The Metaphysics of Mass Expressions

First published Thu Nov 8, 2012

A man might lose an appendix and some blood in surgery, but it seems wrong to say that there is a thing he lost in addition to the appendix. After a child destroys her sandcastle, there is one less thing in the world, but no less sand. One can count cakes, but not cake. Split a large portion of water in half and you will be left with what you started with—water. Split a computer monitor in half and you will not be left with a monitor or monitors.

These examples point to a ubiquitous but elusive conceptual distinction between stuff and things. Paradigmatic examples of stuffs are wood, water, hydrogen, and iron. Less paradigmatic stuffs include beer, salsa, and butter. The most general physical stuff-kind is matter. The concept of stuff is even more general than matter. Concepts such as ectoplasm, justification, or phlogiston may refer to spiritual or abstract stuff. ‘Things’ or ‘objects’ refer, most paradigmatically, to medium-sized entities such as tables and ladles, pears and bears, and locks and socks.

Philosophical explorations of the distinction have generated a number of interesting questions in philosophy of language and metaphysics. The linguistic distinction between what are called mass expressions (e.g., ‘lead’, ‘the water in the tub’) and count expressions (e.g., ‘two horses,’ ‘the horse in the barn’) is believed to be important in examining the metaphysical stuff/thing distinction. In this entry we will be more concerned with nominal mass expressions (e.g., ‘the water in the tub’, ‘the gold in his teeth’), as opposed to predicative mass expressions (e.g., ‘the statue is lead’). Some main questions in this area include: Are things illusory, the world consisting, most fundamentally, of stuff alone? Or is stuff just a certain kind of thing or things? Is all talk of physical kinds of stuff only about concrete portions of matter, or is it also (or instead) about universals? Is there a stuff quantifier in addition to the standard one?

The present essay articulates the foregoing questions, and surveys various answers to them. In particular, we will survey different answers to the following, which is our main target question: What do nominal mass expressions refer to?

1. Introduction

1.1 Mass Nouns and Count Nouns

In the literature, rather than mass and count expressions, there has been a tendency to focus on what are called mass and count nouns. Mass nouns include nitrogen, porridge, trash, china, traffic, data, shade, music and furniture. Count nouns include horse, futon, army, codicil, proposition, and galaxy. It should be noted from the outset that the relation between the mass/count distinction and the stuff/thing distinction is not straightforward, as there are so many different kinds of entities (e.g., events, concreta, sets, processes, absences, conventional entities, etc.) referred to by both mass and count expressions.

Mass expression is a broader class, which, in addition to mass nouns, includes phrases such as ‘the water in the tub’, ‘the gold in France,’ and ‘the grape juice Roderick drank.’ Similarly, ‘Robert’s car’, ‘John’s student,’ ‘a NATO signatory’ are count expressions.

There is an issue, orthogonal to our discussion, about whether expression -types or expression-instances are what are primarily mass or count. Many hold that mass expressions are ambiguous between mass or count senses depending upon context (e.g., ‘Mary had a little lamb’ could mean she owned one, or ate some (Quine 1960, p. 91)). This question can be side-stepped by stipulating, in what follows, that the phrases ‘mass nouns,’ ‘mass terms,’ and ‘mass expressions’ will mean “noun/term/expression occurrences employed with a mass sense” (see Pelletier 1975 and Koslicki 1999, section II, for details on this issue).

Mass and count nouns act differently in relation to quantifiers and non-logical determiners. Count nouns, but not mass nouns (when not used in the kind sense), can be prefaced by ‘each’, ‘every’, ‘few’, ‘fewer’, ‘many’, and ‘a’. Mass nouns, but not count nouns, can be prefaced by ‘much’, ‘little’, ‘a lot of’, ‘less’, ‘more’, ‘a quantity of’, and so on. Both mass and count nouns take ‘most’, ‘all’, ‘some’, ‘no’, ‘none of the’, ‘any’, ‘hardly any’, and ‘a little’.

Only count nouns can be prefaced unqualifiedly by numerals or the indefinite article, and be pluralized without a category shift. When we switch from speaking of ‘a horse’ to ‘five horses’ we have not switched from speaking of things to speaking of kinds of things. However, when we switch from speaking of ‘wine’ to ‘a wine’ or ‘seven wines’, we usually switch from speaking about wine, or portions of it, to speaking about kinds of wine (Pelletier 1974). (Compare ‘The wine is over there’ to ‘Gallo sells seven wines.’) While we do say things like “We’ll have six beers,” or “I need five milks for the children,” these are understood, depending on context, as shorthand for ‘six bottles/kegs of beer,’ or ‘six cartons/pints of milk.’ If you pour a glass of wine on the floor you cannot, if grammar is your guide, count the number of ‘wines’ (in the non-kind sense) on the floor. There are no things (or at least no commonsense things) which are wines, such that there are a number of them on the floor.

While mass nouns do not admit the indefinite article, they admit a use of ‘some’ which acts like an indefinite article (Cartwright 1965). We can say, for example, “Adam drank some water which is worse than Onondaga Lake water,” or, “Heraclitus bathed in some water yesterday and bathed in it again today.”

Both count and mass nouns admit the definite article. There are sentence forms with a mass noun prefaced by the definite article, such as “Socrates drank the hemlock in that cup,” “Bob just wrote your name in the snow over there.” These sentences, if true, will be cases of definite reference of mass expressions, in that they pick out an actual, unique, and concrete referent. Both mass and count nouns admit definite reference. But, it is controversial whether definite reference to stuff is singular reference.

For our purposes, it is useful to lay down a limited taxonomy of mass nouns, not based on their linguistic, logical, or semantic features, but based upon prima facie salient metaphysical criteria. Compare the following lists:

  1. Concrete Quasi-Mass Nouns: furniture, silverware, china, trash, clothes
  2. Concrete Mass Nouns: water, iron, lead, porridge, flesh
  3. Abstract Mass Nouns: information, data, wisdom
  4. Psychological Mass Nouns: pain, admiration
  5. Quantitative Mass Nouns: speed, weight, work, mass

(a) are definitely mass by the grammatical criteria discussed above, and they refer to concrete entities. But, it is hard to see what import they would have for supporting a metaphysics of stuff. These words are devices for speaking about distinct, discrete objects in a collective manner. In certain contexts, we seek to draw attention to a bunch of distinct individuals, not as such, but, for pragmatic reasons, as an undifferentiated mass or plurality of a certain kind. Few have been led by thinking about the use of the words furniture or silverware to conclude that there is a category of stuff distinct from things. But, as we will discuss, our metaphysical insouciance with regards to category (a) could very well undermine the contention that concrete mass nouns do in fact have metaphysical import, since there is little or no grammatical difference between terms in category (a) or (b).

