft (ergon) so that what each produces will have a certain form. Socrates cites painters, housebuilders, and shipbuilders. In Republic VI Socrates compares philosophers who are rulers to painters who look to a model (484c).
The theoretical aspect is also expressed as articulate reasoning about the goal. In Plato’s view, the ability to explain why he does what he does is one of the most important characteristics of the craftsman. In the Charmides, Socrates says that we test the physician by questioning him since he understands health (Charm. 170e5–7). Expanding on the idea of testing, Socrates says they will investigate the physician in what he says and in what he does, on whether what he says is true and whether what he does is right (171b7–9). This theoretical side of craft is further developed in the Gorgias. In his conversation with Polus and later in his conversation with Callicles, Socrates carries on a sustained reflection about craft. In his conversation with Polus, Socrates distinguishes four crafts (technai: medicine, physical training, judging, and legislating; the first pair are concerned with the body and the latter with the soul (464b). These crafts provide their care always for the best, either of the body or of the soul (464c). Unlike empiric practice (empeiria), technê has an account to give by which it provides the things it provides, an account of what their nature is, so that it can say the cause of each (465a). In the conversation with Callicles, Socrates returns to this account, when he seems especially interested in the ability of technê to give an account. He says medical technê investigates the nature of the thing it cares for (therapeuei) and the cause of what it does and has an account to give of each of them (501a). In the first instance, medicine cares for, or treats, the body; but, more particularly, it cares for the good of the body, i.e., its health. So, this technê has an account to give of health and of what it does to achieve the end of health.
So far then, a craft is defined by its goal and is a kind of knowledge. Fully developed, this knowledge is knowing how to accomplish a goal on the basis of an understanding of the goal; the understanding can be articulated in an account. The account informs and guides the skilled practice. A craftsman’s being able to articulate the goal is most fully developed, perhaps, in the Laws. The Athenian Stranger describes the distinction between the slave doctor and the doctor of free men as resting on the ability to give an account. The slave doctor relies on experience (empeiria) and has no account to give for his procedure. The free doctor not only has an account, he communicates it to his patients as a way of eliciting their cooperation in the course of treatment (720 b–d). Presumably, the patients come to appreciate the reasons for the actions the doctor undertakes as well as the regimen he prescribes because they better understand the nature of health and the way the treatments produce health. In fact, the empiric doctor laughs at the free doctor for instructing his patients — as though he were trying to make them into doctors themselves (857 d-e).
There is a second feature of technê that is vital for understanding its importance to Plato. In the Gorgias, technê is distinguished from empeiria not only by its ability to give an account but also because it seeks the welfare of its object. The physician and the physical trainer seek the welfare of the body, just as the judge and the legislator seek the welfare of the soul (464c). These features of technê figure in one of Plato’s persistent themes, the knowledge needed to rule the city. One of its most important occurrences is in the Republic, where Socrates characterizes ruling as a kind of technê that looks out after the welfare of the city (Rep. 342e). But in other dialogues as well, the authentic ruler has a knowledge, both practical and theoretical, that allows him to achieve what is good for the city. In fact, the passage just cited from the Laws is part of an analogy to explain why the legislator should be able to explain to the citizens the reasons behind the law, and presumably why the law is good for the city.
Indeed, most accounts of knowledge in the dialogues are carried out in the context of such discussions. Even in the Theaetetus, the dialogue most often thought of as dedicated to epistemology, we find the same theme. When he argues against Protagoras’ relativism, Socrates gets the sophist to concede that some people are wiser than others when it comes to what is good for the city (167c–d). Socrates then seizes upon an analogy with medicine. While each person may be the final authority for himself when it comes to what is hot, dry, and sweet for him, in matters of health and disease not everyone knows the healthy for himself nor is he able to cure himself. Just so, while Protagoras may hold that for each city what is fine or base, just or unjust, pious or impious is what the city takes it to be, what is really advantageous for the city is not the same as what it takes to be advantageous (171e – 172b). Although Socrates’ investigation of knowledge becomes more abstract when he introduces being, not-being, likeness and unlikeness, identity and difference, unity and plurality, to this group he adds the fine and the base, the good and the bad (185c–186a). The soul itself investigates these things, trying to determine their being (ousia) and their opposition to one another and the being of that opposition. Finally, the investigation of being, non-being and the other opposites — including the fine and the base, the good and the bad — also reflects both on the being of each and on its usefulness (pros te ousian kai ôpheleian) (186c).While Socrates does not explain what reflecting on their usefulness amounts to, the remark shows a link, however slight, to the original motivation for the investigation of knowledge— i.e., providing what is really advantageous for the city.
Nevertheless, these passages from the Theaetetus draw our attention to a change in the notion of epistêmê. Knowledge of the forms tends to become an end in itself; and in this way the idea of knowledge as pure theory begins to make an appearance in the dialogues. This tension is also prominent in the Republic, of course, where Socrates introduces and develops the notion that rulers should be philosophers, who are defined by their knowledge of forms. At the beginning of the discussion of philosophical rulers in Republic IV, knowledge and craft fall into a familiar pattern of interchangeability. After defining the three classes in the city, Socrates is looking for the knowledge (epistêmê) in virtue of which the city is well-counseled. He dismisses the crafts of carpentry, smithing, and farming — obviously crafts and called epistêmai (428b–c). While these focus on some partial good for the city, the epistêmê of ruling takes counsel for the city as a whole and what is best for it internally and externally (428 b–d). Then, in Republic V, Socrates introduces an altogether different notion of the knowledge that philosophers will have — one whose object is forms. Indeed this passage defines for most readers Plato’s idea of epistêmê.
