Charles Leslie Stevenson

First published Fri Apr 15, 2011; substantive revision Wed May 13, 2015

Charles Leslie Stevenson (1908–1979) was a mid-Twentieth Century American philosopher best known for his pioneering work in the field of metaethics (the study of the relations among moral language, thought, reality, and knowledge) and, specifically, as a central figure along with I. A. Richards and A. J. Ayer in the development of emotivism. Emotivism, a precursor to the metaethical expressivism today championed by Simon Blackburn (1984, 1993) and Alan Gibbard (1990, 2003) among others, is typically understood as a theory of moral language according to which ethical terms are used much like exclamative and imperative sentences (‘Hooray!’, ‘Be kind’) to express a speaker's affective, noncognitive psychological states, such as approval or disapproval, rather than to describe (or in addition to describing) some action, person, institution, etc. Stevenson's emotivism, however, was more than a theory of moral language. Rather, it was but one part of a full-blown ethical theory, grounded in moral and linguistic psychology, which was intended to clarify the nature and structure of a whole range of normative problems common to everyday life—ethical, aesthetic, economic, legal, political, etc.—as well as the methods typically used to resolve them. Throughout his work, Stevenson is respectful of the complexity of human experience and the power of signs and sounds to move a person emotionally and behaviorally. Correspondingly, he is impatient with simplistic answers to complex problems, the postulation of entities unverifiable by scientific methods (e.g., non-naturalistic moral properties), and the quest for exceptionless “first principles” of explanation and justification that can be known with certainty.

In this entry, the words ‘ethics’ and ‘morality’ and their cognates, such as ‘ethical’ or ‘moral’, are used interchangeably.

1. Life and Work

C. L. Stevenson was born in 1908 in Cincinnati, Ohio. In his youth, he developed a life-long passion for literature and the arts, especially poetry and music, whose power to influence a person's emotions and actions fascinated him—a fascination that would remain at the center of Stevenson's personal and professional life.

In 1926, Stevenson entered Yale University, earning a prize for best entrance examination for piano at the Yale School of Music. He graduated from Yale in 1930 with a BA in English Literature, a field he intended to pursue upon entering Cambridge University, England later that year. While at Cambridge, however, Stevenson became increasingly attracted to philosophy, in large part because of acquaintances with I. A. Richards, G. E. Moore, and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Each of these figures produced important, and different, kinds of work on the nature, analysis, and use of language, had strong personalities, and shared Stevenson's love for literature, arts, and aesthetics. Stevenson earned his BA in Philosophy from Cambridge in 1933 and entered Harvard that same year to earn his PhD in Philosophy, which he received in 1935. While at Harvard, Stevenson worked closely with Ralph Barton Perry, whose General Theory of Value (1926), conversant in early American pragmatism and early Continental phenomenology, had a lasting influence on Stevenson's work (Sartris 1984; Warnock 1978).

Stevenson remained at Harvard as an instructor for three years until 1938, during which time three early essays were published in Mind: “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms” (1937), “Ethical Judgments and Avoidability” (1938a), and “Persuasive Definitions” (1938b). In 1939, Stevenson accepted the position of Assistant Professor at Yale, where he remained until 1946, and during which time his landmark Ethics and Language was published in 1944. One of the conclusions Stevenson reached in this book was that some ethical disputes may be rationally irresolvable and, thus, would be resolvable if at all only by nonrational methods. Apparently on these grounds, and in the historical context of World War II atrocity, Stevenson was denied tenure.[1] The University of Michigan immediately offered Stevenson a position as Associate Professor, which he accepted, and where he remained until 1978. During his thirty-one year career at Michigan, Stevenson published scores of articles in ethics and aesthetics. The most important of his ethics articles are collected in Facts and Values (1963a), which also contains an informative retrospective essay (1963b) that clarifies, expands, and refines his mature ethical theory. His closely related work in aesthetics remains uncollected.

Stevenson passed away in 1979 in Bennington, Vermont, where he had moved to be near family and where he had accepted a position as Professor of Philosophy at Bennington College. He was survived by his second wife Nora, whom he married in 1965, after the death, two years earlier, of his first wife, Louise. With Louise, Stevenson had three children, including acclaimed poet Anne Stevenson.

2. Ethics and Psychology

2.1 Ethical Theory and Practical Problems

For Stevenson, a field of study is demarcated by the kinds of problems into which it inquires. Biology inquires into problems concerning life; history inquires into problems concerning past social events and cultural developments; etc. Ethics inquires into ethical problems, problems about what is good or bad, what ought or ought not be done, how we ought or ought not feel about something, etc. Ethical problems are ubiquitous. They are the “problems that are familiar in everyday discussions, and which range from idle bits of gossip about this or that man's character to prolonged and serious discussions of international politics” (1963a, v). Stevenson conceives of his work as having “far less to say about the summum bonum of the philosophers than about the judgments of the ordinary man as he finishes reading the morning's newspaper” (1963a, v).

Stevenson viewed normative ethics—the branch of ethics which seeks to resolve ethical problems in a systematic, rigorous way—as the most important branch of ethics (e.g., 1944, 1 and 336). But he also viewed normative ethics as having long been an embarrassment owing to its practitioners' stubborn, “age old quest” for foundational, exceptionless moral principles that could be known with certainty (1944, 336; 1961–62a, 97–106). The quest for such principles, whether general (“Produce the greatest happiness for the greatest number,” “Treat people always as ends in themselves”) or more specific (“Thou shall not lie”), was futile in Stevenson's view; but worse, it was injurious, because it ignored the complexity of moral issues and, thus, issued forth inflexible norms unsuitable for resolving the complex moral problems of modern life (1944, 336; 1961–62a, 116). What normative ethics needed most, according to Stevenson, was clarity about the nature of moral problems. For if the nature of moral problems were more transparent, so too might be more effective means of resolving them—that is, more effective “methodology.” In particular, the role, if any, of scientific methods in resolving moral problems would be more transparent.

The nature of moral problems, according to Stevenson, lies in the subjective experiences of those engaged in interpersonal moral disagreement and intrapersonal moral uncertainty. He viewed this area of moral psychology—the subjective experience of moral disagreement and uncertainty—as the most underappreciated area of ethics and the key to making progress on the important, normative questions of ethics:

[Dealing adequately with the nature of ethical problems] requires us to abstract from the detailed subject matter of the problems and pay selective attention to the aspects of them that are most likely to prod us into problem solving. It requires us to see these aspects not from a moral point of view (which would attend any attempt to settle the problems) but rather from the point of view of an informal, common sense psychology. In effect, then, it asks for a generic description, given in psychological terms, of those ethical doubts and uncertainties, or discords and disagreements, that we often resolve by inquiry, deliberation, and discussion, but which on some occasions can lead us into an impasse, and on other occasions can induce us temporarily to suspend judgment, acknowledging that we are not yet in a position to come to a trustworthy conclusion. (1963b, 186–187)

That Stevenson intentionally develops his entire ethical theory around an “informal, common-sense psychology” is a point missed by many commentators, who misconceive Stevenson's ethical theory merely as a “development” of Ayer's comparatively thin emotive theory. Warnock, for example, apparently conceiving of Stevenson's Ethics and Language simply as a development of a theory of moral language, writes that “it is as if Stevenson had become over self-conscious about methodology and there is a good deal of reflexive commenting upon his own procedures, which add little or nothing to the actual ethical theory” (Warnock 1978, p. 66). But as we'll see below, Stevenson focuses on methodology and procedure precisely because he aims to describe in some detail how language is and can be used to resolve interpersonal moral disagreement and intrapersonal moral uncertainty.

Thus, although normative questions constitute for Stevenson the most important branch of ethics, “pervading all of common-sense life, and occupying most of the professional attention of legislators, editorialists, didactic novelists, clergymen, and moral philosophers,” his work focused on questions of moral psychology, judgment, disagreement, uncertainty, language, and deliberation, thereby contributing to the early development of that branch of ethics now known as metaethics, and thus, on the “limited task of sharpening the tools others employ” (1944, 1).

For Stevenson, then, the study of ethics is the study of moral problems. Normative ethics concerns the resolution of actual moral problems, while “analytical” or “meta” ethics concerns the nature or general features of those problems. Stevenson plausibly assumes that if we ultimately want better resolutions to ethical problems, we should begin in metaethics by gaining clarity about the general features of those problems. For as we gain clarity about their general features, we gain clarity about the function of moral language—about how moral problems arise and are dealt with in our lives as social, communicative beings—clarity about the methods that are and can be used to effectively resolve those problems, and clarity about whether those methods are distinct from the methods of science.

2.2 Disagreement in Belief and Disagreement in Attitude

Moral problems can be interpersonal or personal. Problems are interpersonal when there is disagreement between or among two or more people and personal when an individual is uncertain. But what is the nature of this disagreement or uncertainty? This is the question around which Stevenson organizes all of his work in ethical theory and with which he begins both Ethics and Language (1944) and Facts and Values (1963a).

Interpersonal disagreement is of two broad kinds: disagreement in belief and disagreement in attitude. Disagreement in belief occurs when two or more people have beliefs that cannot all be true and “neither is content to let the belief of the other remain unchallenged” (1948b, 1), that is, when at least one party desires, needs, or attempts to coordinate, or make consistent, those beliefs. If Smith believes that his and Jones's anniversary is in June, while Jones believes their anniversary is in July, their respective beliefs are incompatible, since they cannot both be true; but Smith and Jones disagree in Stevenson's sense only when—because there would likely be a practical coordination problem only when—either or both desire, need, or attempt to coordinate their beliefs, perhaps because they would like to celebrate their anniversary as close to their wedding date as possible. Their disagreement would be resolved when Smith or Jones (or both) modify their beliefs in ways that make them compatible (e.g., they both come to believe that their anniversary is in June), or when both cease to care about coordinating their incompatible beliefs, perhaps because they no longer care when they celebrate their anniversary. Personal uncertainty in belief occurs when an individual is uncertain about what to believe about some event or object yet desires or needs to settle on such a belief. For example, Smith may not have any strong belief about whether Jones or Rodriguez will be his next boss; but he would be personally uncertain, in Stevenson's sense, about which will be his next boss only when he desires to settle between these beliefs, perhaps because he has decided to look for a new job were Jones to become his new boss. By implication, interpersonal agreement in belief occurs when two or more people have beliefs that can all be true or, if they cannot all be true, have no desire, etc. for them to be so (1944, 4–5; 1950, 55–60). Personal “certainty” in belief occurs when an individual has settled on, or ceases to care about, what to believe (see especially 1963b, 191–194; 1950, 55–60).

