Notes to Divine Revelation

1. There is a minority report, however, according to which revelation is not an epistemic notion. Ricoeur, for example, holds that “in none of its modalities may revelation be included in and dominated by knowledge” (1980: 93).

2. For a recent Islamic analytic-philosophical analysis of revelation, see Adeel 2019: 30–35.

3. A Christian theological issue with respect to special revelation concerns whether it is “closed” (from the end of the biblical era) or ongoing. There are different views about this, although the majority report is that in some sense, revelation is closed. Many qualify this, however, for example by distinguishing between original (or foundational) and dependent (or participant) revelation (Tillich 1951: 126–128; O’Collins 2016a: Ch. 8). Dependent revelation is conceived as ongoing, a “living encounter with Christ through his Spirit” (O’Collins 2016a: 115). However, this continuing revelation is dependent on the foundational events of biblical history and does not add any new doctrinal content. Another pertinent distinction in this context is between public and private revelation (or major and minor revelations (Swinburne 2007: 3)). Public revelation involves the Bible, biblical history and (according to some churches) normative church tradition. Private revelations, on the other hand, are post-biblical, supernatural apparitions to individuals with no doctrinal import.

Copyright © 2020 by
Mats Wahlberg <mats.wahlberg@umu.se>

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