Knowledge (epistêmê) is the ability to know the real as it is (477b). The context shows that when Socrates talks about the real, he is referring to the forms. In the Republic, the prominent forms are the forms for the beautiful, the good, and the just. In the Symposium, Socrates describes the form of the beautiful as neither coming to be nor passing away, as not changing in any other way, as never being or even appearing to anyone as anything but beautiful (211a–b). Since an analogous description applies to the good and the just, one can see that forms are very different from the sorts of things we experience through the sensory perception associated with the usual technai. After forms are introduced in the Republic, they are the objects of the most abstract and highest knowledge, afforded by the power of dialectic. At the end of Book VI, Socrates uses the words for knowledge that we have found in other contexts— understanding (gnôsis) and knowledge (epistêmê). However, in the Divided Line passage a new vocabulary is introduced, as though the conception of knowledge has changed in a fundamental way. As he has in other places, Socrates divides the visible world (horaton) from the intelligible (noêton). Whereas before the intelligible had been the undivided field of gnôsis and epistêmê, now it is subdivided into the fields of mathematical or deductive reasoning (dianoia) and the grasping of the unhypothetical beginning point (nous). The latter is the goal of dialectic (511a–b).
Later in Republic VI there is a connection—of a different sort—between technê and epistêmê. Knowledge, in the sense of epistêmê, will be deductive and logical like mathematics; unlike mathematics, its deductions will be based on foundations that need no further justification. In part it will be something like mathematical deduction based on fundamental reality. Two aspects of this account are significant. First, using a mathematical model as the root of this conception of knowledge makes it purely theoretical; it is theoretical because, like calculation in the Charmides (165e), it has no separate product. Its ergon seems to be the activity itself of dialectical thought. Second, in using mathematical thinking as an analogue for dialectic, Socrates is still relying on the notion of technê since both geometry and calculation are technai.
Nevertheless, in the Divided Line, Socrates posits intelligible entities, abstract but real, as objects of mathematical thought and of dialectical knowledge. Although it treats them only as hypotheses, mathematics reasons about the odd and the even, the various kinds of shapes, and the three kinds of angles. These are entities distinct from their perceptual representation in material diagrams. In turn, dialectic does not treat forms as hypotheses but comes to know what each is. This knowledge comes from grasping their relation to the unhypothetical beginning point, the form of the good (509d-511e). The super-eminence of the knowledge of the good leads to the latter’s becoming an end in itself. When philosophers, after years of study, at last see the good, they would prefer to stay at this level and not go back down into the city to rule. They must be forced, by argument, to undertake the task of applying their knowledge of the forms to the affairs of ruling (519c–520e). So, when this account introduces abstract but real entities as objects of knowledge, Socrates comes close to giving theoretical knowledge a sphere of activity that is distinct from that of practical knowledge.
Nevertheless, even though epistêmê is tied to forms, it still has a role in technê. First, at the beginning of Republic VI, Socrates gives his interlocutors a peculiar description of what the philosopher will do with this knowledge of reality. Converting Socrates’ negative description of the non-philosopher, we find that the philosopher has a knowledge (gnôsis) of the reality of each form, thus a clear paradigm in his soul. Like painters, philosophers look to (apoblepontes) the truest paradigm, always referring to it and contemplating it as accurately as possible; in this way they establish here the laws respecting the fine, the just, and the good, if there is need to establish them, or take care to preserve those that are established (484c–d). By comparing philosophers to painters who imitate a paradigm, Socrates is giving to the knowledge of forms a role within a kind of craft which imitates forms. This notion of imitating forms is an important one for Plato; he uses it again in the account of creation in the Timaeus. At 28a, the Demiurge — the craftsman of the universe — looking at (blepôn) that which does not change and using it as a paradigm, fashions its form and power into his creation. In the subsequent passage we learn that this unchanging paradigm is the intelligible animal that contains all other intelligible animals (30c–d).
Besides the contexts in which epistêmê of forms results in imitating them, the dialogues offer another important way of reconciling knowledge of forms and technê. In the Sophist, the Visitor from Elea elaborates an analogy between technê and dialectic, whose objects are clearly forms. He begins with the idea that there is a technê for telling which letters join to which, just as there is technê for which musical notes mingle and which do not (253a ff). Then the Visitor turns to the kinds (genê) that he has just introduced: being, rest, motion, sameness, and difference (254d-e). Making an analogy with the grammatical and musical technai, he posits a sort of knowledge (epistêmê) for showing which kinds harmonize and which do not. This is also the knowledge of how to discriminate according to kinds, which the Visitor calls dialectic. While this knowledge of how to distinguish and to harmonize forms is compared to craft, it is not productive, the way carpentry is productive. However, in the Statesman, the Visitor takes up the relation of dialectic, conceived of as theoretical, with practical knowledge. He contrasts epistêmai that are practical — like carpentry — and those which are for knowledge only (258d). The Visitor calls them respectively the practical (praktikê) and the theoretical (gnôstikê — clearly related to gnôsis and gignôskein)(259d). The practical epistêmai cover what are otherwise called crafts; however, the theoretical is subdivided into (a) epistêmai like calculation, which only judges or distinguishes the things known and (b) epistêmai like that of the architect (architektôn), which command and are thus called commanding (epitaktikê) (259e). The Visitor may seem to have blurred his original distinction between practical and theoretical by including commanding knowledge (epitaktikê) in the latter category. Still, the notion that at least part of theoretical knowledge only judges the things known gives us a basis for distinguishing theoretical from practical knowledge. The former entails craft-like skill; but the skill remains focused on the objects of knowledge. In calculation the objects are numbers; in dialectic they are the kinds. This kind of knowledge has no product separate from its activity; by contrast, practical knowledge actually produces something separate, in the way carpentry does. This way of expressing the difference suggests that theoretical epistêmê is not so much a body of knowledge as an ability to grasp very abstract sorts of distinctions.
Still, by including commanding knowledge, the Visitor has left a middle ground between the purely theoretical and the practical. Certainly architecture is not practical since it does not directly produce anything, in the way carpentry does. However, it does give commands, whose effects are practical; thus, it is not for knowledge only, in the way in which calculation is for knowledge only. Insofar as architecture is an analogue for the political craft, the Visitor seems to be exploiting this middle ground (259e). It is as though the Visitor is trying to associate the political craft with the most abstract disciplines, like geometry, even though it has to have practical impact. In fact, including commanding knowledge under theoretical knowledge reflects again the tension between the knowledge needed to rule and the elaboration of that knowledge. The ruler needs to be able to engage in purely theoretical investigation; he also needs to bring order into the city. The Visitor turns to the latter activity when he compares the kingly or political knowledge to weaving. Finally, he arrives at the conclusion that the kingly knowledge weaves together all the other epistêmai — like generalship and judging — as well as the laws and those things having to do with the city (305e). While no resolution is offered to this tension, two features of this long discussion are suggestive. If the kingly or political epistêmê is like weaving, it depends on the ability first of all to distinguish what it will weave together. Insofar as dialectic is the skill of distinguishing the things known, it can serve as preliminary to weaving because it is preliminary to showing how the kinds harmonize. Further, if political knowledge is like architecture, it is a commanding knowledge (epitaktikê epistêmê); it gives commands. If we search for the source of these commands, a likely source is the relations and distinctions to be found among forms. If so, the abstract structures discovered by gnôstikê are normative for the city, the way the forms are in the Republic.