Analogously, interpersonal disagreement in attitude occurs when two or more people have attitudes or interests—i.e., desires, feelings, attitudes, plans, intentions, or other affective psychological states whose general nature is that of being for or being against something (1948b, 2)—that cannot all be jointly satisfied (had, felt, etc.) and there is a desire, need, or attempt to coordinate those interests. If Smith and Jones desire to dine together, but Smith desires to dine at a restaurant where there is music, while Jones desires to dine at a quiet restaurant, they disagree, in a quite ordinary sense of the term, about where to dine (1944, 3). This kind of disagreement, as Stevenson notes, “springs more from divergent preferences than from divergent beliefs, and will end when they both wish to go the same place. It will be a mild, temporary disagreement for this simple case—a disagreement in miniature; yet it will be a ‘disagreement’ in a wholly familiar sense” (1944, 3). Indeed, for Stevenson, interpersonal disagreements in attitude are not only unextraordinary, they are ubiquitous:

Further examples are easily found. Mrs. A has social aspirations, and wants to move with the elite. Mr. A is easy-going, and loyal to his old friends. They accordingly disagree about what guests they will invite to their party. The curator of the museum wants to buy pictures by contemporary artists; some of his advisors prefer the purchase of old masters. They disagree. John's mother is concerned about the dangers of playing football, and doesn't want him to play. John, even though he agrees (in belief) about the dangers, wants to play anyhow. Again, they disagree. (1944, 3)

Personal uncertainty in attitude occurs when an individual is uncertain about how to feel or what to do about some object or event, but desires to feel or do something appropriate with respect to that object or event. For example, Smith may currently be neither for nor against some particular legislation proposal, but desires to determine whether he is for or against the proposal so he can vote responsibly. By implication, interpersonal agreement in attitude occurs when two or more people have attitudes that can all be jointly satisfied or when there is no desire, etc. for them to be all satisfied (1944, 4–5; 1950, 55–60), and personal “certainty” in attitude occurs when an individual has settled on, or has no desire to settle on, how to feel or what to do about a particular object or event (1963b, 191–194; 1950, 55–60). Interpersonal disagreement and personal uncertainty in belief and attitude thus differ essentially in that “the former is concerned with how matters are truthfully to be described and explained; the latter is concerned with how they are to be favored or disfavored, and hence with how they are to be shaped by human efforts” (1944, 4).

Since there can be agreement and disagreement with respect to beliefs and attitudes, there are four possible combinations of agreement and disagreement (1944, 6–7). Two people can agree in attitude but disagree in belief. For example, two researchers may value and aim to produce a cure for a particular disease, but disagree about whether a proposed treatment would produce its cure. In this case, the two researchers may come to disagree about whether to implement the proposed treatment. Their disagreement would be grounded in disagreement in belief, and ensuing discussion would likely focus on coordinating their respective beliefs. Alternatively, two people may agree in belief but disagree in attitude. Our two researchers, for example, may agree that proposed treatments T1 and T2 may produce a cure for diseases D1 and D2 respectively, but disagree about whether available but limited funding ought to be used to cure D1 or D2 and, hence, ought to be used to develop T1 or T2. In this case, the two researchers may disagree about whether to develop T1 or T2. Their disagreement would be grounded in disagreement in attitude, and ensuing discussion would likely focus on coordinating their respective attitudes. And two people may disagree both in belief and attitude, in which case disagreement would be grounded in both, and two people may agree in both belief and attitude, in which case there may be no disagreement.

Stevenson does not assume that interpersonal disagreement always signals that one is intending to get another to changes her beliefs or attitudes, to win the argument as it were. It may, and often is, the case that one is open to having his or her own beliefs or attitudes changed in the course of open-minded discussion or deliberation. Thus neither disagreement in belief nor disagreement in attitude need be an “occasion for forensic rivalry; it may be an occasion for an interchange of aims, with a reciprocal influence that both parties find to be beneficial” (1944, 4–5).

Given that beliefs and attitudes play a crucial organizing role in Stevenson's full-blown emotivism, one is entitled to inquire about the nature of these psychological states—what these respective attitudes are. Stevenson provides a rather thin account of the nature of various psychological states and, consequently, provides little detail about the nature of belief and attitude. Part of the reason for the lack of detail is their complexity. Stevenson rejects the “antiquated school of thought” according to which beliefs are “so many mental photographs, the product of a cognitive faculty, whereas attitudes stand apart as the drives or forces of a totally different faculty,” and, hence, adopts the view that beliefs and attitudes are more alike than folk psychology suggests (1944, 7). Rather, he accepts a dispositional theory of psychological states, including of beliefs and attitudes, according to which these states are distinguishable by their respective complex causal relations (1944, 7–8; 1950). More will be said about Stevenson's view of dispositions in Section 3.2. Although Stevenson fails to provide a detailed account of the nature of belief and attitude, he does think that these are easily distinguishable in our daily experience and, thus, that there is a distinction “certainly beyond any practical objection” (1944, 7). It is also beyond any practical objection that beliefs and attitudes causally affect each other. Consider an onlooker who witnesses a chess expert open weakly against a novice and wonders:

Does he make the move because he believes that it is a strong one, or because out of charity to his opponent, he doesn't want to make a strong one? The distinction here between a belief and a want (attitude) is certainly beyond any practical objection. One can imagine the expert, with constant beliefs about the opening, using it or not in accordance with his changing desires to win; or one can imagine him, with constant desires to win, using it or not in accordance with his changing beliefs. If in imagining this independent variation of the ‘causal factors’ involved one is tempted to hypostatize either ‘belief’ or ‘attitude,’ the fault must be corrected not by dispensing with the terms in favor of purely generic talk about action, but rather by coming to understand the full complexity of reference that lies behind the convenient simplicity of language. (1944, 7–8)

Thus, for Stevenson, beliefs and attitudes are different, yet causally related. Attitudes may causally affect beliefs, as when people wishfully believe that they will win the upcoming lottery or when parties conjure beliefs about a pub's closing hours while desiring one more beer at late night. Likewise, beliefs may causally affect attitudes, as when employees begin to disapprove of their company CEO because of their newly acquired beliefs concerning her exorbitant compensation package. Often beliefs and attitudes affect each other (1944, 5; 1950).

2.3 Moral Disagreement and Moral Judgment

Are moral problems essentially disagreements or uncertainties in belief, attitude, or both? And are moral judgments constituted by beliefs, attitudes, or both? Stevenson asserts that moral problems almost always involve both types of disagreement or uncertainty (1944, 11; 1948b, 4). For example, consider an ethical disagreement between a union representative and a company representative over an increase in employee wages:

Such an argument clearly represents a disagreement in attitude. The union is for higher wages; the company is against them, and neither is content to let the other's attitude remain unchanged. In addition to this disagreement in attitude, of course, the argument may represent no little disagreement in belief. Perhaps the parties disagree about how much the cost of living has risen and how much the workers are suffering under the present wage scale. Or perhaps they disagree about the company's earnings and the extent to which the company could raise wages and still operate at a profit. Like any typical ethical argument, then, this argument involves both disagreement in attitude and disagreement in belief. (1948b, 4)

However, although moral problems almost always involve both types of disagreement or uncertainty, their distinguishing feature is disagreement or uncertainty in attitude. In fact, moral disagreement or uncertainty may sometimes involve only that in attitude. Stevenson wields four arguments for this conclusion, three of which may be called the “Internalist,” “Desirability,” and “Generational Arguments.” The Internalist Argument is an intuitive appeal to what is now often called “motivational judgment internalism,” roughly, the view that there is a necessary connection between one's moral judgments and motivational states. Our actual moral judgments and disagreements, Stevenson intuits, involve “something more than a disinterested description, or a cold debate about whether [something] is already approved, or when it spontaneously will be” (1944, 13; see also 1948b, 3–4). Reflection on possible moral judgments and disagreements also leads Stevenson to the same intuitive conclusion. Consider a person who is fully persuaded that what he did was wrong and, for that very reason, is more in favor of doing it again:

Temporarily puzzled to understand him, we shall be likely to conclude, ‘This is his paradoxical way of abusing what he considers our outworn moral conventions. He means to say that it is really all right to do it, and that one ought to do it flagrantly in order to discredit the many people who consider it wrong’. But whatever we may make of his meaning (and there are several other interpretations possible) we shall scarcely take seriously his protestations of agreement. Were we not trying all along to make him disapprove of his action? Would not his ethical agreement with us require that he share our disfavor—that he agree with us in attitude? (1944, 16–17)

The Desirability Argument appeals to an oft-leveled objection to J. S. Mill's claim that the only proof that can be given that something is desirable is that people actually desire it (Utilitarianism, Ch. 4, para. 3). The objection is that Mill equivocates on ‘desirable’, which could mean either ‘capable of being desired’, or ‘worthy of being desired’ (see, for example, Moore, 1903, Section 40). If the former, then Mill's claim is a truism and, hence, would rarely occasion any kind of disagreement. If the latter, however, then Mill's claim is a controversial moral claim. Would such a controversy be essentially disagreement in belief or in attitude? Stevenson concludes that it would be disagreement in attitude, again appealing to intuition:

The statement so far from being axiomatic becomes highly controversial. And it becomes so for a reason that is easily understood. ‘That which is desired is desirable’ is a statement of the easy-going man who wishes to encourage people to leave their present desires unchanged; and conversely, the statement, ‘That which is desired is not desirable’ is characteristic of the stern reformer, who seeks to alter or inhibit existing desires. Statements about what is desirable, unlike those about what is desired, serve not to describe attitudes, merely, but to intensify or alter them. (1944, 17–18)

The Generational Argument is an argument from the best explanation about the cause of the disparity of ethical views that often occur between people of widely different generations, ethnic or racial communities, and geographic locations. According Stevenson, the disparity is adequately explained if ethical disagreement were essentially disagreement in attitude, “for different temperaments, social needs, and group pressures would more directly and urgently lead these people to have opposed attitudes than it would lead them to have opposed factual beliefs” (1944, 18).

Many today would find these three arguments controversial at best, especially taken individually. The Internalist Argument is controversial for at least two reasons. First, the upshot of the thesis of motivational judgment internalism is that it would be impossible to make moral judgments without being appropriately motivated; for example, it would be impossible to genuinely think that insulting others is wrong without being motivated at least to some extent to avoid or prevent insults to others. However, some claim that this implication is too strong, appealing either to their own intuitions that genuine-but-nonmotivating moral judgments are possible or to accepted standards of burden of proof arguments, which are thought to place the burden on internalists to argue for the impossibility of such judgments (Brink 1989; Railton 1986; Shafer-Landau 2003; Svavarsdottir 1999, 2006). More recent objections to motivational judgment internalism appeal to empirical evidence from the neuro and cognitive sciences. Although appeal to such evidence is itself controversial (e.g., Kauppinen 2008, Prinz 2006), some suggest that persons with certain damaged or underdeveloped brain functions, perhaps including psychopaths and sociopaths, actually make such genuine judgments (e.g., Roskies 2003, 2005). A second controversy over Stevenson's Internalist Argument is its assumption that beliefs are motivationally inert, that is, that beliefs are insufficient by themselves to generate motivating states and, therefore, that moral judgments must be constituted at least in part by affective attitudes (which are taken to be inherently moving). While some object to the assumption itself, arguing that some beliefs are in fact inherently motivating, or at least sufficient to generate motivating states (e.g., Dancy 1993, Scanlon 1998, Shafer-Landau 2003), others object to Stevenson's inference from that assumption to the further conclusion that moral judgments must be constituted at least in part by affective attitudes (e.g., Railton 1986, Smith 1994). For in-depth but accessible overviews of the issues surrounding moral judgment and motivation, see the entries on moral motivation and moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.

