## Some Prominent Approaches to the Representation of Uncertain Inference

The following figure indicates a relationship among six of the most prominent approaches to uncertain inference. The arrows point from more general to less general representation schemes. For example, the Dempster-Shafer representation contains the probability functions as a special case.

Representations of Uncertainty

These representations are often described as measures on events, or states, or propositions, or sets of possibilities. But deductive logics are usually described in terms of statements or sentences of a language. So let’s follow suit throughout this discussion.

Plausibility relations (Friedman & Halpern 1995) constitute the most general of these representations. They satisfy the weakest axioms, the weakest constraints on the logic of uncertainty. For a plausibility relation $$\succcurlyeq$$ between sentences, an expression ‘$$A \succcurlyeq B$$’, says that A is at least as plausible as B. The axioms for plausibility relations say that tautologies are more plausible than contradictions, any two logically equivalent sentences are plausibility-related to other sentence in precisely the same way, a sentence is no more plausible than the sentences it logically entails, and the at least as plausible relation is transitive. These axioms make plausibility relations weak partial orders on the relative plausibility of sentences. They permits some sentences to be incomparable with respect to plausibility—neither more plausible, nor less plausible, nor equally plausible to one another.

Qualitative probability relations are plausibility relations for which three additional axioms are satisfied. One of these additional axioms says that when a sentence S is logically incompatible with both sentence A and sentence B, then $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ holds just in case $$(A \textrm{ or } S) \succcurlyeq(B \textrm{ or } S)$$ holds as well. Now, suppose that a qualitative probability relations are on a language satisfy one additional (two-part) axiom, they can be shown to be representable by probability functions—i.e., given any qualitative probability relation $$\succcurlyeq$$, there is a unique probability function P such that $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ just in case $$P[A] \ge P[B]$$. So quantitative probability may be viewed as essentially just a way of placing a numerical measure on sentences that uniquely emulates the is at least as plausible relation specified by qualitative probability (see Koopman 1940; Savage 1954; Hawthorne & Bovens 1999; Hawthorne 2009).

Probability (i.e., quantitative probability) is a measure of plausibility that assigns a number between 0 and 1 to each sentence. Intuitively, the probability of a sentence S, $$P[S] = r$$, says that S is plausible to degree r, or that the rational degree of confidence (or belief) that S is true is r. The axioms for probabilities basically require two things. First, tautologies get probability 1. Second, when A and B contradict each other, the probability of the disjunction $$(A \textrm{ or } B)$$ must be the sum of the probabilities of A and of B individually. It is primarily in regard to this second axiom that probability differs from each of the other quantitative measures of uncertainty.

Like probability, Dempster-Shafer belief functions (Shafer 1976, 1990) measure appropriate belief strengths on a scale between 0 and 1, with contradictions and tautologies at the respective extremes. But whereas the probability of a disjunction of incompatible claims must equal the sum of the parts, Dempster-Shafer belief functions only require such disjunctions be believed at least as strongly as the sum of the belief strengths of the parts. So these functions are a generalization of probability. By simply tightening up the Dempster-Shafer axiom about how disjunctions are related to their parts we get back a restricted class of Dempster-Shafer functions that just is the class of probability functions. Dempster-Shafer functions are primarily employed as a logic of evidential support for hypotheses. In that realm they are a generalization of the idea of evidential support embodied by probabilistic inductive logic. There is some controversy as to whether such a generalization is useful or desirable, or whether simple probability is too narrow to represent important evidential relationships captured by some Dempster-Shafer functions.

There is a sense in which the other two quantitative measures of uncertainty, possibility functions and ranking functions, are definable in terms of formulas employing the Dempster-Shafer functions. But this is not the best way to understand them. Possibility functions (Zadeh 1965 1978; Dubois & Prade 1980, 1990) are generally read as representing the degree of uncertainty in a claim, where such uncertainty is often attributed to vagueness or fuzziness. These functions are formally like probability functions and Dempster-Shafer functions, but they subscribe to a simpler addition rule: the degree of uncertainty of a disjunction is the greater of the degrees of uncertainty of the parts. Similarly, the degree of uncertainty of a conjunction is the smaller of the uncertainties of the parts.

Ranking functions (Spohn 1988) supply a measure of how surprising it would be if a claim turned out to be true, rated on a scale from 0 (not at all surprising) to infinity. Tautologies have rank 0 and contradictions are infinitely surprising. Logically equivalent claims have the same rank. The rank of a disjunction is equal to the rank of the lower ranking disjunct. These functions may be used to represent a kind of order-of-magnitude reasoning about the plausibility of various claims.