The obvious place to begin a consideration of epistêmê and technê in Aristotle’s writings is in Book VI of the Nicomachean Ethics. Here Aristotle makes a very clear distinction between the two intellectual virtues, a distinction which is not always observed elsewhere in his work. He begins with the rational soul (to te logon echon) which is divided into the calculating part (to logistikon) and the scientific part (to epistêmonikon). With the calculating part we consider (theôroumen) things which could be otherwise whereas with the scientific part we consider things which could not be otherwise. When he adds that calculation and deliberation are the same, he indicates why calculation is about what could be otherwise; no one deliberates about what cannot be otherwise (1139a5–15). Things which could be otherwise are, e.g., the contingencies of everyday life; things which could not be otherwise are, e.g., the necessary truths of mathematics. With this distinction between a reality which is contingent and a reality which is necessary, Aristotle has laid the foundation for the strong distinction between technê and epistêmê.
Then the account turns to action (praxis), where we find the kind of thought that deals with what is capable of change. The efficient cause of actions is choice (prohairesis). The cause of choice is desire (orexis) and reasoning toward an end (logos ho heneka tinos). Thought (dianoia) by itself moves nothing, only thought that is practical (praktikê) and for the sake of an end. So, practical thought (dianoia praktikê) belongs to the calculative part and pertains to practical truth; theoretical thought (theôrêtikê dianoia) belongs to the the scientific part and pertains to truth and falsity. In turn, practical thought governs productive (poiêtikê) action. The latter has an end separate from the action, i.e., the product; we will see that this kind of practical thought is technê. Underlining the way action requires the two elements of the soul, Aristotle sums up by saying choice can be called intellect fused with desire (orektikos nous) or desire fused with thought (orexis dianoêtikê) (1139a17–1139b5). While this chapter suggests that the truth sought by practical thought is different in kind from the truth sought by theoretical thought—because their respective objects are different—it ends with the summary claim that attaining truth is the function of both parts of the rational soul; then he turns to the virtues which make the soul able to attain the truth.
There are five virtues of thought: technê, epistêmê, phronêsis, sophia, and nous (1139b15). Various translations have been offered for each of these terms. Most often, technê is translated as craft or art. While epistêmê is generally rendered as knowledge, in this context, where it is used in its precise sense, it is sometimes translated as scientific knowledge. However, one must not confuse this usage with our contemporary understanding of science, which includes experimentation. Conducting experiments to confirm hypotheses is a much later development. Rather, translating epistêmê as scientific knowledge is a way of emphasizing its certainty. In any event, as soon as Aristotle introduces these five terms, he turns to the distinction between the first two virtues. First he defines epistêmê, as he says, in its accurate sense and leaving aside its analogous uses. Scientific knowledge is distinguished by its objects, which do not admit of being otherwise; these objects are eternal and exist of necessity. More precisely, scientific knowledge comprises demonstration, starting from first principles; the latter must also be known, although they are not known by demonstration (1139b15–30). The full account of epistêmê in the strict sense is found in Posterior Analytics, where Aristotle says that we think we know something without qualification (epistasthai…haplôs) when we think we know (gignôskein) the cause by which the thing is, that it is the cause of the thing, and that this cannot be otherwise (71b10–15). As though to emphasize the necessity of what is known, he most frequently uses geometry as an example of epistêmê. In this regard, it should be pointed out that Aristotle uses the notion of cause (aitia) in a broader sense than it usually has in contemporary thought. Thus, understanding how the geometrical axioms lead to a theorem that right triangles have a certain property would be an instance, for Aristotle, of understanding the cause of the proven property of the right triangle.
The two virtues of thought that deal with what can be otherwise, i.e., what is contingent, are technê and phronêsis, craft and practical wisdom. Aristotle emphasizes the former, a disposition (hexis) with respect to making (poiêsis), is distinct from the latter, a disposition with respect to doing (praxis). First, technê is a disposition that produces something by way of true reasoning; it is concerned with the bringing into existence (peri genesin) of things that could either exist or not. The principle (archê) of these things is in the one who makes them, whereas the principle of those things that exist by necessity or by nature is in the things themselves (1140a1–20). For instance, carpentry makes this house and medicine produces health in a particular case. What is contingent is whether this house exists or whether health exits in this case. Since what it produces could exist or not, its products are one of the ways craft deals with the contingent.
By contrast, practical wisdom does not make something separate the way craft does. Its province is doing (praxis) and not making (poiêsis). Presumably Aristotle is relying on a distinction between activity, whose end is in itself, and making, whose end is a product separate from the activity of making. When someone plays the flute, e.g., typically there is no further product of playing; playing the flute is an end in itself. However, when one makes a house, e.g., the activity of making a house is not an end in itself but has a product, which is separate from the activity. This distinction is clearer in the opening paragraphs of the Nicomachean Ethics. There Aristotle says that each technê, investigation, action (praxis), and undertaking seems to aim at some good. The ends vary, however; some ends are the activities themselves and some ends are products (erga) beyond the activities. As examples of these latter kinds of ends, he cites health as the end of medicine, a ship as the end of shipbuilding, and victory as the end of generalship; these ends are products separate from the respective activities (1094a5–10).