Stevenson's Desirability and Generational Arguments are also controversial at best. The Desirability argument appears to collapse into the Internalist Argument, for it is at bottom an appeal to the internalist intuition that disagreement over whether something is worthy of being desired is, essentially, disagreement in attitude. Finally, Stevenson himself recognizes the relative weakness of the Generational Argument, admitting that the disparity in ethical views between individuals of different generations, etc. may just as well be explained, for example, by disagreement in belief about the qualities or consequences of certain actions, people, policies, etc. (1944, 18).

Before turning to Stevenson's fourth argument, it is important to note that these two theses—that moral judgments are essentially constituted at least in part by attitudes and that moral disagreement is essentially disagreement in attitude—are two of the features that made Stevenson's theory novel for its time and that continue to be of lasting importance. For although a number of other “interest” theories had taken seriously the central role that attitudes play in moral judgment and disagreement, these theories, according to Stevenson, had erred in holding that moral judgments are essentially beliefs about attitudes and, consequently, that moral disagreement is essentially disagreement in belief (about attitudes):

A long tradition of ethical theorists strongly suggest, whether they always intend to or not, that the disagreement is one in belief. Naturalistic theorists, for instance, identify an ethical judgment with some sort of scientific statement, and so make normative ethics a branch of science. Now a scientific argument typically exemplifies disagreement in belief, and if an ethical argument is simply a scientific one, then it too exemplifies disagreement in belief. The usual naturalistic theories of ethics that stress attitudes—such as those of Hume, Westermarck, Perry, Richards, and so many others—stress disagreement in belief no less than the rest. They imply, of course, that disagreement about what is good is simply one sort of disagreement in belief about attitudes; but we have seen that that is simply one sort of disagreement in belief, and by no means the same as disagreement in attitude. Analyses that stress disagreement in attitude are extremely rare. (1948b, 3; see also 1944, 9–10)

These theses also continue to motivate current day expressivists, such Blackburn (1984, 1993) and Gibbard (1990, 2003).

2.4 Ethics and Science

Stevenson's fourth argument for the view that moral disagreement essentially involves disagreement in attitude relies on the “conspicuous role” that disagreement in attitude plays in unifying moral disagreements; hence, this argument may be called the “Unification Argument.” According to Stevenson, disagreement in attitude imposes a “characteristic type or organization” on the beliefs that could serve to resolve moral disagreement, and, therefore, is that which most distinguishes ethical issues from scientific issues (1944, 13; see also 1948b, 4). Disagreement in attitude unifies moral disagreement in at least two ways. First, disagreement in attitude determines which beliefs are relevant to ethical deliberation, for “any belief that is introduced into the argument must be one that is likely to lead one side or the other to have a different attitude …. But beliefs that are likely to alter the attitudes of neither side … will have no bearing on the disagreement in attitude, with which both parties are primarily concerned” (1948b, 4–5; see also 1944, 14). Second, disagreement in attitude determines when an ethical problem is resolved:

If the men come to agree in belief about all the factual matters they have considered, and if they continue to have divergent aims in spite of this … they will still have an ethical issue that is unresolved. But if they come to agree [in attitude], they will have brought their ethical issue to an end; and this will be so even though various beliefs … still remain debatable. Both men may conclude that these remaining beliefs, no matter how they are later settled, will have no decisive effect on their attitudes. (1944, 14–15; see also 1948b, 6)

This triumvirate—that beliefs and attitudes are different yet causally related, that moral disagreement essentially involves disagreement in attitude, and that moral disagreement also typically involves disagreement in belief—provides much of the leverage for the remainder of Stevenson's full-blown ethical theory involving moral language and methodology and provides the grounds for insisting that ethical inquiry cannot be a science. For this package of views together inform his conclusions about the nature of and differences between ethical and scientific problems, functions, language, and methods. Ethical problems, according to Stevenson, are constituted at least in part by disagreement in attitude, while scientific problems are constituted only by disagreement in belief; hence, the function of ethical inquiry is at least in part to coordinate or settle attitudes, while the function of scientific inquiry is to coordinate or settle only beliefs. Ethical language, then, must have features, namely, emotive meaning (Section 3.3), that make it apt for coordinating attitudes, while scientific language need only have features, namely, descriptive meaning (Section 3.3) that make it apt for coordinating beliefs. Finally, the linguistic methods for resolving ethical disputes must be grounded at least in part by the relations among beliefs and attitudes, while those for resolving scientific disputes need be guided only by the relations among beliefs. For these reasons, ethics is not—and cannot be—a science:

(S)cientific methods cannot guarantee the definite role in the so-called normative sciences that they may have in the natural sciences. Apart from a heuristic assumption to the contrary, it is possible that the growth of scientific knowledge may leave many disputes about values permanently unsolved. … For the same reason I conclude that normative ethics is not a branch of any science. It deliberately deals with a type of disagreement that science deliberately avoids. … Insofar as normative ethics draws from the sciences, in order to change attitudes via changing people's beliefs, it draws from all the sciences; but a moralist's peculiar aim—that of redirecting attitudes—is a type of activity, rather than knowledge, and falls within no science. Science may study that activity and may help indirectly to forward it; but it is not identical with that activity. (1948b, 7–8)

3. Language and Psychology

For Stevenson, language is an instrument or tool for serving certain purposes; ethical language is thus suited especially for the central purposes of ethics. Since the central purposes of ethics are to resolve or coordinate attitudes, an analysis of ethical language must reveal how ethical language serves these dynamic purposes. It does so, according to Stevenson, by having emotive meaning in addition to descriptive meaning, where meaning is to be cashed out in “pragmatic” or dispositional terms as a network of causal relations that obtain between language and psychology.

3.1 Pragmatic Meaning

Stevenson intends to provide a theory of emotive and descriptive meaning in the “pragmatic” or “psychological” sense, where this sense of ‘meaning’ invokes the work of Charles Morris. In Foundations of the Theory of Signs (1938), Morris had suggested a tripartite division of the study of signs into (i) syntax, the study of the relations among signs; (ii) semantics, the study of the relations among signs and their designations or denotations; and (iii) pragmatics, the study of signs as they are used by members of a community in order to “meet more satisfactorily their individual and common needs” (10), that is, the study of signs as they are used to coordinate mental and social life. Taking this cue from Morris, Stevenson seeks to provide a theory of meaning in terms of the “psychological reactions” of those who use the signs (1944, 42), and, then, to distinguish emotive and descriptive meaning by the different types of psychological reaction associated with the use of emotive and descriptive language respectively.

According to Stevenson, explaining emotive and descriptive meaning in this psychological sense of ‘meaning’ would be promising if it did not encounter an immediate problem that “has long been one of the most troublesome aspects of linguistic theory” (1944, 42; 1937, 20). The problem, as Stevenson saw it, is that the meaning of an expression must be relatively stable across a variety of social and linguistic contexts, lest the expression be unhelpful to our understanding of the many contexts in which the expression is used; however, the psychological states associated with an expression vary widely across social and linguistic contexts. At a football game, for example, ‘Hooray!’ may be shouted in connection with terrific excitement, but at other times with little emotion at all; likewise, to a postmaster who regularly sorts the mail, “‘Connecticut’ may cause only a toss of the hand, but for an old resident it may bring a train of reminiscences” (1944, 43). Similarly, the sentence ‘This legislation is just’ may be used to express a favorable attitude towards a particular piece of legislation, but not when embedded within the more complex sentence ‘Vote for this legislation only if it is just’. Thus,

Some variation (of psychological states) must of course be allowed, else we shall end with a fictitious entity, serene and thoroughly useless amid the complexities of actual practice; but ‘meaning’ is a term wanted for marking off something relatively constant amid these complexities, not merely for paying them deference. A sense is needed where a sign may ‘mean’ less than it ‘suggests’—a sense in which meanings are helpful to the understanding of many contexts, not some vagrant sense in which a word has a wholly different ‘meaning’ every time it is used. (1944, 43)

Stevenson's task, then, is to provide a psychological theory of meaning according to which the psychological states associated with an expression's use, and hence an expression's meaning, remains relatively constant across contexts.

3.2 Dispositional Theory of Meaning

Stevenson's solution to this problem of flux is to provide a dispositional theory of meaning grounded in the causal-historical relations between a sign and the psychological states of those within a linguistic community who have used and reacted, and continue to use and react, to the sign. Thus, Stevenson's is not a “use,” “tool,” or “instrumental” theory of meaning, for a sign's meaning is not constituted by its use on an occasion of utterance. Rather, a sign's meaning is constituted by its power—its “tendency,” “potentiality,” “latent ability,” or “disposition” (1937, 20–22; 1944, 46; 1948a, 158)—to evoke the psychological states of a hearer or to be used to express those of a speaker. The “power” of an expression, like the purchasing “power” of a dollar, or the stimulating “power” of coffee, is to be understood not as some mysterious entity or force, but rather as a complex network of causal relations:

The word ‘disposition’ …, is useful in dealing with complicated causal situations, where some specified sort of event is a function of many variables. To illustrate … Although coffee often ‘causes’ stimulation, it is never the only cause. The degree of stimulation will depend as well on many other factors—the initial state of a man's fatigue, the absorptive state of his stomach, the constitution of his nervous system, and so on. (1944, 46)

Just as the stimulating power of coffee remains relatively unchanged despite varied reactions or responses to the ingestion of coffee, so too does the meaning of an expression remain relatively unchanged despite varied psychological states resulting from or leading to the articulation of an expression (1944, 46–47).

A closer look at Stevenson's notion of dispositions might be helpful. A disposition, on Stevenson's account, is a complex causal network consisting of (i) stimuli, (ii) responses, (iii) contextual or “attendant” circumstances of the stimuli, which are subject to occasional or even frequent change, and (iv) the “bases” of the disposition, which are the set of circumstances that are subject to much less frequent change. Considering again Stevenson's own example, the stimulating power of coffee is a disposition constituted by a complex causal network consisting of: stimuli, such as the variable amounts of coffee ingested; and responses, such as the resulting changes in energy, attention, anxiety, or irritation. These stimuli and responses are mediated by: attendant circumstances, such as a drinker's fatigue at the time of ingestion, the absorptive rate of her stomach, or the constitution of her nervous system; and the basis of the disposition, such as the chemical composition of the coffee or the soil conditions where it was grown. The responses, then, are a function of the stimuli, attendant circumstances, and basis, and one who specifies these and who specifies in detail their correlation “has said all about the disposition that there is to say” (1944, 51).

Analogously, the meaning of a sentence, such as ‘Hooray’, is constituted in part by a complex causal network of: stimuli, such as the spoken or written tokens of ‘Hooray!’; and responses, such as excitement, affection, or possibly even annoyance. These are mediated by: attendant circumstances, such the time, location, or sociological context (e.g., whether the person uttering ‘Hooray!’ is a fellow fan or rival) of the utterance; and the basis of the disposition. The basis of a sign's disposition is a notion that is especially underdeveloped in Stevenson's work. He does say that to count as meaningful, a sign's disposition must have been caused by, and would not have developed without, an “elaborate process of conditioning which has attended the sign's use in communication” (1944, 57), a requirement necessary to distinguish linguistic meaning from other general phenomena that might be said to have meaning in some very broad sense, such as a cough that might be said to “mean” that a person has a cold. Thus, for Stevenson, the linguistic meaning of a sign is tied to linguistic conventions that have developed in light of the history of a sign's use in a variety of situations. Perhaps this qualification suggests that the basis of a sign's disposition is its history of use in attendant circumstances within a linguistic community.