Concrete mass nouns refer to the kinds of entities discussed most often in the linguistically-informed metaphysics literature. They have also been called ‘physical stuff-kind terms’ (Zimmerman 1995).

Abstract mass nouns, if they do refer, do not, prima facie, refer to physical stuffs or hunks of stuff. (And the possibility of propositional or abstract stuff is dubious).

Addressing issues surrounding abstract, psychological, and quantitative mass nouns and their referents is beyond the scope of this article. Due to the almost exclusive emphasis on concrete and quasi-concrete mass nouns in the metaphysics literature, this article will follow suit. While an analysis of concrete and quasi-concrete mass expressions could possibly be carried over to generate a general metaphysical theory of masses, the prospects for this are dim. This is because, even given the grammatical similarities between all mass expressions, there are far too many differences between concrete stuff and the entities in categories (c)–(e). Moreover, we should also be skeptical of the possibility of a metaphysical analysis of concrete and quasi-concrete mass expressions to straightforwardly deliver a linguistic or metaphysical interpretation of mass expressions and their referents in general.

In what follows, both concrete and quasi-concrete mass expressions will be referred to as ‘concrete mass expressions,’ except when the distinction is needed. Also, due to our focus, ‘mass expressions’ henceforth refers only to concrete mass expressions, except where indicated.

1.2 Stuff, Things, Fundamentality and Reduction

There are conflicting intuitions about the relation between objects and their constituting matter (see the entry on “material constitution” for more details on this issue). Many make a strong case for an ontological distinction between stuff (or matter) and things. Here are some typical reasons to believe in the distinction:

  1. Some stuff often has a different history than an object which it constitutes. Invariably, the water that makes up a snowball pre-dates the snowball.
  2. The persistence of an object (e.g., a desk) is sensitive to the contiguity of its parts. Some stuff (e.g., the wood), however, can survive many instances of spatial scatter.
  3. Stuffs are cumulative, objects are not (Burge 1977, p. 104). For instance, any two portions of water, considered together, make up a portion of water that contains the first two portions as parts. But objects are not like this, e.g., two cars or cats do not make up a car or cat.
  4. Stuffs are dissective, objects are not (Burge 1977, p. 106) Divide up a (macroscopic) portion of water in half and you will be left with water. Divide a flower in half, and you won’t be left with flowers. (Although this is often a matter of degree).
  5. Extended simple objects with no parts are possible. While there are no objects or things making up such objects, there is nevertheless stuff composing it. The parts do not pre-date the division of an extended simple, whereas the stuff does (Markosian 1998a; Scala 2002).

But, if stuff and things are distinct, they must be intimately related. It is tempting to philosophers to try to reduce or eliminate one of the categories and hold that only one category is fundamental (or ‘ontologically basic,’ i.e., it must be mentioned in any true, comprehensive, and non-redundant description of the world).

Reflection can lead us to believe that a familiar object, such as a tree, is nothing more than some stuff in a certain arrangement. This stuff could have been in a different arrangement, possibly constituting two smaller trees, or perhaps nothing at all. This raises the possibility that stuff is more fundamental than things.

But, when we look closely at stuff, or listen to scientists, we see that it is likely particulate, and, if particles are objects, then it appears that stuff is actually not fundamental after all—objects are. Prima facie these positions cannot both be true, and our conflicting intuitions call for an explanation as to the relation between stuff and things.

The rest of the entry has the following structure. Our target question, “what do nominal concrete mass expressions refer to?”, can also be understood colloquially as, “what are we talking about when we talk about stuff?” We will first look at the three main answers given in section 2. The first answer, by far the most popular (and consequently receiving the most attention), is that stuff-talk is talk about masses of particles or molecules. The second is that stuff-talk is talk about sets, and, lastly, that it is talk about many things (or ‘pluralities’). The views in section 2, in one way or another, hold that stuff is very thing-like or reducible to things.

In section 3. we will examine more radical views which say that the moral to draw from reflection upon concrete mass expressions, among other things, is that the world consists of stuff, not things; or stuff in addition to things, where the former is not thing-like.

2. Stuff as a Special Kind of Thing or Things

A natural thought to have about sentences with referring nominal concrete mass expressions (e.g., “Alvin drank the water that Roderick poured” or “The coffee in that cup is too hot”) is that the expressions refer to portions of matter, which are themselves made up of smaller bits of matter. It seems obvious that thinking this is what taking such sentences at face value amounts to. Not obvious, though, is what metaphysical commitments this requires, and what metaphysical problems might come along with this thought.

A general consensus has been reached that it is helpful to think through these issues about matter within the framework of mereology, or the logic of parts and wholes (although there is much disagreement about what the correct mereology is).

2.1 Some Terminology

Mereologies are formal systems, but we will be ignoring technicalities in this entry as far as possible (for details, see the entry on mereology). Still, some terminology is necessary and useful. Let us take the notion of part as primitive. A ‘simple’ is a non-composite entity, i.e., something with no parts. (Although, in an attenuated sense even a simple object has at least one part—itself. The everyday notion of ‘part’ implies that any part is smaller than the whole thing it is part of. Philosophers and logicians use the term of art ‘proper part’ to mean what the folk mean by ‘part’. We will follow ordinary usage, using ‘part’ to mean ‘proper part’).

A composite thing has more than one part. The verb fuse refers to an asymmetric relation between a whole and its parts. If two things fuse they ‘join together’ to make up a whole. For example, if the water in my glass and the water in your glass fuse, then there exists a thing, a fusion, which is made up of the two portions (sometimes it is said that the two portions ‘have a fusion’). No literal contact or fusion (e.g., welding two rods together) is implied by this usage. If a fleet is a single thing, then it is arguably a fusion of the boats making it up. The nouns whole and sum are synonymous with fusion and composite. Overlap occurs when distinct things share one or more parts.

It is also necessary to make the following distinctions, which are not standard. Any referring non-plural kind noun K (e.g., ‘gold’, ‘lobster’) will fall into one or more of the following categories. In these principles, ‘K’ is to be replaced by a concrete count or mass term:

  • K is an atomic kind iff if something is some K, then it is a K-atom, or it is identical with a fusion of K-atoms. And, something is a K-atom iff it is some K with no parts, or no parts which are K.
  • K is a non-atomic kind iff any K has (proper) parts which are K.
  • K is a fuzzy atomless kind iff any K has parts of which it is indeterminate whether they are K (i.e., there is no fact of the matter as to what counts as a smallest unit of K).
  • K is a heterogeneous kind iff any K has some parts which are K1Kn, where ‘K’, ‘K1’…Kn’ all refer to distinct kinds.