The distinction between making and doing is also important for another distinction, in Book Two, between craft (technê) and virtue (aretê) because virtue is a kind of doing. The value of the works (ginomena) of technai is in the works themselves--because they are of a certain sort. Whereas the value of a virtuous action depends on the agent, who must act with knowledge (eidôs) and deliberately choose the action for itself; finally, the action must come from a fixed disposition of character. The latter two features do not belong to technê (1105a25–1105b5). Presumably, then, the craftsman does not choose his activity for itself but for the end; thus the value of the activity is in what is made. In the case of virtue, by contrast, the value is not in a separate product but in the activity itself. In the light of what Aristotle says about the activity of virtue, we can better understand practical wisdom. For it, doing well (eupraxia) is an end in itself. However, this end is quite expansive; it is doing well as a human being, living life well in general.
Aristotle ends this chapter by saying that practical wisdom belongs to the second part of the rational soul, i.e., the part whose object is what is contingent. Its virtue is the ability to form opinion (doxa) with respect to what is contingent (1140a1–1140b30). Of course, craft also belongs to this part of the rational soul. So, it appears that both of these intellectual virtues, which deal with contingent reality, form (scil. true) opinions. In the case of technê, the opinions are the basis for production; and in the case of phronêsis, the opinions are the basis for living well. By making explicit the role of opinion in dealing with contingent reality, Aristotle has marked the fundamental difference between epistêmê, as scientific knowledge, and technê.
With this distinction we seem to have, at last, the classic division between the purely theoretical and the purely practical. Scientific knowledge concerns itself with the world of necessary truths, which stands apart from the world of everyday contingencies, the province of craft. Still, there are many problems of interpretation surrounding this description of scientific knowledge in Posterior Analytics. While we cannot address them in this article, we can at least point out a central one. The description just given of epistêmê makes scientific knowledge into a deductive system in which the relations among terms are invariable and necessary. The problem for commentators has been how to reconcile this description of epistêmê with Aristotle’s actual procedure in such treatises as the Physics and De Anima, where one does not find a deductive system of invariable and necessary relations. One possible explanation is that these treatises are preliminary sketches for a truly scientific treatise. So one could envision another Physics which would be a series of deductions, all expressing invariable and necessary truths about nature. However, this charitable assessment does not avoid all problems. In Metaphysics II, Aristotle explicitly undermines the possibility of an epistêmê, in the strict sense, with respect to nature. At the end of Book II, Aristotle makes a distinction between the accuracy to be found in mathematics and that in other disciplines. Mathematical accuracy, he says, cannot be expected in all things but only in those which do not contain matter. In particular, then, one cannot expect mathematical accuracy in the study of nature since it is concerned with matter (995a15–20). If ‘mathematical accuracy’ means the grasp of necessary and invariable relations among terms, then the study of nature will, by definition, have no such accuracy because what it studies contains matter. About nature, then, we might have to settle for something less than epistêmê in the strict sense. Indeed, in Book VI of the Metaphysics, Aristotle seems to make a major concession on the issue of epistêmê when he says that there is no knowledge of the accidental, i.e., what happens infrequently, because all epistêmê is of that which is always or for the most part (hôs epi to polu) (1027a20). Instead of grasping what is always and necessary, knowledge can then grasp what happens for the most part, e.g., the regularities of nature, to which there are exceptions.
There is, then, some ambivalence in Aristotle’s use of the term epistêmê. For our purposes in this article, we will leave suspended the question whether epistêmê in the strict sense is achievable in the study of nature. Still, we can recognize a secondary sense of epistêmê, since Aristotle in some contexts uses epistêmê although the strict conditions do not hold. One of these contexts appears to be the study of nature. Whether in the study of nature epistêmê in this secondary sense is the best that can be done or whether it can be converted into epistêmê in the strict sense, there is still a secondary sense of epistêmê, one that is not defined in terms of what is eternal and necessary. As we shall see, this secondary sense is important for understanding the relation between technê and epistêmê.
Now that we have traced Aristotle’s way of distinguishing craft from scientific knowledge and from virtue, we can focus on craft as productive. As we have just seen, craft produces something by way of true reasoning. Aristotle also gives us a very interesting sketch of this practical reasoning at work. In an important example from Metaphysics VII we see how the account of the goal is the basis for reasoning which ends in action. In production the form is in the soul of the one who produces; in the case of medicine, health is such a form. To begin with, health is knowledge (epistêmê) and an account (logos) in the soul. Then the physician engages in the following kind of reasoning: since health is this particular state, if the patient is to be healthy, he should have this other particular state, for instance homogeneity, and if he is to have homogeneity, he should have heat. The physician continues to reason in this way until he arrives at the last step, the thing he can do. From this point the process, which aims at health, is called production (1032b1–10).
With this sketch of practical reasoning we can come to closer grips with what sorts of things could not be otherwise. Let us begin with health and the claim that the physician has an account of health. It is health that is the cause of the steps in the practical reasoning because it explains what is to be done. In what way does health admit of being otherwise? One possibility is that what constitutes health is not invariable; thus the account of health would not be invariable. While it seems unlikely that health is variable in this sense, what obviously could be otherwise is whether health exists in this particular case or not. If health does not exist in this case, it is up to medicine to restore it. In this sense, as well, all of the steps prescribed by the practical reasoning could be otherwise. In the case of this patient, homogeneity may or may not exist; heat may or may not exist. However, there is another sense in which the steps in the syllogism might admit of being otherwise. Each step alleges a productive relation — e.g., heat produces homogeneity. Now, there is a sense in which these relations could be otherwise. While heat produces homogeneity, in a particular case heat causing homogeneity may or may not exist because there may or may not be heat. To say of all these conditions that they could be otherwise, then, implies that they could or could not exist. Whether these conditions exist or not depends on an agent bringing them into existence. So the field of craft is those conditions that can be brought into existence by an agent.
