Notes to Presupposition

1. We use small capitals for indicating focal stress.

2. Strawson provides technical development of his partial logical approach to presupposition in Strawson (1952). Further early discussion of Strawson's proposals is found in Sellars (1954), Strawson (1954), and Nerlich (1967). Van Fraassen (1968) develops a variant approach which uses a partial semantics, but preserves classically valid entailments. For general discussion of the application of such logics to presupposition, see Beaver (1997), Gamut (1991), McCawley (1981), or Soames (1989). Classic early references on partial and multivalent logics include Bochvar (1939) and Kleene (1952), while Blamey (1989) provides a useful overview of such logics.

3. This notion of presupposition was discussed by van Fraassen (1968).

4. Note that under both definitions, every tautology is a presupposition of every sentence, a carry-over of the fact that classically tautologies are consequences of every sentence. Some have argued that this is not a desirable property for entailment (and that what is needed is a notion of relevant entailment—see the entry on relevance logic. But it is not clear whether it is an undesirable property for logics of presupposition: to the extent that such systems model what is taken for granted by speakers, it might be seen as natural that tautologies are presupposed.

5. It is perhaps easiest to see that (12a) presupposes (12c) by considering (i), to which (12a) is equivalent since both classically, and in Strong Kleene, φ → ψ ≡ ¬ ( φ ∧ ¬ ψ ).

  1. It's not the case that [the knave stole the tarts and there was no trouble].

Since Strong Kleene negation is presupposition preserving, this carries the same presuppositions as:

  1. The knave stole the tarts and there was no trouble.

Assuming again that “the knave” is the only source of presupposition, it is easy to see that (ii) is undefined just in case the left-hand conjunct is undefined and the right-hand conjunct is true (since the right-hand conjunct cannot be undefined, and if it were false, the entire conjunction would be false). That is, (ii) is undefined iff there was no trouble and there is no knave. So (ii) is defined iff it's not the case that [there was no trouble and there is no knave]. Using the classical equivalence with implication once more, (ii) is defined iff it holds that if there was no trouble, then there is a knave. We've thus shown that (ii) has the presupposition in (12c), and hence so do (i) and (12a).

6. The internal (e.g., “is not”) and external (“it is not the case that”) negation constructions of English do not correspond directly to presupposition-affirming and presupposition-denying negations, although there may conceivably be a tendency (either among academic philosophers or in general) to use external negation when denying presuppositions.

7. For recent discussion of Stalnaker's account of presuppositions, see Simons (2003).

8. Stalnaker explicitly notes that the notion of pragmatic presupposition is not inconsistent with the existence of Strawson-Frege type semantic presuppositions. He observes that whenever something is semantically presupposed, we should expect it to be pragmatically presupposed, as well (though not vice versa). Thus if a definite description semantically presupposes the existence of a suitable referent, then it follows that speakers using definites will pragmatically presuppose the existence of such referents.

9. Though their impact was immediate, Grice's William James lectures became widely available only later, Grice (1989). Note that Grice himself did not advocate simply reducing presupposition to conversational implicature.

10. Schlenker's special-purpose rule is: “Be Articulate”. This exhorts speakers to assert content rather than presupposing it, but, because of interactions with other maxims, only forces them to do so when such an assertion would not yield redundancy. The net effect is much like that described for Karttunen's (1974) model, below.

11. To deal with cases involving multiple presuppositions, van der Sandt's definition also incorporates a further check: only those potential presuppositions which are consistent with all other presuppositions are projected. However, some problems remain in cases of multiple presupposition, as pointed out in Beaver (2001, p. 66, fn. 6).

12. It should be noted that, pre-theoretically speaking, there is no good reason to suppose that attitude verbs and verbs of saying are plugs: if it is not part of the common ground that France doesn't have a king, (18) will be taken to imply that there is such a person. See Section 5.3 below for further discussion.

13. In the formalization of Karttunen's model above, the conditionals produce conditionalized presuppositions only if the antecedent of the conditional precedes the consequent. Empirically, it remains a contentious issue to what extent presupposition projection is asymmetric in this way—see e.g., Chemla and Schlenker (2009) and Rothschild (2008).

14. Note that if in (15b) we took the presupposition of the definite “the knave” to include a uniqueness or maximality requirement, i.e., that there was no more than one knave, then the overall presupposition of the example as predicted by the Karttunen (1974) model, and indeed by Strong Kleene, would no longer be trivial. The presupposition would be that if there was a knave then there was only one knave. More generally, the conditionalized presuppositions predicted by Karttunen came under withering attack by Gazdar (1979b); Gazdar (1979a), and have been a subject of controversy ever since; see e.g., Beaver (2001) and Geurts (1999a) for discussion.

15. The four values correspond to the possible boolean values that can be given simultaneously to the ordinary content and to the presupposition, thus <1,1>, <0,1>, <1,0> and <0,0>. Thus the third (presupposition failure) value in a trivalent system corresponds to two different values in the four valued system, i.e., <1,0> and <0,0> (where the second index is the truth value of the presupposition).

16. It is difficult to see in Stalnaker's original papers just when and how he took the context to be updated when a complex sentence is uttered. But it became clear with Stalnaker (1998) that he did not intend in those early papers that every sub-part of an utterance should force the sort of fine-grained contextual updates found in Heim's work and in later dynamic semantic models, such as those of Veltman (1996) and Groenendijk and Stokhof (1991).

17. Note that Definition 10 does not cover modals or attitude verbs: for discussion see the Beaver, Heim and Zeevat references above, and section 5.3, below.

18. Sæbø (1996) extends the parallel yet further, suggesting that zero anaphors (e.g., “Sam recovered” not saying explicitly what he recovered from) can be treated as a special case of presuppositions.

19. It is notable that for both (36a) and (36b), accommodation is possible if the context at least provides a hook, in the form of a salient individual that could conceivably be a person, or pregnant, respectively. Thus whereas in a context where the interlocutors have been discussing their tech stocks, without mentioning any particular people, (36b) would be odd, in a similar context but where someone called “Jo” had been mentioned, an utterance of “And by the way…” followed by (36b) would be interpretable, albeit potentially surprising if the hearer did not already know Jo's gender.

20. For more discussion of this type of case, see Kay (1992), Geurts (1999a), Abbott (2000), Beaver (2001), Abusch (2002).

Copyright © 2011 by
David I. Beaver <>
Bart Geurts <>

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