Electrons are atomic, since they have no parts which are electrons. Also, if ships have no parts which are ships, then ‘ship’ is an atomic kind term as well (Zimmerman 1995, p. 75; Sider 2001). Portions of non-atomic gunk or infinitely divisible matter of a kind K are K through-and-through, as would an infinitely descending chain of ‘box-particles’, each of which contains a box-particle (Gardner 1983, p. 26). Fruit cake is arguably a fuzzy atomless substance, since it can have parts (e.g., half a blueberry with some gluten attached) that are not determinately fruit cake. Some mass terms, e.g., ‘cutlery’ and ‘gold’ are heterogeneous. While a fork is some cutlery, a tine is not, and, presumably, an electron in a gold atom is not gold. Not all the categories are mutually exclusive.

2.2 Concrete Mass Expressions Refer to Mereological Sums

In the various sum-theoretical analyses of mass expressions (Cartwright 1965, 1979b; Burge 1977; Moravcsik 1973), all mass expressions with their non-count features disappear upon analysis and are replaced by talk of sums (the metaphysical significance of such replacement is discussed in 3.1).

These accounts can get quite technical, but the basic idea is relatively easy to understand. Concrete mass expressions refer to mereological sums. So, a sentence such as “Snow is white” is, for example, understood to mean that there is a sum of all the snow (flakes, bits, balls, etc.), and that this sum is part of the fusion of all the white things (Quine 1960, chapter 20). A sentence such as “The water is in the tub” gets cashed out to mean that there is a fusion of water molecules which is in the tub. While there are many permutations on this strategy, sum theorists will, whenever possible, paraphrase away talk of stuffs and talk instead of sums.

There are many possible positions for those who wish to analyze mass expressions in terms of sums. What follows is a short survey of some of the most salient decision points one must confront in constructing a detailed view of this kind, and what problems emerge from deciding one way or another.

2.2.1 Which Sums of Stuff Are There?

In the literature on material objects, an oft-discussed question is: when do two or more things compose a further thing (van Inwagen 1990)? Some common answers are—never (Compositional Nihilism—Unger 1979, Dorr and Rosen 2002); always (Mereological Universalism—Lewis 1986, pp. 212–213; Rea 1998); only when they form a life (Organicism—van Inwagen 1990; Merricks 2001); whenever the candidate fusion has non-redundant causal powers (Merricks 2001); whenever (and only whenever) we intuitively think they do (Intuitivism—Commonsense); or that composition is a brute fact (Brutalism—Markosian 1998b).

Perhaps the most commonly held view is Mereological Universalism, or ‘Unrestricted Mereology’ (‘UM’ for short). Two or more things always have a fusion. For example, the Empire State Building and the Dalai Lama compose an object.

The debates about composition largely focus on the fusion of objects—but what of matter? A strong case can be made for what we could call the Unrestricted Fusion of Matter principle:

If there is some matter and some distinct matter, then there is a sum of all of it. (cf. Markosian 2004, p. 410)

There are several ways to argue for this. Here’s one:

  1. For any two masses of stuff K, they compose a further mass of K. (Summativity)
  2. Matter is the most general material stuff kind.
  3. So, any two or more masses of matter whatsoever compose a mass of matter. (cf. Zimmerman 1995, section 5)

Summativity is a plausible principle. We believe that we refer when we say things like ‘the water in your glass’. Now, if you keep half of the water in your glass, and pour half in Larry’s, and Larry drives off with his glass, does the water still exist? Supposing, for simplicity, that none of the water is destroyed, the answer seems to be clearly ‘yes’.

Now, if this is so, and some water can exist while being spread out, why suppose that that very same water came into existence only when poured into your cup (from, say, two bottles)? It seems like it could come into existence when joined only if it went out of existence when scattered. But it didn’t go out of existence when scattered—so it couldn’t have come into existence when joined. So, there always was this water fusion (at least as long as all the sub-portions of water existed). We can repeat the same argument for the copper in those statues. There will also be the sum of the gold in Sweden and the lead in Tanzania, if we can replace the K in Summativity with ‘metal’.

And it also seems true that matter is a genuine kind term. If it wasn’t, it is hard to see how scientists could speak, as they do, about universal properties of matter, or what kinds of matter there are, or how philosophers could contrast matter with allegedly non-physical minds, abstract objects, and so forth. (There is also the ‘argument from vagueness’ from Ted Sider, which was inspired by the Lewisian idea that any restriction on composition would entail indeterminacy in what exists, which is impossible. In addition, any restriction on composition would be unacceptably arbitrary and anthropocentric) (Lewis 1986, pp. 212–213; Sider 2001, chapter 4).

So, it seems that any two portions of matter whatsoever have a fusion. Accepting this result leads to acceptance of ‘mere sums,’ i.e.,

  • ‘Mere sum’: A composite object whose only persistence condition is the persistence of all of the same ultimate parts (or the persistence of all the fundamental stuff which makes it up). A mere sum’s parts need not be cohesive, spatially close, or exhibit any kind of functional unity, and the sum need not be solid, macroscopic, or fall under any commonsense or scientific kind term (see Casati 2005, pp. 573–574, and Spelke 1990 for a contrast class). Even if it does have these qualities they are accidental to its existence. Furthermore, any arbitrary portions of matter x, y… will make up a mere sum.

It has proven extremely tempting to identify matter with mere sums in the mereologist’s sense, for the reasons just outlined.

Of course, if sums are object-like, and one has reason to believe that the only objects are structured ones, then one would have reason to reject Summativity and UFM which lead to the posit of unstructured mere sums. Arguments against these principles can be found in sections 2.4 and 3.2 (see also Laycock 1972, pp. 4–5; 2006, Appendix III).

2.2.2 Can Sums Change Their Parts?

Another crucial decision point in developing a sum theory of the referents of mass expressions is deciding whether the elements in the sum (e.g., the H2O molecules in some water, the gold atoms in some gold) are essential to the sum. The case of the most general kind, masses of matter, is a particularly important instance of this question.

It seems intuitively obvious that when one takes a sip of water, or adds a bit of water to a glass of water, that one does not have in the glass precisely the same water both before and after. Even if the same amount of water from a different batch replaces the water which was taken away, we still would not have the same water after the replacement. And, if we perform electrolysis on a batch of water but preserve any matter from being lost we can rightly say we have all the same matter as we did before, just not the same water (since there is no water). We can construct similar examples for any type of matter. What can explain and unify these obvious intuitions is that there is a most general category of entity—masses of matter, where all the fundamental parts of any mass are essential to it. Such masses of matter cannot change parts whatsoever.