To this kind of contingency, however, another must be added. The productive relation can be contingent in another sense. It is contingent whether heat, e.g., produces homogeneity. Heat does not invariably nor necessarily produce homogeneity, although it does do so for the most part (Prior Analytics, 32b5–20). There are, then, two kinds of contingency possible in practicing medicine. The first kind has to do with whether the physician acts or not; the second kind has to do with whether the productive relation holds or not. On the one hand, if the first kind of contingency held but the second did not, the physician would have a nearly sovereign command of health. If the productive relations between heat and homogeneity and between homogeneity and health were invariable and necessary, then so long as the physician could produce heat, he could invariably produce health. On the other hand, if the productive connections were not invariable and necessary — but only held for the most part — then the physician could reliably but not invariably produce health (Metaphysics, 1026b30–1027a25). One could say of contingent productive connections that they hold unless something unusual happens, that, e.g., heat always causes homogeneity unless something unusual intervenes. Accidental factors — by definition factors which arise infrequently — can defeat the causal link between heat and homogeneity. But since accidental factors are infrequent, one can claim that for the most part heat causes homogeneity. In view of this kind of contingency, what the physician can claim to know is that heat produces homogeneity unless something unusual intervenes. In his deliberations, what he does not know is when something unusual will happen (Nicomachean Ethics, 1112a20–1112b10).
Scientific knowledge, in the strict sense, does not deal with these kinds of contingency. Nevertheless, Aristotle still describes medicine — which does deal with contingency — as an epistêmê, as we have seen. Indeed, from time to time, Aristotle mentions epistêmê and technê in the same breath, as though they are not as distinct as Nicomachean Ethics VI would make them seem. In the Physics (194a20), Aristotle argues that the student of nature will study both form and matter. To illustrate he says that it belongs to the same epistêmê to study the form as well as the matter; the physician, for instance, studies health as well as bile and phlegm. In Nicomachean Ethics, in his polemic against the Platonic notion of the good itself— using epistêmê and technê indifferently — Aristotle says the physician does not study health as such but human health — even the health of this human because it is individuals that he cures (1097a10–15). Clearly, if medicine is an epistêmê which studies health, it is also a technê which produces health. If he were using epistêmê in its strict sense, he ought not to have called medicine epistêmê. Indeed, the mixing of epistêmê and technê is not confined to medicine. In Nicomachean Ethics II, when he illustrates the notion of the mean between extremes, he cites experts in physical training. Generalizing, he says that every epistêmê achieves well its goal (ergon) by looking at the mean and using that as a standard in its products. Then when he says next that the good craftsmen technitai (craftsmen) and technê look to the mean, he shows there is no hard distinction between epistêmê and technê in this context (1106b5–15).
Thus, a mixed picture of epistêmê and technê begins to emerge. While technê deals with things which could be otherwise, Aristotle still has a tendency to call it epistêmê. The reason for this tendency is probably that, while the person with technê does not have epistêmê in the strict sense, he has something close to it. At the beginning of the Metaphysics, Aristotle says that the person with epistêmê and the person with technê share an important similarity. There Aristotle contrasts the person of experience (empeiria) with someone who has technê or epistêmê. The former knows that, when Callias had such and such disease, thus and such helped him, and the same for Socrates and many others. However, the person who has a technê goes beyond experience to a universal judgment. This judgment is that this remedy helped all individuals of this type, with this disease. Examples of the types of individuals are the phlegmatic and the bilious, when afflicted with a burning fever (981a5–15). However, it is important to note that the universals cited — phlegmatic and bilious — have a role to play in explaining a fever and, thus, a role to play in the account of a cure. As Aristotle says, the master craftsman (technitês) is wiser than the person of experience because he knows the cause, the reasons that things are to be done. The mere artisan (cheirotechnês) acts without this knowledge (981a30–b5). Aristotle goes on to say that in general the sign of knowing or not knowing (tou eidotos kai mê eidotos) is being able to teach. Because technê can be taught, we think it, rather than experience, is epistêmê ( 981b10). Presumably the reason that the one with technê can teach is that he knows the cause and reason for what is done in his technê. So we can conclude that the person with technê is like the person with epistêmê; both can make a universal judgment and both know the cause. Of course, the epistêmê in question is not meant in the strict sense; technê is like epistêmê only in the secondary sense.
Still, even if the craftsman is capable of a universal judgment about the cause of disease, we ought not to conclude that there is no difference between technê and epistêmê, even in the secondary sense. We can take our cue from the kind of accuracy Aristotle says is to be expected in the study of the supreme good. In Nicomachean Ethics I 3, he says that it is political science (politikê epistêmê) which pursues this study (1094b1). Since there is disagreement and error surrounding the topic of the good, we must be content, concerning such a subject and relying on similar premises, to show the truth roughly and in outline. Given a subject and premises that hold for the most part (hôs epi to polu) similar conclusions will follow. He adds that it is the mark of an educated person to seek the amount of accuracy (takribes) that the nature of the subject matter permits (1094b20–25). Later in Book I, Aristotle returns to the problem of the accuracy appropriate to different undertakings; one must seek accuracy (akribeian) according to each subject matter and to the degree that is appropriate to the method for investigating it. He illustrates this problem by comparing geometry with carpentry. Both seek (epizêtousi) the right angle, the latter insofar as it is useful for his product and the former as to what it is and its properties, since he is looking for the truth (1098a25–30). Here Aristotle suggests the notion of practical accuracy, clearly distinct from mathematical accuracy, is possibly distinct from the accuracy of the study of nature. After all, the accuracy needed for production might also fall short of the standard required by the study of nature, even when this study is epistêmê in the secondary sense. Finally, nothing in the last distinction undermines the claim that technê is clearly distinct from epistêmê in the strict sense. The former is confined to the world of contingencies; the domain of the latter is what is necessary.
4. The Stoics
Among the Stoics, the relation between epistêmê and technê is the richest and most focused of all the accounts we have so far considered. That relation is enmeshed in the Stoic account of virtue, in which the two notions of knowledge and craft flow together in forming the science and art of living. Zeno refers to a technê which cures the diseases of the soul (SVF, i.e. Stoicorum Veterum Fragmenta, I 323) and Chrysippus says that practical judgment (phronêsis) is a kind of technê concerning the things having to do with life (SVF II 909). While virtue is compared to a technê, it is also a complete and unshakeable understanding of the universe. It has then some of the features of an epistêmê in Aristotle’s strong sense. Clearly, such a position rests on the basis of peculiar Stoic doctrines. We can begin with the Stoic idea of impulse to action. Diogenes Laertius says that, according to the Stoics, an animal has self-preservation as the object of its first impulse (hormê). So, the first thing appropriate (oikeios) to every animal – including humans – is its own constitution and the consciousness of this. Impulse leads every animal to seek what is appropriate to it and rejects what is not appropriate. In addition, the constitution of adult humans includes reason; so, reason supervenes on what would be purely automatic impulses in other animals. Stoics say that reason is itself the craftsman (technitês) of the adult’s impulses (Diogenes Laertius 7.85–6).
