Notes to Preferences

1. Bundles of goods are represented as vectors, where each position in the vector represents a specific good, and the scalar at that position denotes the number of units of that good. For convenience, economists often operate in two-goods worlds, where one good—the numeraire—stands for all the other goods (money is the most common numeraire). The countability of such bundles allows formulating two important preference properties.

Preferences are monotone if larger bundles are always preferred to smaller bundles of the same goods, i.e. if A=⟨a1,…,an⟩ is preference ranked and there is a bundle B=⟨b1,…,bn⟩ such that for at least one i: ai>bi and for all other j: ajbj, then AB.

Preferences are homothetic if indifference is retained under proportional expansions, i.e. if AB, then aAaB for any a0 (aA is the vecotor obtained by multiplying each element of A by a). These properties allow inferring a preference relation over many alternatives on the basis of only a few observations.

2. A lexicographic preference relation gives absolute priority to one good over another. In the case of two-goods bundles, AB if a1>b1, or a1=b1 and a2>b2. Good 1 then cannot be traded off by any amount of good 2. Debreu shows that such a preference relation cannot be represented by a standard utility function.

3. This and the counterexample below have been dismissed on the ground that properties α and β were intended only for changes in the set of alternatives which do not change the agent's information of the alternatives' desirability. However, it is not clear how much of a distinction can be made between cases for which the properties hold and those for which they do not, without recurring to criteria of the same type as α or β. Such a criticism thus runs the danger of turning into an immunising defence of the properties.

4. The expansion property γ requires that an element X that is chosen from every set in a particular class must also be chosen from their union.

C(B1) ∩ … ∩ C(Bn) ⊆ C(B1 ∪ … ∪ Bn)    (Property γ, Expansion)

As an example of property γ, if one of the university's best teachers in non-classical logic is also one of its best teachers in classical logic, then she is one of its best logic teachers.

5. A variety of models of preference change have been proposed that differ in what they want to achieve. Psychometric analysis only strives to record relationships between past and current preference orderings, not to explain them. It makes almost no rationality assumptions. Böckenholt (2002), for example, discusses a Thurstonian vector autoregressive model that investigates the strength of the relation between past and current preference rankings (with ties). A crucial assumption in this investigation is the normal distribution of the individual differences in preference judgements. A justification of this assumption would require insights into the underlying mechanisms that the data and the models used in this research do not provide. This requires models of explanatory scope.

Copyright © 2017 by
Sven Ove Hansson <>
Till Grüne-Yanoff <>

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]