The existence of entities like this could easily explain why there is not precisely the same water through these changes. An unqualified view of this kind would be that nothing whatsoever can change parts—this is called ‘Mereological Essentialism.’ More restricted views hold that at the very least masses of matter cannot change parts. Mereological essentialism has been an extremely popular approach throughout history. (Abelard, Reid, Bishop Butler, Locke, Hume, and Leibniz were all mereological essentialists of some kind.)

There is much to say in favor of the following principle of Mereological Essentialism for Masses of Matter in general (for early discussion of Mereological Essentialism, see Chisholm 1973, 1975; Plantinga 1975):

For any mass of matter M and any mass of matter x, if x is ever a part of M, M will exist only when x exists and is a part of M.

We can argue for a principle like this by first stating that masses of matter at a time are individuated by having the same parts, and then arguing that no mass can change parts over time.

Our more restricted ‘Mereological Essentialism for Masses’ (MEM) seems prima facie consistent with allowing ordinary objects to change parts. MEM seems less controversial than ‘Mereological Essentialism for Objects’ (MEO). MEM seems like something of a truism, and perhaps part of the nature of the category of matter. But let us turn to an argument for MEM.

At a time, it is easy to distinguish and identify masses. It is trivial that if x is identical to y at a time, then x and y would have all the same parts, whether or not x and y are sums. This follows straightforwardly from Leibniz’s Law. Since no sum of matter can have different parts from itself at a time, then x and y can only be identical sums if they have all the same parts.

One can make a further case that sums’ parts are essential to them over time. Suppose that simples 1–9 exist at t1. Assuming UFM, then 1–9 fuse to give us the sum S. At t1, also by UFM, there is the fusion of 1–8, which we can call S−. S− ≠ S, since they have different parts (by Leibniz’s Law). If a sum could lose a part and persist, then it could be possible for the fusion S to come to be made up of different parts. Suppose that only part 9 is destroyed. If MEM is false, then S could come to be composed of exactly what S− is. So, if MEM is false, either (i) S became S−, (ii) S− went out of existence, or (iii) S and S− coincide as distinct sums. But, (i) cannot be true: two things cannot become one (although this has been challenged, see Gallois 1998); (ii) cannot be true—how can a mere mass of matter go out of existence without undergoing any intrinsic change? (for challenges to this see Markosian 1998a and 2004); (iii) violates a very clear intuition—if you have some stuff, and take some of it away, then you do not have the very same stuff. So (iii) is false. But then all of (i)–(iii) are false. And so MEM is true. (For another challenge to an argument like the foregoing, see van Inwagen 2009.)

So, if there can be mere sums, and UFM is true, then we ought to believe in mereological essentialism for masses of matter, even if we do not accept MEO. (Arguments against MEM can be found in the supplement Challenges to Mereological Essentialism for Masses and arguments against UFM in section 3.2.)

2.2.3 How do Sums of Stuff Relate to Ordinary Objects?

Of course, if ordinary objects can change parts, but sums can not, then it seems that ordinary objects are not mereological sums. But then, what are they, and how do they relate to the sums which obviously seem to constitute them?

If one is serious about the existence of sums of matter, it seems there are only a few ways they could relate to ordinary objects. (The story is more complicated than this. See the entry on material constitution for more details. We are focusing on issues in material constitution especially salient for those who take stuff seriously and hold identity to be absolute.) One way is to say that sums constitute ordinary objects by coinciding with them. That is, sums are distinct objects which share all of their parts with the commonsense objects they make up. One could also eliminate ordinary objects. Ordinary objects either do not exist, or exist in some kind of shadowy or derivative sense (think of ‘the average man’). Another way is to say that while sums are in fact things or objects, ordinary objects are a different kind of entity. These dual-category views hold that commonsense objects are in a different ontological category than sums.

Those who wish to explore in more detail the metaphysics of masses, objects, and their relations, can read the supplement on Sums and Ordinary Objects.

2.2.4 Are Sums of Stuff Non-Atomic?

Godehard Link and Harry Bunt have argued that the best models of natural language use of mass expressions will distinguish mass entities from count by treating the former as if they are non-atomic, whether or not they actually are. Godehard Link (1998) argues that the reference of mass expressions is best understood via the development of a rich model-theoretic semantics, which algebraically models the interrelated network of talk of mass, plural, and particular entities. Harry Bunt (1985) subsumes both set theory and mereology into an axiomatic system called “Ensemble Theory” in order to model the structure of talk about mass expressions. Link’s account in particular embraces coincidence on a massive scale.

Since Link and Bunt’s views are put forward in a relatively metaphysically neutral way, we will relegate more information about these views to an appendix. But, if the modeling they propose handles the linguistic data better than other views then that will give further support to a theory which embraces both coincidence and infinite divisibility. Hence these treatments are ontologically relevant. Examining Link’s theory in some detail can show us just how far distinguishing mass- and count- via the atomic/non-atomic distinction can take us, and what it can’t do for us. See the supplement Non-Atomicity and the Mass/Count Distinction

2.3 Concrete Mass Expressions Refer to Sets

A slightly less popular way to answer our question is to treat mass expressions as referring to sets. For instance, suppose there’s some wine on the floor. Roughly, according to the masses-as-sets theorist, this is equivalent to there being a set of wine bits (whatever they are) on the floor. If Nancy’s ring is gold, then there is a set of gold molecules which compose or constitute the ring. If ‘the gold’ is identified with a set, then some problems faced by the mereologists are avoided. While a mereologist who is committed to the existence of the mass of gold is under pressure to deny the existence of the ring if she wants to avoid coincidence, the masses-as-sets theorist has a great advantage in that she can say that both the ring and gold exist but are not coinciding material things, since the gold, unlike the ring, is a set and not an object.

The masses-as-sets theorist reduces mass expressions to count expressions, by treating concrete mass expressions (e.g., ‘the gold’) as veiled count-expressions (e.g., ‘the set of gold atoms’).

One stark problem for the masses-as-sets view (henceforth we will identify a proponent of this view as a ‘set theorist’), is that it identifies paradigmatically concrete stuffs with what are usually regarded as paradigmatically abstract objects—sets. How could some gold be a set? Suppose we can pick out a definite portion of gold which makes up a ring. If sets are abstract, then the set theorist must say that the gold is abstract. This is pretty hard to swallow. Abstract things are not in time or space, but gold is. Also, sets are not identical to their members. But the gold in the ring does seem identical to the members of the set of gold atoms, not the set itself (for issues regarding ‘many-one identity’, see Baxter 1988 and Wallace forthcoming).

