Notes to Questions

1. The latter condition ensures that questions can be truthfully resolved in every possible world. That is, if the propositions that make up a question meaning are required to cover the entire logical space, then for any question meaning \(I\) and any world \(w\), there is always at least one proposition \(\alpha\) in \(I\) that contains \(w\). This proposition corresponds to a response that is true in \(w\) and resolves the given question. The condition that questions can be truthfully resolved in every possible world is weakened in presuppositional extensions of \(\Inq_B\), see section 2.3.2.

2. A note on terminology: the term inquisitive semantics was initially used to refer to the system developed in Groenendijk 2009 and Mascarenhas 2009, discussed in section 2.2.2 above, but is currently generally used to refer to the system \(\Inq_B\) and its extensions. Here, to avoid confusion, we use it only to refer to the latter.

3. As is commonly done in formal semantics, we use expressions from the lambda calculus here to describe functions. For instance, \(\lambda x.mother(x)\) is a function that takes an individual \(x\) as its input and yields \(x\)’s mother as its output. Similarly, \(\lambda x.\lambda w.called(x)(w)\) is a function that takes an individual \(x\) as its input and then yields as its output another function, \(\lambda w.called(x)(w)\), which takes a world \(w\) as its input and yields a truth value, either 1 or 0, depending on whether the individual \(x\) called in the world \(w\). The latter function is the characteristic function of the set of all worlds in which \(x\) called, i.e., the proposition that \(x\) called. It is common practice to identify propositions with their characteristic functions.

4. The predicates are to be interpreted as follows: \(Gx\) stands for ‘\(x\) is a sample of gas’; \(Ex\) stands for ‘\(x\) expands’; \(Tx\) stands for ‘the temperature of \(x\) is kept constant while the pressure decreases’; \(Px\) stands for ‘the pressure of \(x\) is kept constant while the temperature increases’; \(Ax\) stands for ‘the absolute temperature of \(x\) increases by a larger factor than its pressure’; and \(Dx\) stands for ‘the pressure of \(x\) decreases by a larger factor than its absolute temperature’. Given the English wording in the passage from which (16) derives, one might argue that the material biconditional in (16) should be replaced with a material conditional, but it is clear that (16) is the logical form that Bromberger intends.

5. One might wonder whether (16) is an abnormic law that completes ‘Nothing expands’, but (16) is of the wrong form. An abnormic law completing ‘Nothing expands’ would have the form ‘Nothing expands unless it is \(\phi\)’. (16) is of the form ‘No gas expands unless it is \(\psi\)’, but notice that this is not equivalent to ‘Nothing expands unless it is a gas and \(\psi\)’. Indeed, the latter is sure to be false (and therefore not an abnormic law) no matter what replaces \(\psi\), since things other than gases expand. In order for an abnormic law of the form ‘Nothing expands unless it is \(\phi\)’ to complete the general rule ‘Nothing expands’, \(\phi\) would have to be a disjunction exhaustively specifying every type of thing that expands. Thus, \(\phi\) would have to contain a disjunct mentioning gases (and the conditions under which gases expand) as well as a disjunct for each type of thing that is capable of expanding (along with the conditions under which that type of thing expands). The correctness of \(Pa\) as an answer to (18) depends on there not being such a \(\phi\), and this could conceivably be disputed, but it is at least plausible that there is no such \(\phi\).

Copyright © 2018 by
Charles Cross <>
Floris Roelofsen <>

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