Notes to Revolution

1. Cécile Fabre (2012), Steven Lee (2012), and Allen Buchanan (1979, 2006, 2013) all have addressed some important issues of just revolutionary war, but none has provided a comprehensive account.

2. Ned Dobos’s valuable book, Insurrection and Intervention: Two Faces of Sovereignty (2011), is also a step forward in addressing the neglected topic of the morality of revolution. It is narrower in scope than Finlay’s work, because it focuses on the question of whether the same circumstances that justify revolution can also justify intervention.

3. Secession can occur through constitutional processes, but this is extremely rare. In most cases secession is an extra-constitutional phenomenon.

4.Wholesale rejection and destruction of existing government authority, the anarchist’s aim, could be viewed as revolution in an extended sense, because the goal would be to establish a new social arrangement without the state, a radical change.

5. Algeria was not a colony, but rather a department of France.

6. See, for example, Erica Chenoweth and Maria Stephen, Why Civil Resistance Works: The Strategic Logic of Nonviolent Conflict (New York: Columbia University Press, 2011).

7. If the ultimate result of the supposedly inevitable radical transformation of society is not a new, fundamentally different form of government, but rather a form of society beyond the state, then the so-called proletarian revolution would be more accurately described as a proletarian rebellion. Yet if there is an initial stage in the struggle, namely, the dictatorship of the proletariat understood as the proletariat’s gaining control of the state apparatus, then it would be accurate to say that this is a revolution, but that it will be followed by a more fundamental transformation that is not a change in the type of government.

8. Those who initiate revolutionary war or who attempt to do so are typically a minority and hence are attempting to lead others in revolutionary war, understood as involving a large scale attempt at the violent over of the government that entails the development of strategies and tactics the implementation of which requires coordinated collective efforts. Sometimes revolutionary violence can be undertaken by individuals who do not aspire to leadership in revolutionary war, as is the case when violence erupts spontaneously and is not conceived as being part of a plan for war.

9. Protocol 1 to the 1949 Geneva Conventions allows revolutionary warriors to wear civilian clothes and conceal their weapons when they are not deploying for action or engaging in it, but does not permit them to use civilian appearance for purposes of ambush, which is defined as perfidious (Section II, Article 44).

Copyright © 2017 by
Allen Buchanan <>

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