Perhaps the set theorist can instead maintain that masses are sets, but deny that sets (or at least sets of bits of matter) are abstract. Perhaps sets of physical objects (such as gold atoms) can be said to be in space in virtue of their members being in space. The gold, construed as a set of gold atoms, can be said to weigh ten ounces in virtue of its members collectively weighing ten ounces. Massy sets have their physical properties ‘by proxy’. So, some gold (a set) has a spatial location in virtue of where its members are, has a weight in virtue of its members’ weight, and so on (Zimmerman 1995, sections 3 and 9).

But, when we try to unpack exactly in which sense the set of gold atoms is non-abstract, we can see that it is hard to distinguish the masses-as-sets view from the plurals approach which we will examine below. The non-abstract set theorist will hold that a set of gold atoms can in fact have physical properties, in virtue of the properties of its members. So, a non-abstract set theorist would first paraphrase “the gold weighs ten ounces” into “that set of gold atoms weighs ten ounces.” But, in order to explain how a set weighs ten ounces, they would have to again paraphrase and analyze the latter as something like “the set’s members collectively weigh ten ounces.” But if the set theorist has to paraphrase their paraphrase, then there is considerable pressure for the set theorist to instead switch over to the stuff-as-plurals view (section 2.4) and just talk directly about the members. If we are just talking about the members, or the gold atoms, and we can say what we want about many things without talking about the set of those many things, then why complicate matters by introducing sets?

There are some problems for the set-theoretic paraphrase. Suppose one truly says “the melted sugar here is the same sugar that was in the packet.” If ‘sugar’ in this context referred to the various lumps and grains of sugar in a packet, then, if there are no more lumps or grains after the melting, then the set-equality, and hence the identity-claim, comes out false. As Pelletier points out, when we identify some stuff, there are many different individuating standards available (e.g., ‘packets of__’, ‘bottles of ____’, ‘granules of___’), and different divisions will yield different sets (1974, p. 94). This ends up either under-determining which identities hold, or, absurdly, entailing that some stuff is distinct from itself.

In addition, as Zimmerman points out, the set theorist assumes that matter is atomic (1995, section 9), yet it seems possible that there is gunky non-atomic stuff (Zimmerman 1996b; Sider 1993). If there are, or could be, stuffs like this, then standard set-theoretic treatments will not work, since such theories require all sets to be well-founded. Another problem is that for some stuffs it is (or seems to be) indeterminate what, if anything, will count as a smallest unit of it—e.g., minestrone soup or beer. So, the set theorist has a problem with non-atomic or fuzzy atomless stuffs (see 2.1 for terminology). In what immediately follows, we will only discuss the issue of non-atomicity.

Suppose there is a cube of completely homogenous and gunky jello on the table, with no empty space inside. Suppose that the cube can’t survive being sliced or having its parts scattered. Suppose that the jello composing the cube is a fundamental stuff-kind. On the set-theoretic proposal, to say that the jello constitutes the cube is to say that a set of jello-individuals constitutes the cube. Which individuals? One non-option is the set {cube}, for then the jello would be identical with the cube, and could not undergo any changes which the cube could not. So, the set must include at least two jello individuals. Suppose that the set’s members are the left and right halves of the jello—call them ‘Lefty’ and ‘Righty’. So, saying that the jello constitutes the cube is to say that {Lefty, Righty} constitute the cube. But, of course, there is also the set of Lefty’s left half, right half, and Righty’s left and right halves. This set, {Lefty’s left half, Lefty’s right half, Righty’s left half, Righty’s right half}, is a better candidate to identify with the jello stuff, since it will survive if cut into four pieces the right way, whereas {Lefty, Righty} will not. We want to pick out the set of jello-individuals which can survive any kind of scattering. But, the problem, of course, is that Lefty’s left half is composed of Lefty’s left half’s left half, and so on. Since the postulation of gunk rules out employing a set of point-particles, there appears to be no set of jello-individuals that we can identify the jello stuff with which can serve to pick out all the jello stuff and account for the persistence conditions of the stuff (=set) in the right way. So, there is absolutely nothing which is the set of individuals which make up the cube. If we wish to identify the jello stuff with every set that is some of it, since the members of every set are themselves composed of further sets, then it is sets ‘all the way down’, where we never arrive at members which are not composed of further members of sets of stuff. Dean Zimmerman notes,

The mere thought of these “non-well-founded” sets is enough to induce vertigo. How could something as concrete and physical as a mass of matter be made of nothing but sets of sets of sets…ad infinitum? (1995, p. 99, italics his)

For masses of stuff composed of simples, however, the procedure is relatively simple—“whenever you have a larger mass compounded out of smaller masses of the same kind, identify the larger mass with a set of these smaller masses.” There is no way to do this with gunky masses, since, for any arbitrarily chosen constituting individual, it itself is a constituted object that needs to have the same treatment applied to it.

The set-theoretical interpretation has many difficulties, and few champions. But, this should not be regarded as the last word on the subject. There are non-well-founded set theories, which could perhaps get around the foregoing difficulties.

2.4 Concrete Mass Expressions Refer to Many Things, Not One Thing: Pluralities and Plural Reference

We do not only speak of individual things, we speak of many things. Sentences such as “The cheerleaders formed a human pyramid,” or “Those dogs are sick” are examples of plural predication, quantification, and reference. Some hold that some plural referring expressions are irreducible to singular predication, quantification, and reference (Boolos 1984; McKay 2005; Yi 2005). According to standard logic, “some things are F” is true only if each of those things is F. But, as McKay and others point out, “The students surrounded the building” could be true even though it is false to say of Bob (one of the students) that he surrounded the building (McKay 2005, chapter 1). Those in favor of plural logic argue that we need not countenance sums or sets to account for plural logic, rather, we can take such sentences at face value. Those tigers may be distinct from those lions, but this doesn’t require ‘the tigers’ to refer to a collection, sum, or particular thing of any stripe.

Some ‘pluralists’, as we may call those who analyze mass expressions in terms of plural expressions, hold that mass terms are used, generally, to refer to many things at once (Nicolas 2002). ‘Gold’, on most occasions of use, does not refer to a thing—it refers to many things.

According to an early account (Laycock 1975) statements such as “the water is boiling” or “Bob took out that trash” mean “those water molecules are boiling” and “Bob took out those pieces of trash.” The idea (also developed more fully later by Nicolas 2008, who, in turn, was inspired by Gillon 1992) that mass expressions are used to refer to several things at once seems especially promising for concrete quasi-mass nouns such as silverware and furniture, whose reference is particular pieces of silverware or furniture. Concrete mass nouns such as beer will be paraphrased as referring, depending on context, to bottles, drops, glasses, gallons, or quantities (in Cartwright’s 1979b sense) of beer.

