#### Supplement to Location and Mereology

## A Theory of Location

In this document we set out a fragment of the theory of location due to Casati and Varzi (1999). Their full system includes a topological component, and some purely mereological axioms, that we ignore. The fragment that will concern us here includes a pair of purely locational axioms and a pair of ‘mereo-locational’ axioms that govern the interaction parthood and exact location. (The present exposition of Casati and Varzi follows the discussion in Parsons 2007.) The four axioms are:

- (1)
- Functionality
∀
*x*∀*y*∀*z*[(*L*(*x*,*y*) &*L*(*x*,*z*)) →*y*=*z*]

*Nothing has more than one exact location.* - (2)
- Conditional Reflexivity
∀
*x*∀*y*[*L*(*x*,*y*) →*L*(*y*,*y*)]

*Locations of entities are located at themselves.* - (3)
- Weak Expansivity
∀
*x*∀*y*∀*z*∀*w*[(*P*(*x*,*y*) &*L*(*x*,*z*) &*L*(*y*,*w*)) →*P*(*z*,*w*)]

*Any exact location of any part of an entity is a part of any exact location of that entity.* - (4)
- Arbitrary Partition
∀
*x*∀*y*∀*z*[(*L*(*x*,*y*) &*P*(*z*,*y*)) → ∃*w*(*P*(*w*,*x*) &*L*(*w*,*z*))]

*If entity**x*is exactly located at*y*, then for any part*z*of*y*, there is some part*w*of*x*that is exactly located at*z*. - (The labels ‘Weak Expansivity’ and ‘Arbitrary Partition’ are due to Parsons 2007: 223.)

Functionality and Conditional Reflexivity are discussed in the main document.

Weak Expansivity says that if both the part and the whole are located,
then the part ‘lies within’ the whole: the part's exact
location is a part of the whole's exact location. This allows for a
situation in which *x* is a part of *y* though one or both
of these entities fails to be exactly located anywhere. (One might
think, e.g., that a certain proposition has another proposition as a
part though neither is exactly located anywhere, or that a person is a
part of a proposition even though the person has an exact location and
the proposition doesn't.) It also allows for situations in which an
entity and one of its proper parts share the same exact location.

Casati and Varzi take care to ensure that their system does
*not* entail that if *x*'s exact location is a part of
*y*'s exact location, then *x* is a part of *y*. (Call
this *WE _{C}*; it is the approximate converse of
Weak Expansivity.) One reason to be cautious about this runs as
follows. Suppose that my body, a material object, is exactly located
at the region

*r*

_{b}, that my head is exactly located at the region

*r*

_{h}, and that my head is a part of my body. Then given Weak Expansivity,

*r*

_{h}is a part of

*r*

_{b}, and given Conditional Reflexivity,

*r*

_{h}is exactly located at

*r*

_{h}, and

*r*

_{b}is exactly located at

*r*

_{b}. So, if Casati and Varzi were committed to WE

_{C}, they would be forced to conclude that a certain

*region*,

*r*

_{h}, is a part of a material object, my body.

Now consider Arbitrary Partition. Informally, it says that a located
thing has a *part* located at each subregion of the thing's
location. (It is a somewhat stronger version of the ‘Doctrine of
Arbitrary Undetached Parts’ attacked by van Inwagen (1981).)
Together with Functionality, Arbitrary Partition entails that simple
things do not have complex exact locations. Given the popular
assumption that a region is complex if and only if it is extended
(better: not-point-like), this amounts to the claim that simple things
do not have extended exact locations—roughly, that there are no
*extended simples*. Arguments for and against the possibility
of extended simples are discussed in the main document.

It is worth noting, however, that one can reject extended simples without accepting Arbitrary Partition.

First, one might think that everything is composed of point-like
simples but that composition is restricted, so that some pluralities
of simples have no fusion. In that case it would be natural to deny
Arbitrary Partition. For example, one might say that Obama is composed
of some point-like simples, *oo*, and is exactly located at
region *r*, but that there are proper parts of *r* (say, the
left half of *r*) at which no part of Obama is exactly located.
The material simples in the left half of *r*, one might say, do
not have a fusion.

Here is the second reason. (What follows is rough. See Cartwright
(1975) and Uzquiano (2006) for a more careful discussion.) One might
think that (i) all material objects must always be topologically open
and gunky, that (ii) any part of a material object must be a material
object, and that (iii) space or spacetime is a continuum of simple
points, each plurality of which composes a region. Now let *o* be
a material object whose exact location, *r*, is a topologically
open sphere. Then, given (iii), presumably there will be a part
*r** of *r* that is not topologically open and so (by (ii))
is not the exact location of any material object and so (by (iii)) is
not the exact location of any part of *o*, contrary to Arbitrary
Partition. For reasons like these, Uzquiano claims that Arbitrary
Partition “seems far too strong to be classed as an axiom of any
reasonable theory of location” (2011: 206).