In any case, in addition to the “active” disposition of a sign to evoke particular psychological states of a hearer, the meaning of a sign is also constituted in part by a “passive” disposition to be used to express the psychological states of a speaker (1944, 57–58). The essential difference between these dispositions is that the kinds of stimuli and responses are “reversed.” In the case of a sign's active disposition, the stimuli are the token productions of the sign, while the responses are the psychological states of a hearer; however, in the case of a sign's passive disposition, the stimuli are psychological states of a person, the responses the token productions of the sign. Thus, for Stevenson, the meaning of a term is the “conjunction” or union of two dispositions, one “active” disposition to evoke psychological states of a hearer, another “passive” disposition to be used to express the psychological states of a speaker, where a disposition is a complex causal network of stimuli, responses, attendant circumstances, and basis. Stevenson warns that his account of meaning, understood in causal-dispositional terms, should not be taken as anything close to a complete theory of meaning, but only the detailed outlines of one that must be extraordinarily complex (EL, 58).

3.3 Emotive and Descriptive Meaning

For Stevenson, the meaning of a sign is a complex dispositional property. Consequently, since the sentences of a language have distinguishable kinds of dispositions, they have distinguishable kinds of meaning.

The emotive meaning of a sign is a disposition that relates the sign to a range of attitudes (1944, 59–60). From a hearer or reader's point of view, feelings or attitudes are the responses, tokens of the sign are the stimuli; from a speaker or writer's point of view, attitudes are the stimuli, tokens of the sign are the responses. An attitude is itself a disposition whose stimuli and responses relate to “hindering or assisting” the object of the attitude, that which one is for or against (1944, 60). As a disposition, the emotive meaning of a sign remains relatively stable, though responses may vary across contexts given different attendant, or contextual, circumstances (1944, 60). Thus, a speaker's utterance of “Hooray!” may be occasioned by excitement or, on rare occasion, even indifference; but the disposition of the sign to be used to express or to evoke these varying attitudes remains relatively stable, its stability a result of an “elaborate process of conditioning” that gives rise to linguistic conventions (1944, 60–62). Emotive meaning, for Stevenson, is not a degenerate kind of meaning, as is sometimes thought to be the conclusion of some Logical Positivists, such as Ayer (1936). Rather, Stevenson is among the group of philosophers, linguists, critical and value theorists, such as Richards (1924, 1926, and with Ogden 1922) and Perry (1926), who seek to re-establish, in an era of scientific enthusiasm, the importance of emotive language and meaning for coordinating mental and social life:

It may be well to guard against the tendency, too common among popular writers, to separate meanings into the sheep and the goats—a procedure which militates against detachment, and hides the need for a more detailed classification (of meaningful language)…. In particular, the term ‘emotive’ is sometimes used in an extremely rough way, until it labels a wastebasket for the many aspects of linguistic usage that are detrimental or irrelevant to the purposes of science. … (This) usage is not at all fortunate when it leads one to suppose, as it too readily does, that any expression classifiable as emotive is thereby perfectly put in its place, requiring no further attention. (1944, 76–77)

The descriptive meaning of a sign is a disposition that relates the sign to a range of “cognitive” states, including belief, supposition, presumption, etc. From a hearer or reader's point of view, cognitive states are the responses, tokens of the sign are the stimuli. From a speaker or writer's point of view, cognitive states are the stimuli, tokens of the sign are the responses. Cognitive states, like attitudes, are complex dispositions.

Indeed, according to Stevenson, cognitive states and attitudes are dispositions so complex that he can give no precise account of them. He does, however, try to clarify by analogy the complexity with which cognition and attitudes are linked to action. Consider a small ball of iron surrounded by magnets, each with its own disposition to affect the ball:

The current is switched on, and the ball moves in a certain way. Now each of the magnets has a disposition to affect the motion of the ball, but the actual motion of it cannot be related to one of these dispositions alone; it must be related to all. Change any of the magnets, and, all else remaining constant, the motion of the ball will change as well. In spite of many differences, this case parallels the one in question. Several dispositional properties are present together, each making a difference to the way any other is realized. … There is clearly nothing mysterious about such a situation. The term ‘disposition’ is used, as always, to refer to a complicated milieu in which a given sort of event has many causes. Here the situation is complicated enough to require the mention of several dispositions. … It is after this fashion, perhaps, that cognition must be conceived—as a disposition whose response is modified by that of many other dispositions. (1944, 65–66)

The emotive and descriptive meanings of signs are related in a variety of ways. Signs may have both emotive and descriptive meaning, and often do. Perhaps a noncontroversial example is the sentence ‘That was courageous’, whose descriptive meaning relates tokens of the sentence to cognitive states that, in some way, represent the action referred to as one performed in spite of an actor's fear, and whose emotive meaning relates tokens of the sentence to favorable states, such as admiration towards the action or actor. According to Stevenson, almost all words in a natural language have both emotive and descriptive meaning owing to their historical uses in emotional contexts (1944, 71). The interplay of emotive and descriptive meaning also affects the development and evolution of sign's meaning, a result of the relative independence of the two kinds of meaning. Stevenson suggests, for example, that the word ‘democracy’ may have come to possess its laudatory emotive meaning in America because the word refers, via its descriptive meaning, to properties of government that Americans favored. But now:

Suppose, for example, that a group of people should come to disapprove of certain aspects of democracy, but continue to approve of other aspects of it. They might leave the descriptive meaning of ‘democracy’ unchanged, and gradually let it acquire, for their usage, a much less laudatory emotive meaning. On the other hand, they might keep the strong laudatory meaning unchanged, and let ‘democracy’ acquire a descriptive sense which made reference only to those aspects of democracy (in the older sense) which they favored. It is often essential, if failures in communication are to be avoided, to determine which of these changes is taking place; and the distinction between emotive and descriptive meaning is of great use in studying the matter. (1944, 72)

Emotive and descriptive meaning can thus be independent to varying degrees. Consequently, one kind of meaning can survive change or even disappearance of the other. The independence of the emotive meaning of a sign can be roughly tested by comparing the meaning of a sign with that of a sign that is a descriptive, but not an emotive, synonym. (Stevenson holds that signs rarely, if ever, have emotive synonyms given their respective “emotional histories” (1944, 82).) Thus, to whatever extent the laudatory strength of ‘democracy’ exceeds that of ‘government where rule is by popular vote’, the emotive meaning of the former will be independent of the latter (1944, 73).

4. Ethics, Language, and Methods

Ethical language should be suitable for the purposes of ethics. Since, for Stevenson, the purposes of ethics are to settle, coordinate, or otherwise resolve disagreements in attitude, an analysis of ethical language must display how ethical language is apt for performing these functions. It is apt, according to Stevenson, because ethical language (i) almost always has both emotive and descriptive meaning, where (ii) emotive meaning is essential and (iii) often strongly independent of descriptive meaning (in the sense in which “thin” ethical terms, such as ‘good’, might be said to have emotive meaning that is strongly independent of any descriptive meaning it might have). That ethical language has essential emotive meaning—that is, has dispositions in which attitudes play a most prominent role—implies as it should that attitudes and feelings are at issue in cases of moral disagreement or uncertainty. That ethical language usually has both emotive and descriptive meanings which often interact in various ways suggests as it should that beliefs, and therefore rational methods, can be relevant to resolving moral disagreement or uncertainty. That emotive meaning is often strongly independent of descriptive meaning suggests as it should that nonrational “persuasive” methods can also play a role in settling or resolving moral disagreement or uncertainty.

4.1 Patterns of Analysis

Stevenson aims to clarify ethical language by using “tools” of analysis. One tool that Stevenson will not use to clarify ethical language is the tool of definition, at least in the sense of ‘definition’ that implies “finding synonym for synonym,” since he thinks that ethical terms, due to their emotive meanings, are indefinable in this sense (1944, 82). Rather, Stevenson's analytic tool of choice is a set of models. The models highlight the respective dispositional elements (i.e. elements of meaning) of ethical language that, via its use, are to varying degrees in linguistic play (1944, 82–83).

Two such models, labled ‘(P1)’ and ‘(P4)’ below, receive a great deal of Stevenson's attention, because they paradigmatically exemplify for the sentence ‘This is good’ what Stevenson calls respectively his “First Pattern” and “Second Pattern” of analysis. These patterns and, hence, (P1) and (P4) differ most importantly in descriptive richness and emotive force. (P1)'s descriptive content is scant, conveying only information about the speaker's attitude and, therefore, conveying only somewhat more information than is conveyed by (P1)'s relatively strong emotive element; therefore, (P1) well-models those uses of an ethical sentence at which front and center is a speaker's attitude. (P4)'s descriptive content conveys more complex, precise information about the qualities of which the speaker approves and merely characterizes ‘This is good’ as conveying emotive force; therefore, (P4) well-models those uses of an ethical sentence at which front and center are a speaker's moral standards.

As models, (P1) and (P4) have different strengths and weaknesses, and while discussing them Stevenson suggests or implies several other models: (P2a)-(P3c). Like (P1), (P2a)-(P2c) exemplify Stevenson's First Pattern of Analysis, and, like (P4), (P3a)-(P3c) exemplify Stevenson's Second Pattern of Analysis. Notice that each subset of models, and each model within each subset, is listed roughly in order of increasing descriptive richness and decreasing emotive force.

Discussion begins with (P1), returning later to (P0a)–(P0d).

‘This is good’ means:

(P0a) Approve of this!
(P0b) Let's all approve of this!
(P0c) Hooray for this!
(P0d) Hooray for this for being X, Y, and Z!
(P1) I approve of this; do so as well.
(P2a) I approve of this; let's all do so!
(P2b) I approve of this; hooray for this!
(P2c) I approve of this; how I wish we would all do so!
(P3a) This is X; hooray for this!
(P3b) This is X; hooray for things that are X!
(P3c) This is X, Y, and Z; hooray for things that are X, Y, and Z!
(P4)This is X, Y, and Z [“except that ‘good’ has as well a laudatory emotive meaning which permits it to express the speaker's approval and tends to evoke the approval of the hearer”]

Model (P1) contains two sentences each of a different mood: ‘I approve of this’, a non-normative declarative sentence, and ‘Do so as well’, a second-person imperative. As a non-normative declarative sentence, ‘I approve of X’ is passively disposed, Stevenson thinks, to be used by a speaker or writer who believes the world is as described—in this case, by a speaker or writer who believes that she approves of that which is demonstrated by ‘this’—and is actively disposed to evoke a similar belief or cognitive state in an audience upon its being heard or read. Similarly, as a second-person imperative sentence, ‘Do so as well’ is passively disposed, Stevenson thinks, to be used by a speaker or writer who desires her audience either to share her favorable attitude or to engage in the particular kind of behavior demonstrated, and is actively disposed to effect that particular attitude or behavior of a hearer or reader. Thus, (P1) is intended to clarify the sense in which ethical language dispositionally relates ethical terms to both attitudes and beliefs, and thus, the sense in which ethical language has both emotive and descriptive meaning. As a model, (P1) also helps to clarify several other important features of ethical language. For example: the descriptive sentence in (P1) has quite narrow descriptive content, namely, that the speaker approves of the particular object or act to which she is referring; the imperative sentence has especially direct emotive force, strongly commanding one's audience to have similar favorable attitudes; and both sentences are, of course, about attitudes. Thus, (P1) is intended to bring to light that ethical terms sometimes bring, or are brought, into play by narrow descriptive content, as with many uses of “thin” ethical terms like ‘good’, right’, etc.—though also sometimes even by “thick” ethical terms like ‘courage’ or ‘justice’; as Stevenson writes, “We all know that a politician who promises ‘justice’ commits himself to very little, unless he defines the term before the election” (1944, 35)—and sometimes have very direct emotive force, as when a parent strongly intones to her child that she (the child) is to share the parent's favorable attitude towards sharing with others. Also, by forcing attitudes to center-stage, (P1) captures the essential nature and organizational focus of moral problems as described in Section 2.3. Finally, because the descriptive content of the declarative is relativized to a speaker, (P1) brings to the fore the speaker-relativity of the descriptive meaning of ethical terms, a point to which Stevenson returns on several occasions (e.g., 1944, 227–232).

