Notes to Pragmatic Arguments and Belief in God

1. Translated by W.K.C. Guthrie.

2. Some commentators read the Will-to-Believe essay as advancing a truth-dependent argument.

3. My analysis here is influenced by Gale (1990, 358).

4. On the many-gods objection to Pascal's Wager, see Jordan (2006, 219–23).

5. I do not suggest that this brief argument is a complete summary of Gale's detailed objection to James.

6. This is obvious to consequentialist eyes, and, arguably, plausible (even if not obvious) to any who hold that moral duties are defeasible.

7. See (Somerville 1995).

8. This point is made in Stove (2003, 34).

9. Is (12) well supported? Two commentators (neither of whom could be called theistic apologists) characterize the relevant social science literature as “…a huge, and growing literature that finds religion to be a reliable source of better mental and even physical health… regardless of the age, sex, race, ethnicity, nationality, or time period of the population being studies” (Stark and Fink 2000, 31–2). See also Koenig, McCullough, and Larson (2001).

10. For a discussion concerning the various kinds of rationality and the relations among them, see Moser (1985, 211–38); for an objection to this idea see Feldman (2000, 693–95).

11. It is far from clear that every case of self-deception is morally or rationally problematic. If it is permissible on some occasions to deceive others, perhaps it is likewise permissible on some occasions to deceive oneself.

Copyright © 2018 by
Jeff Jordan <>

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