Pluralists about mass expressions differ most markedly from sum and set theorists as follows. The set theorist would take ‘the water in Merrihew’s cup’ to refer to the set of water molecules in his cup, and the sum theorist would take it to refer to a fusion. These are both particular entities. But, for the Pluralist, the water is not a particular thing—it is many things. For example, the account that Nicolas recommends

associates to a mass noun [M], not a set of things, but some things, each of which is M…the denotation of the expression the gold on the table, the as, comprises any things that are gold on the table. (2008, 22)

Many claim that plural logic, reference, predication, and quantification is ontologically innocent. That is, we are not committing ourselves the existence of new entities by employing plurals, even if we believe that some usage featuring plural reference is irreducible. Being committed to the existence of ‘those cats’ (while adverting to Mr. Furrikens, Chairman Meow, and Magnificat) is not an additional commitment over and above the commitment to Mr. Furrikens, Chairman Meow, and Magnificat. When one pays for this apple, and that apple, one gets ‘the apples’ for free. (In this respect the ontologically innocent Pluralist has a leg up over the set and sums theorists, since the former posits no novel entities.)

In some of his early work Laycock makes arguments by analogy to support the proposal that mass expressions are veiled plural expressions, so that water, in its analysis, gets treated like apples or Hobbits does. We turn to the analogies.

Both mass and plural terms refer cumulatively. Just as any two portions of water considered together are water, so these apples and those apples together are apples.

Also, Hobbits, just like water, resists pluralization. For the former, this is because Hobbits is already plural: ‘Hobbitses’ does not make sense. Water cannot be pluralized and retain its standard reference, since ‘waters’ either means kinds of water, or different bodies of water (e.g., lakes, rivers, pools, seas, rather than numerous water per se, which doesn’t make sense unless used in a technical or stipulative way). One way to explain this is to suppose that water is already plural.

Both Hobbits and water do not take the indefinite article. Neither ‘a water’ (when not understood in the kind sense or with an implicit partitioning e.g., ‘bottle of’) nor ‘a Hobbits’ are grammatical. Both mass and plural expressions take the definite article since ‘the’ “does not discriminate between singular and plural” (Laycock 2006, p. 35). Both Hobbits and water take the non-singular analogue of the indefinite article—‘some’. Some Hobbits and some water can both surround a castle, and neither use implies singularity.

Both mass and plural terms can be prefaced by partitioning and measurement terms. One could buy seven pounds of applesauce, or seven pounds of apples. One could sell a jar of applesauce, or a box of apples, a gallon of marbles, or a gallon of milk.

But, even given the aforementioned similarities, there are significant differences between mass and plural terms. While one can infer from “There are peppercorns in the sauce” that there is at least one peppercorn in the sauce, one cannot infer from “There is wine in the sauce” that there is at least one (non-kind usage) wine in the sauce. Furthermore, every plural term (except for plural invariable terms such as ‘cattle’ and ‘groceries’) e.g., ‘cats’, is correlated with a singular cognate, e.g., ‘cat’. But there are no singular cognates for mass terms e.g., ‘water’ or ‘silverware’

There is much to say for the pluralist position. Plural logic is becoming better understood, less controversial, and a case can be made that standard first-order logic will be subsumed under, or merged with, plural logic (for discussion of these issues, see the entry on plural quantification). If this is so, and mass expressions are plural expressions, then mass expressions can be accounted for in a relatively well understood and uncontroversial logic which accounts for a wider range of commonsense inferences than standard logic does.

The pluralist account is quite plausible when we consider atomic mass expressions, or mass expressions with atomic denotata (def. ‘atomic’ in 2.1) such as ‘silverware’, ‘furniture’, and ‘water’. It will become easy to cash out the truth conditions of such talk in terms of the atomic units, such as pieces of silverware, furniture, and H2O molecules (Nicolas 2008).

Also in favor of the account is that it does at least as good a job as the set-theoretical view since it explains the relationship between a thing and its constituting matter in a similar way, yet posits no novel entities like sets. There are just the many bits, and the constituted object of which they are parts. This point has been stated forcefully by Laycock (1972) and Burke (1997), yet these accounts have the worrying feature of not being truly reductive. See section 3.2 for an ‘ontologically serious’ view of pluralities.

Many of the problems which beset the set theorist confront the Pluralists as well. What about fuzzy atomless or gunky stuff? If talk of stuff is to be paraphrased in terms of plural reference, what are the individuals slotted for this role? With atomic stuffs, it is clear. But with ‘fruitcake’ and ‘taco sauce’ it is not. Why suppose there is a fact of the matter as to what counts as stuffs of these kinds? And if there is no fact of the matter then what are the individuals we are speaking of when we speak of fruitcake? And our Pluralist has just as much trouble chopping up the Jello cube as the Set Theorist (see section 2.3).

Of course, vagueness and indeterminacy are problems for most theories of masses, so it could be unfair to overstress this point, and it is not at all clear that the pluralist can’t augment her account with standard logics of vagueness or employ analogues to set-theoretic non-well-foundedness moves. Given the many salutary components of plural logic in relation to mass expressions, this remains a promising area of inquiry.

3. Stuff as Distinct From Things

The first three approaches to the referents of concrete mass expressions are all relatively conservative. All three are compatible with what one might call ‘Thing Theory’. In this section we will examine views which posit non-thing-like stuff in addition to things, or eliminate things altogether.

3.1 Thing Ontologies vs. Stuff Ontologies

The relatively orthodox view vis-a-vis things and stuff in contemporary analytic metaphysics is what we could call ’Thing Theory.’ Thing Theory, very roughly, is the view that (excluding properties and relations) all concrete existents, are either things fundamentally, or reducible to fundamental things.

What things, individuals, or objects are is itself a controversial and murky matter, and goes beyond the purview of this article (for more, see these related entries: object, sortals, substance). Related terms in philosophy for ‘thing’ are substance, primary substance, particular, existent, being, entity, and so on. For the purposes of this entry, we will take a rather minimalistic view of thinghood. We will regard a thing or object as whatever satisfies this definition:

(Thinghood) x is a thing or object if and only if:
  1. x falls under some F, and F is singular. [Furthermore, the plural “the Fs” is well-formed and does not refer to kinds (e.g., in ‘the wines of France’).]
  2. x can be unqualifiedly counted as one. [i.e., x can take ‘one’ as an unqualified numerical determiner, without recourse to measurement, ‘packaging’, or partitive phrases (e.g., ‘one dog’, versus ‘one gallon of water’ or ‘one water molecule’).] (See Laycock 2006, chapter 2)
  3. x is concrete (i.e., x is not a universal, property, relation, or abstract entity).

And now, using the notion of Thinghood, a minimalist Thing Theory can be captured as follows:

Whatever exists (or could exist) and is concrete is a thing (or is reducible to a thing or things).