Despite its usefulness, Stevenson's (P1) is not be taken as some sort of “official” model of ethical sentences. It might be tempting to do so, given that Stevenson devotes a great deal of space in Ethics and Language discussing the various features and implications of (P1). Despite the temptation, Stevenson himself later came to regret putting (P1) front and center, and this for two reasons. First, (P1) has the implausible methodological implication that to fully justify a moral claim, such as ‘This is good’, one must provide reasons for believing that one approves of the object that (P1) describes one as having (1963b, 210–212). Second and more importantly, taking (P1) as a sort of “official” model masks Stevenson's own sensitivity to the myriad of ways in which (P1) is misleading or otherwise defective. Five of (P1)'s misleading features are as follows:

Problem 1:
The imperative is “too blunt and instrument” (1944, 32), evoking attitudes in a overly aggressive, crude way. Moral claims, according to Stevenson, lead rather than command people to alter their attitudes and, so, the force of the judgment ‘This is good’ “has been poorly approximated” by (P1) (1944, 32–33).
Problem 2:
The imperative suggests that the purpose of moral deliberation and discussion is to convert others. Since the use of a second-person imperative implies a position of authority over one's audience, this model gives the impression that the speaker or writer “wishes only to propagate his preconceived aims, without reconsidering them” (1944, 32). However, most moral claims are often occasioned not by a desire for “conquest,” but rather by a desire for mutual understanding (1944, 32).
Problem 3:
The declarative suggests that the descriptive element is often quite narrow and perhaps quite precise, when it point of fact it is often quite broad or complex and quite vague (1944, 33–34 and 206–213).
Problem 4:
The declarative fails to model the possibility of disagreement in belief, which intuitively is a part of many moral disagreements. Suppose, for example, that Smith declares that complimenting others is good, while Jones declares that complimenting others is bad, and that their disagreement is grounded in the conflict between Smith's belief that complimenting others generally leads to a healthy degree of self-esteem and Jones's belief that complimenting others too often leads to excessive pride. According to (P1), the descriptive element of Smith's utterance is rendered ‘I approve of complimenting others’, while Jones's utterance is rendered ‘I disapprove of complimenting others’ (1944, 22). But here, Smith and Jones disagree in belief not at all.
Problem 5:
The declarative implies, implausibly, that the full justification of a moral claim always requires the provision of reasons for believing that a speaker approves or disapproves of that to which she refers (1963b, 210–212).

Models (P2a)–(P2c) rectify Problems 1 and 2 to some degree in several ways. First, each lessens the blunt force and authoritativeness of the second-person imperative by using a more interpersonally agreeable first-person plural imperative, exclamative, and optative respectively. (P2a), because it retains an imperative, models better than (P2b) and (P2c) the dispositions of moral sentences to evoke an audience's attitudes or behaviors. The latter two, containing instead an exclamative and optative respectively, models better than (P2a) the dispositions of moral sentences to express a speaker's attitudes, though at the expense of evoking the audience's attitudes less directly than (P2a). (P2b), given its exclamative, which typically conveys an attitude more forcefully than an optative (with the possible exception of regret), models even better than (P2c) the disposition of moral sentences to express a speaker's attitudes and, thereby, better models the dispositions of moral sentences to evoke an audience's attitudes via the “contagion of warmly expressed approval” (1944, 22). In the models to follow, an exclamative rather than an imperative or optative is used to model the emotive features of ethical language.

Models (P3a)–(P3c) rectify Problems 3-5 to some degree, while suggesting additional complexity in the emotive element. Each suggests that the descriptive element in ethical sentences is more complex and perhaps more vague, suggesting as they do a more general description of an action, person, policy, etc. as exemplifying certain characteristics or properties, rather than the narrower and more precise description of a speaker as exemplifying a specific attitude. Thus, each allows that moral disagreement may be grounded in disagreement in belief—e.g., Smith and Jones can use ‘complimenting others is good’ and ‘complimenting others is not good’ respectively as a means of disagreeing in belief about whether complimenting others exemplifies property X (or Y or Z)—and, thereby, eliminates the implication that fully justifying a moral claim requires providing reasons for believing that a speaker has the particular attitude she is described as having. In addition, the exclamative in (P3a) suggests that the disposition of ethical sentences relates ethical terms in part to attitudes directed towards the object or action at issue. The exclamatives in (P3b) and (P3c), on the other hand, suggest that the dispositions of ethical sentences relates ethical terms in part to attitudes directed towards the characteristics or properties that an object or action might exemplify.

Stevenson's (P4), has a descriptive element that is more precise than (P3a)–(P3b). It also removes even a model of the emotive element, leaving instead just a characterization to the effect that some emotive element is present. Thus, unlike (P0a)–(P1), which place the dispositional relations between ethical terms and attitudes—i.e., emotive meaning—front and center, (P4) instead places front and center the dispositional relations between ethical terms and beliefs—i.e., descriptive meaning. (P4) thus captures the passive dispositions of ethical terms to be used as a result of a speaker or writer's more specific cognitive states about the properties or characteristics of an action, person, etc, and the terms’ active dispositions to cause such cognitive states in an audience. Perhaps the more descriptive “thick” ethical terms, such as ‘cruel’, ‘kind’, or ‘courageous’ provide the best examples of terms that possess such dispositions, though these may be evident even when reflecting on “thin” ethical terms, such as ‘good’ or ‘right’. Consider, for example, an Aristotelian, Kantian, and Millian individually deliberating over whether a particular action or object is good, their respective deliberation and use of ‘This is good’ guided, as they would be, by their beliefs about whether the action or object under discussion exemplifies the promotion of a teleological end, a Good Will, or pleasure respectively.

Returning to (P0a)–(P0d), these rectify to some degree an additional problem, one that encumbers all of (P1)–(P4).

Problem 6:
It is often simply too difficult to determine whether the descriptive meaning of ethical language is strictly designated or merely suggested (1944, 85–87).

The distinction between ‘strictly designates’ and ‘suggests’ is most plausibly understood as invoking the distinction between semantics and pragmatics, or the distinction between that which is conveyed as a matter of convention or as a matter of conversational dynamics:

The distinction which the question presupposes, that between what ‘good’ means and what it suggests, is often beyond the precision of ordinary language. It is a distinction between descriptive dispositions of the term, one of which is preserved by linguistic rules and the other is not. In the rigorous discourse of science or mathematics, which avails itself of interrelated sets of definitions or formal postulates, the distinction is readily made. In the rough contexts of daily life, however, a great many rules are not stipulated, being imperfectly evident from people's linguistic habits; and even those rules which are occasionally stipulated are not constantly followed. Certain rules, of course, are always observed; for ‘good’, whatever else, is ‘not bad’ and ‘not indifferent’. But many other rules remain as mere possibilities. If such a rule is specifically called to a person's attention he may accept it—though usually only temporarily, for a given purpose. Not until a great many rules are permanently settled, though, do we get beyond the undecided region that separates descriptive meaning from suggestiveness. When rules are in the course of becoming generally accepted, there is a long period over which we may either accept or reject them without violence to conventional language. Our decision may settle the matter for our own usage, and determine what is afterward to be called the term's descriptive meaning, and what is to be called its suggestiveness; but our finished product is by no means the same as the raw material. (1944, 86; see also 1948a, 154–158; 1963b, 208–210)

Thus, Stevenson's distinction between ‘strictly designates’ and ‘suggests’ is plausibly captured by the later Gricean distinction between that which is “said” or “conventionally implicated” on the one hand, and that which is “conversationally implicated” on the other (Grice 1975); or perhaps by the later Searlean distinction between that which is conveyed via the performance of a “direct” assertive illocutionary act on the one hand, and via an “indirect” assertive illocutionary act on the other (Searle, 1975). Models (P0a)–(P0d), then, are useful for reminding us that the “strict” meaning of ethical terms may include only its emotive meaning; if so, however, its descriptive meaning is strongly suggested and, thus, always remains in linguistic play.

All of these specific models, (P0a)–(P4), thus fall into two logical patterns:

‘This is good’ means:

(G1)x is D; φ’
(G2) ‘φ’

where ‘x’ is to be instantiated by a term denoting an action, person, policy, etc; ‘is D’ is to be replaced by a set of descriptive predicates; and ‘φ’ is to be either instantiated by an appropriate exclamative, optative, or imperative sentence, or replaced by a description of an emotive linguistic rule (as in (P4)). Instantiations of (G1) will model: (i) the dispositional relations that obtain between ethical sentences and psychological states of belief and attitude; (ii) varying degrees of descriptive precision; (iii) varying degrees of descriptive complexity; (iv) speaker-relativity of descriptive meaning; (v) varying degrees of emotive force or directness; and (vi) varying objects of attitude, whether actions, persons, etc, or any properties these may exemplify. Instantiations of (G2) will model (i), (v), and (vi), and serve as a reminder that the descriptive meaning of ethical language may be merely suggested by the use of ethical sentences, rather than a part of their conventional meanings.

4.2 Moral Reason

An ethical problem is essentially constituted by disagreement or uncertainty in attitude, though it is often constituted by disagreement or uncertainty in belief as well. Resolving an ethical problem, therefore, requires coordinating attitudes, sometimes by coordinating beliefs that causally affect those attitudes. Attitudes may be coordinated by methods that do not involve the use of language; physical force, bribery, and physical seduction are just a few nonlinguistic means of shaping and coordinating attitudes. Stevenson, however, is interested only in linguistic methods of coordinating attitudes, about which at least two questions can be distinguished: (i) How can language be used (and how has it been used) to coordinate attitudes? and (ii) How ought language be used to coordinate attitudes? The latter is itself a normative question and thus falls outside the scope of Stevenson's project. The former is a metaethical question and, thus, is that which Stevenson is most keen to answer. Stevenson categorizes linguistic methods of coordinating attitudes as either “rational” or “nonrational.” Rational methods seek to shape or coordinate attitudes by using language to produce reasons; Stevenson thus calls the set of such methods, aptly enough, “Reason.” Nonrational methods seek to shape or coordinate attitudes by using language in ways other than the production of reasons; Stevenson calls this set of methods “Persuasion.”