For the Stoics, however, reason’s being the craftsman of all adult human impulses does not imply a division between the rational and any non-rational parts of the soul. Orthodox Stoics do not divide the soul into reason and non-rational desires. Without this division there is no basis for a distinction between epistêmê as an intellectual virtue and reason as exercising a kind of technê with respect to some non-rational element. Rather, there is only the reasoning (dianoia) and governing principle (hêgemonikon) which is capable of opposite states and thus becomes either virtue or vice (Plutarch, On moral virtue 441 C–D). Moral weakness or hesitancy comes from alternating judgments about what is morally right (446E–447A). Such an account implies that reason controls impulse solely by its judgments. One’s emotions, then, are not independent of reason; they cannot pursue as good something different from what reason takes to be good. In those who do not know what the good is, reason gives rise to mistaken impulses to action. For instance, the belief that health is good is mistaken because only virtue is good; still, this mistaken belief is expressed as fear at the prospect of losing one’s health, which, in turn, can move one to preserve health at the expense of virtue. However, in the one who knows that virtue is the only good – the sage – reason, unimpeded by fear, gives rise to impulses that aim only at virtue. If reason is the craftsman of impulse and if technê implies knowledge, then it molds one’s impulsive feelings, i.e., the ones that lead one to act, through knowledge of the good.
However, this knowledge of the good locates what is good for the sage in what is good for the whole universe. Zeno says that the end of life is to live in accordance with nature. In fact, living in accordance with nature is the same as virtue (Diogenes Laertius, 7.87). Chrysippus modifies Zeno’s claim when he says that living in accordance with virtue is equivalent to living in accordance with the experience of what happens by nature. What happens by nature is governed by universal law, which is right reason pervading everything and is identical with Zeus, who is the leader of the governance of everything (Diogenes Laertius, 7.87–8). The consequence is that the sage’s reason, endowed with knowledge of the way right reason pervades the universe, supervenes on impulse with the good of the whole in view. Chrysippus says that there is no other or more appropriate way of approaching the account of things which are good and bad or the virtues or happiness than from universal nature and from the governance of the universe. (Plutarch. On Stoic Self-contradictions 1035 C–D)
At this point, we can appreciate the way Stoicism presents a distinct view of the relation between epistêmê and technê. Socratic intellectualism holds that what one knows to be good is sufficient for one to do what is good; but it has no moral psychology to justify the claim. Finding the claim itself paradoxical, Plato explains the hesitancy to do what one knows to be good by introducing non-rational elements into the soul. (See the entry on ancient ethical theory, especially the sections on Socrates and on Plato.) Finally, the Stoics return to a form of Socratic intellectualism. However, Stoicism provides the missing moral psychology with its doctrine of the unity of the soul. In the soul of the Stoic sage, the knowledge of the good is an unshakeable grasp of what is good both for the sage and for the whole universe. Because of its unity, there is nothing in the soul of the sage to oppose this knowledge. It is as though the Stoics assume that, without opposition, this sort of knowledge would naturally pass over into action once the connection is made with a particular situation. Any reason to think otherwise is false. One type of false opinion is theoretical (and external to moral reasoning) and comes from mistaken views about moral psychology that clutter the soul up with non-rational parts. The other type is practical (and internal to moral reasoning) and comes from failure to know that virtue is living in accordance with nature and is the only good. This type of false opinion gives rise to such emotions as fear, which impede living in accordance with nature. Once these are swept away, knowledge of what is good is motivation enough to act. In the sage, then, where the unity of the soul is perfected, the theoretical grasp characteristic of epistêmê just is a technê.
The way this technê works is illustrated in another widely held Stoic teaching, i.e., the unity of the virtues. Zeno held that virtue is practical knowledge (phronêsis) in various forms. When phronêsis deals with what is owed to others it is justice (dikaiosunê); when it deals with what should be chosen it is moderation (sôphrosunê); when it deals with what must be endured it is courage (andreia). In all of these definitions Zeno means phronêsis to be knowledge (epistêmê) (Plutarch, On moral virtue 441A). According to Sextus, the Stoics say that phronêsis, being knowledge (epistêmê) of the good and the evil, provides a technê concerning life (SVF III 598). Here we can see the ‘sage’ or fully perfected human being has a kind of insight into what is good and bad in each situation of life. In its particularity, this insight is like that of a master craftsman, who knows what is appropriate at each juncture of his practice. And like the master craftsman, the sage reacts appropriately both in the way he feels and in the way he acts.
Still, there is room for a distinction between epistêmê and technê. Several authors attribute to Zeno the notion that a technê is a systematic collection of cognitions (katalêpseis) unified by practice for some goal advantageous in life (SVF I 73). The difference between technê and epistêmê properly speaking is that the latter is said to be secure and unshakeable by reason (Stobaeus 2.73,16–74,3). In general, however, technê does not have the same kind of stability (Cicero, On Ends III.50). Indeed, such technai as love of music, and liberal arts in general, are not even called knowledge (Stobaeus, 2.67, 5–12; cf Seneca, Letters 88). Nevertheless, such distinctions between epistêmê and technê do not keep the Stoics from characterizing virtue as technê. This special technê does consist in a secure and unshakeable insight into what is appropriate at each juncture of life.