See Halpern 2003 for a good comparative treatment of all of these approaches.

Here are the axioms for the Plausibility Relations and the Qualitative Probability Relations. We may specify them in terms of a formal language L for either sentential logic or for predicate logic. In this formal language we employ the following expressions to represent the standard logical terms: ‘not’, ‘$${\nsim}$$’; ‘and’, ‘$$\cdot$$’; ‘or’, ‘$$\vee$$’. We represent the the standard logical entailment relation with the symbol ‘$$\vDash$$’—i.e., the expression ‘$$B \vDash A$$’ says “B logically entails A” and the expression ‘$$\vDash A$$’ says “A is a tautology”.

Axioms for the Plausibility Relations
Each plausibility relation $$\succcurlyeq$$ satisfies the following axioms:
1. if $$\vDash A$$, then not $${\nsim}A \succcurlyeq A$$;
2. if $$B \vDash A$$, then $$A \succcurlyeq B$$;
3. if $$A \vDash B$$ and $$B \vDash A$$ (i.e., if A is logically equivalent to B), then: (1) if $$A \succcurlyeq C$$, then $$B \succcurlyeq C$$; and (2) if $$D \succcurlyeq A$$, then $$D \succcurlyeq B$$;
4. if $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ and $$B \succcurlyeq C$$, then $$A \succcurlyeq C$$.
Axioms for the Qualitative Probability Relations
To get the qualitative probability relations we add the axioms
1. if $$\vDash{\nsim}(A\cdot C)$$ and $$\vDash{\nsim}(B\cdot C)$$, then $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ if and only if $$(A \vee C) \succcurlyeq(B \vee C)$$.
2. $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ or $$B \succcurlyeq$$ A;

The typical axioms for quantitative probability are as follows:

1. for all sentences $$A, 0 \le P[A] \le 1$$;
2. if $$\vDash A$$, then $$P[S] = 1$$;
3. if $$\vDash{\nsim}(A\cdot B)$$, then $$P[(A \vee B)] = P[A] + P[B]$$.

Axioms 1–6 for the qualitative probability relations are probabilistically sound with respect to the quantitative probability functions. That is, for each given probability function P, define a relation $$\succcurlyeq$$ such that $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ just in case $$P[A] \ge P[B]$$. Then it can be shown that $$\succcurlyeq$$ must satisfy axioms 1–6. However, not every qualitative probability relation that satisfies axioms 1–6 may be represented by a probability function. To get that we must add one further structural axiom.

First we need to define a bit more notation. Two sentences are defined as equally plausible, $$A \approx B$$, just when both $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ and $$B \succcurlyeq A$$. One sentence is defined as more plausible than another, $$A \succ B$$, just when $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ but not $$B \succcurlyeq A$$.

Let’s say that a qualitative probability relation $$\succcurlyeq$$ is fine-grained just in case it satisfies the following axiom:

1. if $$A \succ B$$, then (for each natural number n) there is some tautology consisting of a disjunction of n sentences, $$\vDash(S_1 \vee S_2 \vee \ldots \vee S_n)$$, where for each distinct $$S_i$$ and $$S_j$$ we have $$\vDash{\nsim}(S_{i} \cdot S_{j})$$ (each distinct $$S_i$$ and $$S_j$$ are inconsistent with one another) and where $$S_i \approx S_j$$ (they are equally plausible), and such that for each of the $$S_i$$, $$A \succ(B \vee S_i)$$.

Think of each sentence $$S_i$$ as saying that in some fair lottery consisting of n tickets ticket i will win (where exactly one ticket must win, and where each ticket has the same chance of winning).

It can be proved that for each fine-grained qualitative probability relation $$\succcurlyeq$$ there is a unique probability function P such that $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ just in case $$P[A] \ge P[B]$$.

Now, call a qualitative probability relation $$\succcurlyeq$$ properly extendable just in case it can be extended to a fine-grained qualitative probability relation (perhaps defined on a larger language, i.e., a language containing additional sentences). Then for every properly extendable qualitative probability relation $$\succcurlyeq$$ there is a probability function P such that $$A \succcurlyeq B$$ just in case $$P[A] \ge P[B]$$. In general a given properly extendable qualitative probability relation may have many such representing probability functions, corresponding to different ways of extending it to fine-grained qualitative probability relations.

Thus, the quantitative probability functions may be viewed as just useful ways of representing properly extendable qualitative probability relations on a convenient numerical scale.

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