A reason, for Stevenson, is “any statement about any matter of fact which any speaker considers likely to alter attitudes” (1944, 115). “Whether this reason will in fact support or oppose the judgment will depend,” Stevenson says, “on whether the hearer believes it, and upon whether if he does, it will actually make a difference to his attitudes; but it may conveniently be called a reason (though not necessarily a ‘valid’ one) regardless of whether it is accepted or not” (1944, 115). Thus, a reason is a statement whose content, if believed, is causally relevant to altering attitudes. About how beliefs may alter attitudes Stevenson cannot be precise, given the complexity of the phenomena. He does provide a very general explanation, namely, that beliefs serve as “intermediaries” between attitudes, strengthening or weakening them by “disclosing new objects of favor or disfavor, in such a way that several attitudes act concurrently, with a mutual modification of them all” (1944, 115; also see especially 1950, 63–70).

Although this explanation is quite general, Stevenson provides a plethora of examples throughout his work to clarify the variety of ways in which beliefs, in their intermediary roles, may serve to strengthen or weaken attitudes (1944, especially Chapters, V, VI, VIII). The examples are divided into those in which beliefs can alter attitudes by being logically related to other beliefs and by being psychologically related to other beliefs. Consider examples of the former kind in which reasons are deductively related to other beliefs in the sense that they call into question the truth of one's judgments. Suppose that Smith disapproves of policies that would weaken a person's sense of independence, but nevertheless claims that providing for unemployment payments would be a good policy (1944, 115–116). Assuming model (P1), Smith's claim is akin the claim “I approve of this policy; do so as well.” In such a case, Jones might try to alter, or call into question, Smith's judgment that the policy is good by establishing the intermediary belief that receiving unemployment payments would weaken a person's sense of independence. In this case, Jones introduces an intermediary belief that is likely to cause in Smith the belief ‘I disapprove of this policy’, which logically contradicts Smith's original belief (according to (P1)). Similarly, assuming model (P3a), Smith's judgment is akin to the claim “This policy (of receiving unemployment benefits) will not weaken a person's sense of independence; hooray for this policy.” Again, Jones might try to alter, or call into question, Smith's judgment that the policy is good by establishing the intermediary, and logically contradictory, belief that receiving unemployment payments would weaken a person's sense of independence. In either case, Smith may alter her attitudes toward unemployment insurance and, hence, her judgment about the policy. As a second example, consider a person A who claims that “it is always wrong to break a promise,” though B points out to A that “there are many cases of that sort which you regard without the least disapproval”:

B's reply is an empirical assertion, but note that it contradicts A's judgment (by the first pattern only, of course) and so is logically related to it. A must, in the interest of consistency, either reject B's assertion, or give up his ethical judgment [i.e., modify his attitude]. (He would be very likely to qualify his judgment, saying merely that most instances of breaking promises are wrong.) (1944, 116)

Stevenson also identifies a number of ways that reasons can shape attitudes in virtue of being psychologically related to others' beliefs. Consider, for example, cases in which reasons are offered pertaining to the consequences or nature of a proposed tax bill (1944, 118–119). One might try, for example, to mold an unfavorable attitude towards the bill by proffering as a reason to oppose it that “it will put a great burden on the poor, and make little difference to the rich” (1944, 119). In this case, the speaker uses as a reason to oppose the bill consequences towards which one is likely to disapprove. (This example is closely related to the previous example, but it does not directly call into question the truth of a belief someone already has.) Stevenson identifies other ways that reasons can be psychologically related to a person's other beliefs or attitudes. Consider, for example, reasons that appeal to intentions, origin, or authority. Smith mentions that another's actions towards an elder friend “is admirable,” but Jones points out that those actions are performed with the intention of getting the elder's inheritance; in this case, Jones makes a claim about the person's intentions or motives, towards which she believes Smith will have an unfavorable attitude and, thereby, will alter Smith's admiration (1944, 121). Or perhaps Jones points out that the general disapproval towards extramarital intercourse arose historically because of admirable attitudes towards a stable family life for children, but that such an origin no longer fits with current circumstances that provide for widespread, effective birth control (1944, 123). In this case, Jones seeks to affect Smith's attitude towards extramarital intercourse by pointing out the origin of that attitude and contrasting it with present circumstances. Or consider a person who tries to shape attitudes by invoking an authority. For example, Jones claims that our schools ought to emphasize the humanities because “‘To seek utility everywhere is entirely unsuited to men that are great-souled and free’ as Aristotle so wisely says” (1944, 125). In this case, Jones seeks to mold Smith's attitude towards favoring the promotion of the humanities by leveraging the extent to which Smith respects Aristotle as an authority on educational matters.

Thus, ethical inquiry and deliberation often proceeds rationally by presenting reasons to be for or against something, reasons whose effectiveness is tied to their logical or psychological relation to others' beliefs.

4.3 Moral Persuasion

Not all linguistic attempts to coordinate or settle attitudes are rational. Often, according to Stevenson, we attempt to mold attitudes by linguistic means other than the presentation of reasons. For example, we often attempt to affect or coordinate attitudes merely by invoking or stressing the purely emotive element of words, or perhaps by using metaphor, intonation, pleasantness of speech or rhythm, and the like. These are all nonrational, but still linguistic, methods of settling and coordinating attitudes that Stevenson calls “Persuasion”:

The most important of the nonrational methods will be called ‘persuasive’ in a somewhat broad sense. It depends on the sheer, direct emotional impact of words—on emotive meaning, rhetorical cadence, apt metaphor, stentorian, stimulating, or pleading tones of voice, dramatic gestures, care in establishing rapport with the hearer or audience, and so on. … A redirection of the hearer's attitudes is sought not by the mediating step of altering his beliefs, but by exhortation, whether obvious or subtle, crude or refined. (1944, 139)

Consider as the first of several examples the many uses of thick ethical terms, such as ‘courageous’ or ‘democratic’. Often, we try to coordinate attitudes by invoking these words more for their emotive meanings than for their descriptive, especially when the descriptive meanings are taken for granted. Saying that one acted in the face of fear may be descriptively accurate; saying that one acted courageously, especially when all relevant parties already believe that one acted in the face of fear, is more likely an attempt to coordinate admiration among the parties. Consider also the persuasive strategy of repetition, especially when terms are used repeatedly in question begging form. Smith says that Jones did the right thing; asked for a reason, Smith merely states that Jones's act was an instance of performing his duty, or that Jones had an obligation to do it. Here, Smith provides no reason at all, but merely attempts to coordinate positive attitudes by relying on the repeated effect of the emotive force of evaluative terms. For a different use of repetition, consider the persuasiveness of Martin Luther King, Jr.'s repetition of ‘I have a dream’ and ‘Let freedom ring’ during his “I Have a Dream” speech, delivered during the 1963 March on Washington. No doubt, Dr. King's speech was intended to shape attitudes in part by specifying various kinds of injustices, that is, by proffering reasons that, it was to be hoped, clashed logically with others’ beliefs about the extension of freedom and equality; but the impact of Dr. King's speech continues to be the persuasive, emotive power of his words and their delivery, including the linguistic technique of repetition. For a wildly different example of persuasion, consider the power wielded by Jim Jones, who was so adept at building rapport with his followers that he was able to coordinate, through speech, the agreement among hundreds of followers to commit suicide in protest “of an inhumane world” (Jones et al. 1978). These are just a few examples in which persuasive linguistic methods are used to shape and coordinate moral thought and, thereby, to resolve moral disagreement.

Persuasive techniques, according to Stevenson, play a vital role in attempts to modify the standards of a society or group. At the center of such reform is the use of what Stevenson calls “persuasive definition,” or attempts to give “a new conceptual meaning to a familiar word without substantially changing its emotive meaning, and which is used with the conscious or unconscious purpose of changing, by this means, the direction of people's interests” (1938b, 32). Suppose Smith recognizes that Jones has had little formal education and uses grammatically incorrect sentences and obvious literary references and, on this basis, claims that Jones is simply not a person of “culture.” Rodriguez agrees that Jones has such qualities but claims that Jones is a person of culture notwithstanding, for “in the true and full sense of the term, ‘culture’ means imaginative sensitivity and originality,” and these qualities Jones has in abundance:

It will be obvious that [Rodriguez], in defining ‘culture’, was not simply introducing a convenient abbreviation, nor was he seeking to clarify ‘the’ common meaning of the term. His purpose was to redirect [Smith's] attitudes, feeling that [Smith] was insufficiently appreciative of their friend's merits. ‘Culture’ had and would continue to have, for people of their sort, a laudatory emotive meaning. The definition urged [Smith] to stop using the laudatory term to refer to grammatical niceties, literary allusions, and the rest, and to use it, instead, to refer to imaginative sensitivity and originality. In this manner, it sought to place the former qualities in a relatively poor light, and the latter in a fine one, and thus to redirect [Smith's] admiration. When people learn to call something by a name rich in emotive meaning, they more readily admire it; and when they learn not to call it by such a name, they less readily admire it. The definition made use of this fact. It sought to change attitudes by changing names. (1944, 211–212; see also 1938b)

It is also possible to persuasively change the emotive meaning of a term while retaining its descriptive meaning. Stevenson calls such attempts persuasive “quasi-definitions,” since he wants to reserve ‘definition’ for a statement of a word's descriptive meaning only. Consider, for example, Simon Blackburn's recent explicit attempt to persuasively quasi-define ‘lust’ (2004). Lust is not a sin, suggests Blackburn, but rather a “delight of the mind”:

(Lust) is not merely useful but essential. We would none of us be here without it. So the task I set myself is to clean off some of the mud, to rescue it from the echoing denunciations of old men of the deserts, to deliver it from the pallid and envious confessors of Rome, and the disgust of the Renaissance, to destroy the stocks and pillories of the Puritans, to separate it from the other things that we know drag it down … and so to lift it from the category of sin to that of virtue. (2004, 3)

Persuasive definitions and quasi-definitions, then, lie at the heart of much moral reform, whether for good or ill (1944, 209–210). “The words are prizes,” Stevenson writes, “which each man seeks to bestow on the qualities of his own choice” (1938b, 35).

For Stevenson, then, ethical inquiry or deliberation involve three general sorts of linguistic methods for resolving moral disagreement or uncertainty: (i) rational, logical methods; (ii) rational, psychological methods; and (ii) persuasive methods.

5. Objections to Stevenson's Emotivism

At least nine objections have been leveled against Stevenson's emotivism over the years, some of which were first articulated by Brand Blanshard (1949). The objections fall within two categories, one related to Stevenson's theory of moral psychology, the other to his theory of moral language. Though most of these objections ultimately miss their mark against Stevenson, several serious objections remain, including what is described below as the Objection from Motivational Judgment Internalism, the Frege-Geach Objection, and the Objection from a Dispositional Theory of Meaning.

5.1 Objections to Stevenson's Theory of Moral Psychology

Stevenson holds that moral judgments or thoughts are essentially constituted at least in part by affective attitudes, feelings, or interests, those mental states whose general character is to be for or against something. In this section, ‘strong emotivism’ refers to this metaphysical view of moral thought. Several objections to Stevenson's theory arise from perceived implications of strong emotivism.