A significant refinement of this technê is found in Cicero’s On Ends. In Book V, Piso, representing the views of Antiochus of Ascalon, gives an overview of philosophical schools. The account depends on the notion of the highest good (summum bonum) because differences about the highest good define the possible schools. The explication of these differences begins with an analogy drawn from the crafts (artes, Cicero’s Latin for the Greek technai). First of all, the art is different from its object. Second, as medicine is the art of health and navigation the art of guiding ships, so prudence (practical wisdom) is the art of how to live (vivendi ars est prudentia). Piso presents this last claim as common to all the schools, or at least as a good way to present an element which is common. Next he says that whatever prudence would aim for is something suited to our nature and the object of natural impulse (what the Greeks call hormê). Stoics hold that prudence aims for the primary objects of nature. The primary objects of nature include such things as life and health. However, Stoics do not hold that actually obtaining the primary objects of nature is the highest good. Rather they maintain that making every effort to obtain them (i.e., appropriate ones among them, given the circumstances), even if one is unsuccessful, is morality and is the only thing desirable for itself and the highest good (V.16–20).
If life and health are among the primary objects of nature, then the Stoic teaching is that doing everything to obtain life and health is morality. But this claim must be qualified; it is not moral to strive for life and health in an unjust way. Another of the primary objects of nature is human solidarity. Thus, making every effort to obtain life and health (and the other primary objects of nature) is the same as being virtuous, just as making every effort to cure a patient is the same as following the craft of medicine. Whether the sage actually obtains life and health (or his other specific objectives in his actions) is beyond his control. Finally, however, virtuously striving for these is more important than obtaining them — it is, in fact, the only true good.
In Book III, the Stoic Cato explains this complicated position. Human beings begin life automatically and instinctively seeking the primary objects of nature, but as their power of reason develops, they come to realize, if they attain a correct understanding, that moral action is really the end of life. So they shift the aim of their life, from the primary objects of nature themselves to doing everything possible to attain them. Using an analogy to marksmanship, Cato says that someone who makes it his purpose to hit the target would do everything he could to hit the target. Thus, he says, his end would be to try everything he could. Cato’s thought is that the sage will aim for such things as health; however, the good — and therefore the end he seeks — is in the way he pursues health. Thus, actually getting health is preferable to not getting it, but pursuing it in a moral way is what is desirable in itself. So, he explains, wisdom (sapientia) is not like medicine or navigation but closer to acting and dancing, where the end is the exercise of the art and is in the art itself and not external to it. Even this analogy to the art of dancing is not quite adequate. According to Cato, a virtuous action entails all the virtues; presumably he means, e.g., a just action is also moderate and courageous. However, not every dance movement includes all the possible dance steps (III. 22–25). In sum, the Stoics give us the powerful idea that the excellent human life, and happiness, is the same thing as performing in an artful way, striving for a life of natural satisfactions, but actually finding ultimate value in the way one strives.
5. Alexander of Aphrodisias
In commenting on the notion of contingency in Aristotle’s Prior Analytics, Alexander introduces the idea of stochastic technê — an idea important for the Stoic explanation of virtue that we have just seen. Aristotle himself recognizes a kind of knowledge that deals with things that happen for the most part; what happens for the most part is distinct from what may or may not happen (Prior Analytics, 32b5–20). In his commentary on the kind of syllogism relative to what happens for the most part, Alexander calls the technai that use this kind of syllogism stochastic. The root sense of ‘stochastic’ is the ability to aim or hit. Obviously there is an ambiguity in the notion. A necessary condition of being able reliably to hit the target is being able to aim; but aiming and hitting are different. If one aims well, she usually hits, but contingencies can intervene. Stochastic technai are ones subject to this kind of contingency. Alexander calls them stochastic, in the sense of conjectural (In An.Pr. 39, 15–40, 5). When the physician, e.g., aims at health, his aiming is a kind of conjecture, albeit a grounded one, that such and such treatment will produce health.
Alexander develops the notion of stochastic technê further in his commentary on Aristotle’s Topics. Addressing the problem that dialectic does not always achieve its goal, i.e., leading the interlocutor to a contradiction, he divides technai into ones which achieve their ends by definite steps and those which cannot (In Top. 32,10–34,1). Given materials, tools, and other conditions, carpentry, e.g., can produce houses by following a series of steps each of which is effective in a determinate way. However, medicine does not always cure and certainly does not cure with the reliability that carpentry produces houses. Even though medicine tries everything in its power, chance can intervene so that it does not achieve its goal, the curing of the patient. When carpentry, by contrast, tries everything in its power, it achieves its goal. If there is failure, it is the result not of chance but of error in executing the technê, as Alexander says in Quaestiones (Quaestio 2.16, 10–25). To mark the difference between these two kinds of technê, Alexander says that the task (ergon) of medicine is to try everything possible to achieve its goal (telos); but achieving its goal is not (totally) within the power of medicine. He calls stochastic, then, the sorts of technê whose task is to try everything possible to achieve its goal, the realization of the goal being subject to chance.
In a different vein, Alexander makes an interesting addition to Aristotle’s distinction between epistêmê and technê. In his account of wisdom in Book One of the Metaphysics, Aristotle argues that knowledge is valued for its own sake. In one place, Aristotle says that what distinguishes experience (empeiria) from technê is that the latter has a rational account, which explains what it does. Of course, the one with experience may be more effective than the inexperienced person who has only the rational account. Still, we think the craftsman wiser than the empiric because of his knowledge of the account (Metaphysics 981a 5–30). The suppressed conclusion is that wisdom is characterized by knowledge of causes quite apart from the utility of knowing the causes. Another argument shows that wisdom is not productive knowledge. Since wonder is the beginning of philosophy, satisfying that wonder is an end in itself. In fact, this kind of pursuit arose when the requirements of necessity and ease were satisfied (Metaphysics 982b 10–15). So wisdom is knowledge without practical utility, an end in itself.
In his commentary on the Metaphysics, Alexander interprets these arguments as showing that pure knowledge is superior to action. But there is a difference between the claim that there is a kind of knowledge which is an end in itself and the claim that pure knowledge is superior to action. The latter idea is a distinct development in thinking about the relation between knowledge and craft. This development rests on the notion that action implies need and it is better to be without need. So knowledge that fills no need is superior to action, which fills some need or other. We see this idea at work in the auxiliary arguments which Alexander offers to back up or explicate claims made in Aristotle’s text. For instance, when Alexander first claims that Aristotle means to show that knowledge is more honorable than action, he says that action aims at some end other than itself. As though remembering that virtuous action — unlike productive action — has no end outside itself, he immediately offers an argument to the effect that even virtuous actions have reference to the passions. Divine beings, who are without passions, have no need of virtue. Those who have passions need the virtues in order to control the passions (In Metaph. 2, 1–10). Obviously, to have passions is to be in need. The contrast between the divine and the human also figures in another auxiliary argument. In passing, Aristotle says that one might justifiably think that wisdom is beyond human ability because in many ways human nature is in slavery (Metaphysics 982b30). Alexander explicates the remark about slavery by saying that humans are slaves in that they need such things as health and prosperity. But what is divine is free of all need (In Metaph. 17, 15–20).