Thing theorists hold that whatever exists is unqualifiedly countable as one, or reducible to such things. For the Thing Theorist “to be is to be countable.” Some Stuff Ontologists would counter—“to be is to be either countable or measurable” (a gloss on Burge 1975, p. 459).

All three views in section 2 can maintain that, fundamentally, everything boils down to things. Sums, it is usually held, are always sums of things, and these sums are themselves things, and can even be counted. (If there are n simple things, then there are 2n − 1 sums). Masses-as-sets can always be held to be sets of things, and plural reference can always be held to be reference to a number of things.

We can view ‘Stuff Ontologies’ as views which, in some sense, depart from this picture and ‘take stuff seriously’. That is, a Stuff Ontology is any view which departs from Thing Theory in important respects so as to allow non-thing-like stuff to be part of the fundamental furniture of the world. Thing Theorists believe that stuff-talk modeled on mass term use has no proper place in the fundamental correct description of the world.

Stuff Ontologists can either (i) eliminate things, or, (ii) accept that there are things, but hold that they are merely derivative entities which are parasitic on the fundamental stuff of the world.

Thing Theory can be enriched with various supplemental hypotheses to generate a more informative theory. Sum theorists believe in the existence of mere sums (defined in 2.2.1) and hold that sums are things. If sets of physical things are physical (at least in a derivative sense by having their physical properties by proxy), then the masses-as-sets theorist can count as a Thing Theorist as well. The Plural Theorist of the ontologically innocent stripe, who need admit neither sums nor sets (at least for the purposes of mass reference), does not have any entities which are not things or reducible to things.

We will now examine two views, one which states that there are entities which are not things (3.2), and another which states that there are no things in addition to stuff (3.3).

3.2 Serious Pluralities

Some have taken a view of pluralities which is not ontologically innocent. Henry Laycock and Michael Burke, at times, have tentatively favored the notion that there is a novel ontic category of plural entities which are not individual items of quantification.

What is the difference between the ontologically innocent and ontologically serious pluralists, and what is the case for the serious position? The serious pluralist can have several motivations. Laycock (1972) argues that there is definite reference of mass expressions, such as ‘that water’, ‘the water in the tub’, but that this reference is not singular reference. ‘This water’, on a demonstrative occasion, refers, but, “my contention is that this water, unlike this or that drop, is not a particular object” (1972, p. 4). Laycock claims that “we can and do think of stuff as having an independent reality [from things]” (1972, p. 27, italics his). While saying “that there is gold in a certain region is certainly to assert the existence of something” (1972, p. 28), he does deny that this ‘something’ is particular, and, throughout his work, denies that it is a set or a fusion. What definite singular terms like ‘the gold in the…’ “designate is a quite distinct type of item, concrete but not particular” (1972, p. 28).

If one really believes that i) there is water, ii) we make definite reference to it, iii) water is not a thing (i.e., not a sum or set), and iv) plural quantification and predication is irreducible to singular quantification and predication, then one might feel compelled to accept that mass expressions like water and gold refer to genuine entities distinct from (or ‘over and above’) the water and gold molecules. Let us call whatever it is that is referred to with definite reference by mass expressions in this way ‘pluralities’ (Laycock and Burke do not use the phrase, and Laycock would probably find it at best infelicitous, and at worst a grave source of metaphysical error).

Belief in irreducible pluralities gets more traction when combined with a denial of unrestricted mereology, which is just what Laycock does:

The posit of a physical object without a physical unity—the posit of a ‘formless’ or ‘structureless’ concrete plurality, an arbitrary physical unit upon which there are no physical or spatio-temporal constraints—is no mere curiosity: it would seem to be a kind of incoherence…the concept of an object is the concept of a unit or a unity…A physical object with all the physical unity of a set of physical objects, for example {Caesar’s nose, the Eiffel Tower, the Andromeda galaxy}—a physical object in short lacking physical or spatio-temporal unity—is no physical object at all. (2006, p. 95)

If one accepts (i)–(iv), and has reason to reject both UFM (see 2.2.1) and the set-theoretical view, and one wants commonsense sentences featuring mass expressions to come out true, then what is left to be referred to by nominal statements about water, lead, etc. except pluralities?

Another motivation can be found in Burke (1997), inspired by Laycock. Burke was concerned to resolve the coincidence puzzle between not only a thing and it’s constituting piece of matter, but between these things and the matter per se. (Since some copper can persist past the shattering of a piece of copper which constitutes a statue, then presumably the copper is distinct from either). Burke’s account, all the details of which do not concern us here (see the entry on material constitution and the supplement Sums and Ordinary Objects for details) requires that the statue and piece of copper be identical. If this is so, and the statue comes into existence, and is identical with its constituting piece, then a new piece must come into existence and the old one cease to be. One of the options Burke canvasses to explain why it is that we (mistakenly) assume the piece continues in existence is because the copper persists through the change:

Of course, this explanation concedes that the statue…shares its place with something, namely, the copper. So am I not allowing coinciding objects after all? No, I am not, since I deny that the copper is a single object. Following Laycock (1972) , I claim that the copper is a plurality. It is many objects… The case of the statue and the copper is not a case of coinciding objects because it is not a case in which one object occupies the same place as any one other. (1997, p. 12, italics his)

Burke denies the identification of the many copper bits and the piece of copper:

Well, I hold that each of the many is a part of the one, but I deny that the many parts collectively are identical with the one…Trivially, the many are many. But it is not individually that they are many. (They are one each.) So the many collectively are many. But ‘many’ and ‘one’ are contrary. So the many collectively are not one. But, again trivially, the one is one. So it is false that the many collectively are identical with the one. (1997, p. 13)

It is doubtful, though, that postulating pluralities which are not things can solve the coincidence puzzles. Burke, who himself brought up a similar objection to coincidence in general, faces the following problem. How are distinct entities, such as the statue and the copper, different in sort, given that they both have the same intrinsic properties? There seems to be a one to one correspondence between the features of the statue and those of the copper. Why isn’t the copper a statue, for the same reasons the piece of copper is? Burke can insist that the main difference is that the statue/piece is one thing, whereas the copper is many things, but it is not clear why withholding the honorific thing from ‘the’ copper plurality solves the problem (Zimmerman 1997, p. 23).

It is unclear what the addition of the attribution of ‘concrete non-particulars’ to the plural analysis is doing, and doubtful that it clarifies matters. Indeed it seems to somewhat back away from the plural analysis. The initial reason for analyzing concrete mass expressions in terms of plural quantification and predication is that talk about ‘the lions’ and ‘those Hobbits’ is relatively unproblematic. But then, why reduce mass expressions to plural reference if one holds that water or a water plurality is something over and above those water molecules, yet denies that the lion plurality is something over and above those lions? It’s not clear why both water and lions get a plural reference treatment, yet the referents of mass expressions get to retain some kind of ontological halo which distinguishes their referents from non-mass plural expressions. Laycock (2006) no longer holds (and only tentatively held) that mass expressions are plural.