Objection from Moral Properties. According to this objection, if strong emotivism is true, then an event (person, action, policy, institution, etc.) is bad (good, evil, etc.) only if a person has an unfavorable attitude towards that event; however, having such an attitude (the objection goes) cannot be a necessary condition for an event's being bad (good, evil, etc.). Consider, for example, Blanshard's example in which a rabbit has been caught in a severe hunting trap for several days, causing the rabbit unnecessary, prolonged, and extreme agony (1949). According to Blanshard's understanding of strong emotivism, until a person has an unfavorable attitude towards such an event or state of affairs, the rabbit's being in such agony would not be bad, for on this understanding of strong emotivism, an event cannot be bad unless and until someone has a negative attitude towards that event. Since (the objection continues), this conclusion is absurd, Stevenson's theory of moral thought must be false. However, this objection conflates Stevenson's theory of moral thought with a theory of moral properties, assuming as it does that having, for example, an unfavorable attitude towards an event constitutes the badness of that event, at least in part. But this is the kind of moral metaphysics that Stevenson's theory is designed to avoid. According to Stevenson, there is nothing that constitutes badness (or goodness, etc.), for on Stevenson's view there are no such moral properties. Rather, having a negative attitude towards an event constitutes in part the thought that something is bad (good, etc), not badness (goodness, etc.) itself.

Objection from Externalism. Section 2.3 describes Stevenson's “Internalist” argument for strong emotivism. Blanshard objects to this argument for reasons similar to those discussed in that section. Consider a person who thinks, with great contempt, that unnecessary, prolonged, extreme agony is bad and claims repeatedly that it is bad, still repeating the claim even a week later though fatigue has dissipated all contempt:

When we repeat the remark that such suffering was a bad thing, the feeling with which we made it last week may be at or near the vanishing point, but if we were asked whether we meant to say what we did before, we should certainly answer Yes. We should say that we made our point with feeling the first time and little or no feeling the second time, but that it was the same point we were making. And if we see that what we meant to say remains the same, while the feeling varies from intensity to near zero, it is not the feeling that we primarily meant to express. (1949, 45)

That is, it appears plausible that a person can think over time that a certain event is bad, even though the attitude or feeling with which one judged the event as bad has partially or even completely dissipated over that time frame. However, were strong emotivism true, such a thing would be impossible, and thus strong emotivism is likely false. As discussed in Section 2.3, objections of this kind provide one of the more serious challenges to Stevenson's emotivism.

Objection from Rational Irresolvability. According to this objection, if strong emotivism is true, then there can be no objective moral truth, no rational criticism of one's moral judgments, no rationally resolvable moral disagreement. For according to strong emotivism, the moral judgment that something is bad (good, etc) just is in part having a negative attitude towards that thing, and attitudes, feelings, or interests are not rationally governable. This objection has a strong and a weak version. The strong version argues that attitudes cannot be, and hence are never, rationally governable. This objection misses its mark against Stevenson, for as we saw in Sections 2.2 and 4.2, Stevenson goes to great lengths to show how attitudes can be, and in fact often are, rationally governable (see especially 1950, 63–70; 1961–62b). That is, attitudes can be and often are settled, shaped, or coordinated by the presentation of reasons that are logically or psychologically related by means of intermediary beliefs. The weak version argues that attitudes, in principle, may sometimes be rationally ungovernable. Stevenson himself admits that this might be the case (e.g., 1944, 336). From this admission, however, some have been tempted to argue for the next, radically different, objection.

Objection from Moral Chaos. If attitudes may sometimes be rationally ungovernable, then moral disagreement may sometimes be rationally irresolvable. However, if moral disagreement may sometimes be rationally irresolvable, then (this objection goes) moral chaos is likely to ensue. Taking this objection to heart, Blanshard goes as far as to claim that “[The general acceptance of strong emotivism] would, so far as one can see, be an international disaster” (1949). Stevenson could respond that even if the possibility of rational irresolvability could lead to such chaos, such an objection would not constitute a theoretical objection to his theory of moral thought. That is, the objection does not imply that Stevenson's theory of moral thought is false. Stevenson, however, responds directly to the challenge, arguing that such an objection arises from fear that cannot be assuaged by postulating some objective truth or robust moral properties awaiting to be discovered (e.g., 1944, 336 and 1950, 68–70). Rather, such fear can be assuaged only when we have a clear, realistic understanding of the nature and complexity of moral disagreement and of the methods by which they can be, and often are, resolved:

The present analysis can afford no assurance that dictators and self-seeking politicians, whose skill in exhortation is so manifest, ‘inevitably must” fail, if left unopposed, in reshaping moral codes to serve their narrow interests. … But this much must be said: Those who cherish altruism, and look forward to a time when a stable society will be governed by farsighted men, will serve these ideals poorly by turning from present troubles to fancied realms. For these ideals, like all other attitudes, are not imposed upon human nature by esoteric forces; they are a part of human nature itself. If they are to become a more integral part of it, they must be fought for. They must be fought for with the words ‘right’ and ‘wrong’, else these attitude-molding weapons will be left to the use of opponents. And they must be supported with clear-minded reasons, else hypostatic obscurantism will bring contempt to the cause it is intended to plead. (1944, 110; see also 1961–62b)

5.2 Objections to Stevenson's Theory of Moral Language

Objections also arise from considerations of the view that moral language is conventionally used at least in part to express or evoke affective attitudes rather than or in addition to describing or reporting.

Objection from Empty Expression. According to this objection, if strong emotivism is true, then a speaker who utters, for example, ‘That's bad’ as a means of expressing her moral judgment, but without having any negative attitude towards what is referred to, has “expressed nothing.” Such an utterance is, says Blanshard, “as empty as the word ‘Hurrah’ would be when there was no enthusiasm behind it” (1949). This objection fails to distinguish sincere from insincere speech acts. Consider, for example, a speaker who knowingly lies by uttering the sentence ‘Smith is home’. Intuitively, the speaker has expressed the belief that Smith is home, even though by hypothesis she lies and, thus, fails to have that belief. The reason is that it is a plausible condition of sincere assertion that a person who asserts that p believe that p; but one could certainly assert that p without believing that p. Analogously, a speaker who utters ‘Hurrah’ intuitively expresses enthusiasm, since it is a plausible condition of sincere expression that a person who utters ‘Hurrah!’ be enthusiastic. But one could certainly utter ‘Hurrah!’ to express enthusiasm while remaining unenthused. Likewise, Stevenson would respond, a speaker may be unaffected and, thereby, insincere in uttering ‘That's bad’, though she would still thereby express an unfavorable attitude via her utterance.

Objections from Illocutionary/Perlocutionary Conflation. Stevenson claims repeatedly that moral language is used to express a speaker's attitudes or interests or to evoke or otherwise shape the attitudes or interests of others. The Objection from Illocutionary/Perlocutionary Conflation argues that these two claims—that moral language is used to express the attitudes of speakers, and that moral language is used to evoke or alter the attitudes of an audience—conflate illocutionary acts and perlocutionary intentions (e.g., Hare 1952 Section 1.7 and 1997 Sections 1–5–1.6; Urmson 1968). Illocutionary acts are the acts that a speaker performs in uttering a sentence: warning, advising, describing, directing or commanding, asking, expressing and so on. Like sentences, illocutionary acts are subject to logical constraints—it would be logically inconsistent, in some intuitive sense, to direct one's hearer to both close and open a particular window (‘Close that window and open that same window’), for example, or to express both gratitude and annoyance towards the cleaning of one's room (‘Thank you for cleaning the room and shame on you for cleaning the room!’). Since sentences and the illocutionary acts they are typically used to perform have similar logical constraints, illocutionary acts may plausibly be associated in some appropriate way with the semantics or meanings of sentences. Now when a speaker performs an illocutionary act in uttering a sentence, she often does so with particular intentions or effects in mind. For example, knowing that her audience often attempts to annoy her by doing the opposite of what she asks, a speaker may utter ‘Keep the window closed’ with the intention that her audience will in fact open the window. Thus, there need be no logical inconsistency between directing one to keep a particular window closed and an intention that the window be opened. Thus, it is concluded, perlocutionary intention ought not be associated with the semantics or meanings of sentences. The Objection from Illocutionary/Perlocutionary Conflation, then, is that Stevenson's theory of meaning incorporates that which is irrelevant to semantics, namely perlocutionary intentions. This objection is related to the next.

The Objection from Instrumentalism. Even if Stevenson's claims about perlocutionary intentions are ignored, it remains (according to this objection) that Stevenson's theory of meaning is, at bottom, an instrumental or use theory of meaning, since it is a theory that explains the meaning of moral sentences by appealing to the illocutionary acts they are typically used to perform, that is, to their typical illocutionary forces. However, a great many uses of moral sentences fail to have such force. For example, when moral sentence 1 is used in utterances of sentences 2 or 3, it is used without its usual expressive force.

  1. Insulting others is wrong.
  2. If insulting others is wrong, I'll stop.
  3. It is possible that insulting others is wrong.

Thus, the objection goes, Stevenson's theory of meaning leaves too much unsaid about a great many uses of ethical language, and consequently, is radically incomplete.

These last two objections are understandable, given how often Stevenson appeals to the uses and purposes of moral language. Nevertheless, they miss their mark, for Stevenson's theory of meaning is not a “use” or “tool” theory of meaning, but rather a dispositional theory of meaning (Section 3.2; Urmson 1968, Ch. 4; Warnock 1978, Ch. 3). Thus, Stevenson associates the meaning of a word or sentence with neither perlocutionary intentions nor with illocutionary force, but rather with the conjunction or union of its passive and active dispositions—its passive dispositions to be used to express a speaker's mental states and its active dispositions to evoke mental states of a speaker's audience.

The Frege-Geach Objection. Because Stevenson's theory is often thought to succumb to the Objection from Instrumentalism, it is also thought to succumb to the Frege-Geach Objection, perhaps the most pressing objection to any emotivist or expressivist theory of meaning. This objection is so-called because Peter Geach (1958, 1960, 1965), relying on insights from Frege (e.g., 1918), argued persuasively that a sentence's illocutionary force cannot constitute its meaning. The strength of the Frege-Geach Objection arises from the fact that natural languages are compositional and, thus, that a minimal condition of adequacy on any semantic theory is that it specify that which sentences contribute to the more complex sentences into which they are embeddable. For example, a minimally adequate semantic theory for English will entail that the meaning of sentence 1. remains the same when it is embedded within sentences 2. or 3., since an understanding of the latter sentences rests on an understanding of their respective parts, including 1., and of the significance of the way those parts are combined. However, since (it is thought) Stevenson's theory of meaning holds that moral sentences are used to express a speaker's attitudes—i.e., used with expressive illocutionary force—and since moral sentences are often used as parts of more complex sentences without such expressive force, as in sentences 2. and 3., Stevenson has failed to provide a minimally adequate theory of meaning for moral sentences.