Alexander returns to this theme in his commentary on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics. At the beginning of the commentary, he claims that theorizing is the highest of human goods. In making out this claim, Alexander points to the situation of the gods, who are without emotions and therefore do not need the moral virtues. Nor do they need to deliberate. What is left is contemplating the truth. For the gods, theorizing about truth is continuous and uninterrupted. Such a state is impossible for humans in general; but some may approach it. By leaving behind emotions and the human condition, one may engage in the divine activity of pure theorizing. Insofar as one is engaged in this activity, a human becomes like the gods. If becoming like god (homoiôsis theô(i)) is the greatest good for humans, then syllogistic, the method for theorizing, is most valuable (In An. Pr. 5,20 – 6,10). Although expressed hypothetically, becoming like god is being put forth as the greatest good for humans. Even if a human cannot always be in such a state, when he is in a state of continuous and uninterrupted theorizing about the truth, he is just so far forth like god. In this discussion Alexander is building on themes found in Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics (X.7–8). There Aristotle argues that the life of contemplation is happiness because it is the virtue of the highest part of the soul, reason. Since this part is the most god-like, contemplation is in some sense divine activity. Still, in these passages, Aristotle continues to talk about integrating contemplation of truth within the context of a human life. By contrast, Alexander suggests that one might lead — or at least strive for— a god-like life of pure contemplation. In such an account, pure theory is expressly divorced from practice and promoted over it.
As might be expected, Plotinus’ philosophy does not have much use for the concept of technê. Its account of knowledge is fuller than that of craft and is close to Aristotle’s idea of epistêmê in the strong sense. In the Enneads, epistêmê is not directly associated with technê. In the first place, epistêmê refers to the particular cognitive state of the first hypostasis from the One, Nous, in which there is an identity between knowledge and what is known (VI. 6. 15). Our souls gain true knowledge by the presence of Nous, although Nous knows non-discursively while our souls characteristically know in a discursive way (V. 9. 7; IV. 3.18). Discursive knowledge is the sort of knowing that moves from, e.g., premise to conclusion; non-discursive thought, then, is a unitary grasp or understanding. Discursive knowledge, through dialectic, is able to speak in a reasoned way about each thing, say what it is and in what way it differs from others, and what it has in common with those with which it exists, and so on. It does all these things with certain knowledge (epistêmê) and not by opinion (I. 3. 4). Plotinus also uses epistêmê in another sense to refer to the various branches of knowledge which are articulated in theorems (e.g., IV. 3. 2). Since the ideal state for a human is to enjoy the knowledge which is found in Nous and then, beyond that, the contemplation of the One, Plotinus gives short shrift to the civic virtues of courage, justice, and moderation. Once one attains the higher levels, he gives up the civic virtues in their usual sense. At this level, moderation, for instance, is not measure and limit but rather separation from one’s lower nature (I. 2. 7. 25).
Technê, then, is even further down Plotinus’ list of concerns. He gives as examples of technai grammar, rhetoric, lyre playing, music, housebuilding, medicine, and farming (II. 3. 2. 10–15; IV. 4. 31. 15–20). The most important use of the nature of technê is to illustrate points about the coming to be of the universe. Plotinus holds that Nous gives rise to the rational principle (logos) which is responsible for the existence of our universe (III. 2. 2) although the rational principle does not create the universe because the universe neither comes into existence nor perishes (III. 2. 1). Still, Plotinus uses analogies with technê to explain the work of the rational principle. In the treatise on beauty, he says that beauty in the material world comes from shape or form and rational principle; insofar as matter is ordered by these it is beautiful. As an illustration of this point he cites the way technê can bestow beauty on a house and its parts (I. 6. 2). In justifying the presence of both good and evil in the universe, he cites the way a painter includes varying and contrasting elements in painting (III. 2. 11). In another very striking passage, Plotinus invokes the technai of dance, music, and drama to explain the way contrasting elements in the life of the universe are blended (III. 2. 16). Nevertheless, there are ways in which the activity of the rational principle is different from technê. The most important is that rational principle does not reason that the universe should exist; the creative power of rational principle is the power to make another thing without striving for its being made. This power is not acquired or learnt the way a technê is (III. 2. 2). In explaining the way nature works, Plotinus says that nature is productive because of its contemplation of realities in Nous. Its act of contemplation makes what it contemplates— as though the very act of contemplation were automatically productive (III. 8. 4). In a similar vein he says that the universe is an image of reality but does not exist by discursive thought (dianoia) nor by contrivance of craft (epitechnêsis) (II. 9. 8). Plotinus, then, is proposing the interesting notion that pure thought, while distinct from craft, can be productive in its own right.
Hence Plotinus can dismiss technê as later than soul and imitating it, making unclear and weak copies, childish things not worth much, stacking up many devices in making an image of nature (IV. 3. 10). Still, Plotinus makes some interesting claims about craft when he is being less severe. Making an analogy with the beauty in Nous, Plotinus says that the statue is beautiful not because of the stone but because of the form which craft puts in it. Moreover, this beauty which exists in the craft is much better than the beauty expressed in the stone (V. 8. 1). Drawing another analogy between Nous and technê, he says that the forming principles of the universe come from Nous the way the forming principles in the souls of craftsmen come from their crafts (V. 9. 3). Finally he raises the question whether technê might be based somehow in the intelligible world. In answer, he distinguishes those crafts which imitate nature from those which consider proportion in general. The former are painting, sculpture, dance, and mime. However, music deals with proportion of an intelligible kind (V. 9. 11). Music, then, has some grasp of purely intelligible proportion.
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