3.3 World-Stuff

Some stuff ontologists eliminate concrete things altogether. There is only stuff, objects being accidental phases of objectively non-objectual stuff. Alternatively, concepts are thought of as ‘cookie-cutters’, which conventionally carve pseudo-objects out of the amorphous world-blob, which itself contains no objects (cf. Dummet 1981, chap 16; Horgan and Potrč 2000).

Alan Sidelle, in various places (1989, 1991, 1998) argues that while stuff exists, there are no things which exist and actually have the essences we believe they do. In 1998 he argues that we should regard the unraveling of a sweater or the chopping down of a tree as not substantial changes, in which things cease to be, but accidental changes in underlying, persisting stuff:

the intuitive [claim] we are here considering amounts to the claim that while there are trees, sweaters, and other ordinary objects, our ordinary substance terms are not, in fact, substance terms, but pick out these objects according to accidental properties…Being a tree, or a sweater, is an accidental property of something more basic.

What is more basic? Stuff. Supposed substantial change in objects is actually accidental change to some stuff. Sidelle diagnoses the phenomenon of coincidence as a species of the problem of individuation:

Whether there is coincidence is fundamentally the question of whether there can be more than one criterion of identity instantiated at a given location, that is, whether, for any location taken to contain an object, the various seemingly possible criteria of identity can all be ruled out as false, save one. (1998, p. 441)

He claims that the problem of coincident entities arises not due to the diversity of individuals in a region, but rather due to the fact that the world as it is under-determines which principles of individuation are the correct ones to employ. We can treat any property as accidental or as essential by employing different sortals, or nominal essences, to describe a thing. When a cow dies, we can describe this either as the accidental change in some flesh-and-bones, or the substantial change in a cow which is no more. Sidelle concludes, in a Lockean vein, that which changes we conceive of as substantial and which as accidental is more a function of us and our interests than of the way things really are (1998, p. 439).

Sidelle goes on to note that our problems with things come about from supposing that there are any. That is, these problems arise because of our concept of an object.

It is objects which have made the problem, and the solution isn’t to switch which objects we allow, but to disallow objects altogether. (1998, p. 441)

Sidelle recommends, tentatively, that we describe the world without quantification over things, and deny that “there is genuine, world-given individuation.” Furthermore, as it is supposedly obvious that there is at least stuff, we should suppose so, and theoretically regard the role of the ‘world-stuff’ as “the mind-independent matter of the world which, among other things, determines our perceptions” (1998, p. 443).

One problem for this view is that it is virtually indistinguishable from a Quinean view according to which a physical object is just “the content, however heterogeneous, of some portion of space-time, however disconnected and gerrymandered” (Quine 1960, p. 171). Our sortals, according to a type of Quinean, are used to pick out definite filled portions, and any and all of these are objects. What Sidelle calls ‘stuff’ Quine (or Jubien in 1993) is happy to call an ‘object’. If Sidelle’s stuff talk is inter-translatable into Quinean thing-talk then there is merely a terminological difference between the posit of World-Stuff and the posit of arbitrary things.

A further strange point about this view is that it entails that, just as there are no objects which have the persistence conditions that we think, there are no non-fundamental stuffs. The very same arguments given for rejecting ordinary objects and reducing them to world stuff can be given for water molecules and sodium chloride. Electrolysis can be seen not as the destruction of water but as a change in persisting underlying stuff. This can be carried on until we get to the fundamental stuff(s). Hydrogen can be seen as a phase of a proton and an electron, and a proton can be seen as a phase of quarks and gluons. So, it seems that elements and complexes, since they are not the fundamental or non-individuated world-stuff, must also be the result of conceptual carvings.

What about fundamental particles (assuming there are some)? They’ve got to go as well, if we assume they are objects. If there are in fact gluons and electrons which exist, are objects, and are particular things with identity and persistence conditions, then, if they are in fact simple they form the basis out of which we could construct the other objects. So, if non-individual world stuff is going to play a role, it seems that we must eliminate fundamental particles as well. This approach allows too much physics to be done from the armchair.

It must be noted, though, that such a World-Stuff view is similar to some interpretations of elementary particle physics and quantum theory. Some scientists and philosophers of science do in fact argue that at bottom the world is not a world of things. Rather, the basic stuff is non-particular ‘quantum foam’, or mass-energy, fields, or structures. Some argue that the only real entity is the space-time fabric, ordinary objects just being temporary warpings or disturbances in it. On such views both ordinary macroscopic objects and putative fundamental particles are only epiphenomenal entities or temporary manifestations in the electromagnetic or gravitational fields, which are fundamentally non-individual—some kind of world stuff (for details, see the entry identity and individuality in quantum theory). So, one should not rule out such views tout court. But, given the flux and opacity of such views, one should not quickly and whole-heartedly embrace the notion of a fundamental non-particular stuff either. These views merit further examination.

Mass expressions and their relations to count expressions, and how they are interpreted and employed by metaphysicians, offer us an interesting and voluminous case-study of recent metaphysics informed by lexical and syntactic considerations. The careful student of this material can take away many cautionary tales and useful tools. This is a very difficult and woolly area of inquiry where there is almost no consensus—not even consensus about the basics. But there is some interesting empirical work on mass and count expressions being done which is shedding some new light on these issues (see Casati 2005 for details), and there has been an explosion of recent work in linguistics (see the bibliographies from Link 1998, and the Pelletier and Schubert classic paper on the subject linked in the Other Internet Resources). Hopefully, philosophers can work together with linguists, computer scientists, cognitive scientists, and others to help achieve some kind of breakthrough.

The category of ‘Stuff’ seems to be where the category ‘Event’ was thirty or so years ago. It is an important ontological category which remains poorly understood. In the absence of consensus on the referents of mass expressions, controversy about stuff is bound to continue.


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Other Internet Resources


Many people gave me extremely valuable feedback for this entry, or for material which preceded it. I would like to thank David Barnett, Henry Laycock, David Liebesman, Jim McCollum, Thomas McKay, David Nicolas, Jeff Pelletier, Joe Salerno, Adam Sennet, Irem Kurtsal Steen, Jim Stone, and especially Dean Zimmerman. The latter gave me an extraordinary amount of useful feedback and recommendations. I would also like to thank the editors of The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for their patience. I would like to thank Boğaziçi University Scientific Research Fund for supporting my research for this work (Grant Number: 6668-12B02P1).

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