The Frege-Geach objection may ultimately undermine Stevenson's theory of moral language, though not, as just discussed, because his theory is a “use” or “tool” theory of meaning that identifies a sentence's meaning with the illocutionary force of its utterance or with the perlocutionary intentions of its speaker. Associating a sentence's meaning instead with the set of its passive and active dispositions, Stevenson's theory of meaning implies that sentences will have relatively stable meanings across contexts of use (Sections 3.1 and 3.2), and therefore, that these dispositions might themselves be contributed to the more complex sentences into which they embed. Precisely how Stevenson's dispositional theory could be extended to account for compositionality in this way is unclear, and Stevenson himself appears never to have been sufficiently worried by the Frege-Geach objection to respond to it. One idea would be that sentential operators, such as ‘if … then’ and ‘it is possible that’ be treated as functions from the dispositions of the component sentences to a resulting set of dispositions, where the latter would constitute the meaning of the complex sentence. Stevenson hints at such a possible extension of his theory while discussing the compositionality of atomic sentences:

No attempt has been made here to deal with one of the most difficult problems that meaning-theory includes—that of explaining how separate words, each one with its own meaning, can combine to yield sentence-meanings. It is feasible, perhaps, to take each word as having a disposition to affect cognition, just as the full sentence does. The problem reduces, then, to one of explaining the interplay of the dispositions of the several words, when realized conjointly. The analogy of the magnets will still serve, used now to illustrate the relationship of meanings rather than of beliefs. We may compare the meaning of each word with the disposition of some one of the magnets, and compare the meaning of the sentence with the disposition that may be assigned to the group of magnets. Each word has an independent meaning in the sense that if it is replaced by certain others in any context, there will be a typical sort of difference in the meaning of the context; but the precise way in which the word's meaning is realized will depend on the meaning of the other words that accompany it. (1944, 67)

Since Stevenson suggests that he might explain the compositionality of atomic sentences in terms of functions from the dispositions of a sentence's parts to a set of resulting dispositions, it is plausible that he might also wish to extend his theory in a similar way to explain the compositionality of complex sentences. Whether such a theory could sustain additional scrutiny is debatable. For more in-depth but accessible discussion of emotivist and expressivist attempts to respond to the Frege-Geach Objection, see especially Schroeder 2008a and 2008b and the entry on moral cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.

Objection from General Dispositional Theories. Stevenson's is a dispositional theory of meaning. As explained in Section 2.2, his is also a dispositional theory of mental states. As such, Stevenson's emotivism inherits challenges that accrue to most kinds of dispositional theories. For an accessible discussion of the merits and demerits of dispositional theories, see the entry on dispositions.

6. Stevenson's Legacy

Stevenson remains a central figure in current day metaethics, a result of his development of at least four key ideas:

  1. Progress in ethical theory begins by focusing in the first instance on moral thought—on what it is to think that something is good, bad, evil, etc.
  2. Moral thoughts are essentially constituted at least in part by attitudes or interests, that is, those feelings, attitudes, or other affective states that are most closely related to motivation and action, which can be generally characterized as states of being for or being against.
  3. Attitudes or interests can be, and often are, rationally governable.
  4. Moral sentences have both emotive and descriptive meaning.

These four ideas remain central to current day expressivists, such as Blackburn (1984, 1993) and Gibbard (1990, 2003), whose work arises especially from ideas 1–3. Indeed, the title of Gibbard 1990, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings, suggests all three ideas. Current day hybrid expressivists, such as Stephen Barker (2002), Daniel Boisvert (2008), David Copp (2001, 2009), and Michael Ridge (2006, 2007, 2014), hold that moral language is used conventionally to express both beliefs and attitudes and, thereby, continue to develop in different ways Stevenson's idea that moral sentences have both emotive and descriptive meaning (Fletcher and Ridge 2014).


Works by C. L. Stevenson Cited in This Article

  • 1937, “The Emotive Meaning of Ethical Terms,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 10–31.
  • 1938a, “Ethical Judgments and Avoidability,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 138–152.
  • 1938b, “Persuasive Definitions,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 32–54.
  • 1944, Ethics and Language, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • 1946 [1943], “Some Relations Between Philosophy and the Study of Language,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 175–185.
  • 1948a, “Meaning: Descriptive and Emotive,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 153–174.
  • 1948b [1941], “The Nature of Ethical Disagreement,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 1–9.
  • 1950, “The Emotive Conception of Ethics and Its Cognitive Implications,” reprinted in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 55–70.
  • 1961–62a, “Reflections on John Dewey's Ethics,” in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 94–116.
  • 1961–62b, “Relativism and Nonrelativism in the Theory of Value,” in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 71–93.
  • 1963a, Facts and Values: Studies in Ethical Analysis, New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • 1963b, “Retrospective Comments,” in Stevenson 1963a, pp. 186–232.
  • 1973, “Richards on the Theory of Value,” in I. A. Richards: Essays in His Honor, Reuben Brower et. al (eds), New York: Oxford University Press, pp. 119–134.

Other References and Secondary Literature

  • Ayer, A. J., 1936, Language, Truth, and Logic, London: Victor Gollancz Ltd.
  • Barker, S., 2002, “Is Value Content a Component of Conventional Implicature?,” Analysis, 60(3): 268–279.
  • Blackburn, S., 1984, Spreading the Word, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1993, Essays in Quasi-Realism, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2004, Lust, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Blanshard, B., 1949, “The New Subjectivism in Ethics,” reprinted in Ethics: The Big Questions, 2nd edition, J. Sterba (ed.), 2009, Hoboken: Wiley-Blackwell, pp. 43–49.
  • Boisvert, D., 2008, “Expressive-Assertivism,” Pacific Philosophical Quarterly, 89(2): 169–203.
  • Brandt, R., 1959, Ethical Theory: The Problems of Normative and Critical Ethics, Englewood Cliffs, New Jersey: Prentice-Hall, Inc.
  • Brink, D., 1989, Moral Realism and the Foundations of Ethics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Burks, A., 1978, Preface to Values and Morals: Essays in Honour of William Frankena, Charles Stevenson, and Richard Brandt, A. Goldman and J. Kim (eds), Dortrecht: Reidel, pp. vii–xvii.
  • Copp, D., 2001, “Realist Expressivism: A Neglected Option for Moral Realism,” Social Philosophy and Policy, 18(2): 1–43.
  • –––, 2009, “Realist Expressivism and Conventional Implicature,” in Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Volume 4, R. Shafer-Landau (ed), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 167-202.
  • Dancy, J., 1993, Moral Reasons, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Dreier, J., 2001, “C. L. Stevenson,” in A Companion to Analytic Philosophy, A. Martinich and D. Sosa (eds), Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing, pp. 175–180.
  • Fara, Michael, 2009, “Dispositions,” The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Summer 2009 Edition), Edward N. Zalta(ed.), URL = <>.
  • Finlay, S., 2005, “The Emotive Theory of Ethics,” MacMillan Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 2nd edition, M. Borchert (editor-in-chief), New York: Thomson Gale.
  • Fletcher G. and M. Ridge, 2014. Having it Both Ways: Hybrid Theories and Modern Metaethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Frege, G., 1918, “Negation,” in The Frege Reader, Michael Beaney (ed.), 1997, Malden, MA: Blackwell Publishing, pp. 346–361.
  • Geach, P., 1958, “Imperative and Deontic Logic,” Analysis, 18: 49–56.
  • –––, 1960, “Ascriptivism,” Philosophical Review, 69: 221–225.
  • –––, 1965, “Assertion,” Philosophical Review, 74: 449–465.
  • Gibbard, A., 1990, Wise Choices, Apt Feelings: A Theory of Normative Judgment, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • –––, 2003, Thinking How to Live, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Grice, P., 1975, “Logic and Conversation,” reprinted in P. Grice, Studies in the Way of Words, 1989, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Hare, R. M., 1952, The Language of Morals, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1997, Sorting Out Ethics, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Kauppinen, A., 2008, “Moral Internalism and the Brain,” Social Theory and Practice, 34(1): 1–24.
  • Mill, J. S., 1861, Utilitarianism, Roger Crisp (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Moore, G. E., 1903, Principia Ethica, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press; revised edition with “Preface to the second edition,” T. Baldwin (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993.
  • Morris, C. W., 1938, Foundations of the Theory of Signs, Chicago: University of Chicago Press.
  • Ogden, C. K. and I. A. Richards, 1923, The Meaning of Meaning, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner.
  • Perry, R. B., 1926, General Theory of Value: Its Meaning and Basic Principles Construed in Terms of Interest, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Prinz, Jesse, 2006, “The Emotional Basis of Moral Judgments,” Philosophical Explorations, 9: 29–43.
  • –––, 2007, The Emotional Construction of Morals, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Railton, P., 1986, “Moral Realism,” Philosophical Review, 95: 163–207.
  • Richards, I. A., 1924, Principles of Literary Criticism, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner.
  • –––, 1926, Science and Poetry, London: Kegan Paul, Trench, Trubner.
  • Ridge, M., 2006, “Ecumenical Expressivism: Finessing Frege,” Ethics, 116(2): 302–336.
  • –––, 2007, “Ecumenical Expressivism: The Best of Both Worlds,” in Oxford Studies in Metaethics, Vol. 2, R. Shafer-Landau (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 51-76.
  • –––, 2014. Impassioned Belief, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Rosati, C. S., 2008, “Moral Motivation”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2008 Edition), Edward N. Zalta(ed.), URL = <>.
  • Roskies, A., 2003, “Are Ethical Judgments Intrinsically Motivational? Lessons from ‘Acquired Sociopathy’,” Philosophical Psychology, 16: 51–66.
  • –––, 2006, “A Case Study of Neuroethics: The Nature of Moral Judgment,” in Neuroethics: Defining the Issues in Theory, Practice, and Policy, J. Illes (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press: pp. 17–32.
  • Satris, S., 1987, Ethical Emotivism, Dortdrecht: Martinus Nijhoff Publishers.
  • Scanlon, T., 1998, What We Owe to Each Other, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Schroeder, M., 2008a, Being For: Evaluating the Semantic Program of Expressivism, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2008b, “What is the Frege-Geach Problem?,” Philosophy Compass, 3(4): 703–720.
  • Searle, J., 1975, “Indirect Speech Acts,” in Expression and Meaning: Studies in the Theory of Speech Acts, 1985, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 30–57.
  • Shafer-Landau, R., 2003, Moral Realism: A Defence, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Smith, M., 1994, The Moral Problem, Oxford: Basil Blackwell.
  • Svavarsdottir, S., 1999, “Moral Cognitivism and Motivation,” Philosophical Review, 108:161–219.
  • –––, 2006, “How Do Moral Judgments Motivate?”, in Contemporary Debates in Moral Theory, J. Dreier (ed), Oxford: Blackwell, pp. 163–181.
  • Urmson, J., 1968. The Emotive Theory of Ethics, London: Hutchinson & Co.
  • van Roojen, M., 2009, “Moral Cognitivism vs. Non-Cognitivism”, The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2009 Edition), Edward N. Zalta(ed.), URL = <>.
  • Warnock, M., 1978. Ethics Since 1900, third edition, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Other Internet Resources


The author thanks Giulio Pietroiusti for especially helpful discussion concerning Stevenson's First and Second Patterns of analysis.

Copyright © 2015 by
Daniel R. Boisvert <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]