Kant and Hume on Morality

First published Wed Mar 26, 2008; substantive revision Thu Mar 29, 2018

The relationship between Immanuel Kant (1724–1804) and David Hume (1711–1776) is a source of longstanding fascination. Kant credited Hume with waking him from his “dogmatic slumber”, and he describes the Critique of Pure Reason, arguably the most important work of modern philosophy, as the solution to the “Humean problem in its greatest possible amplification” (Prol 4:260–61). Much of the focus has been on their respective views in metaphysics and epistemology. Yet, as Thomas Nagel remarks, contemporary moral philosophy also “continues to be dominated by the disagreement between these two giants” (Nagel 2012). Comparing Hume and Kant therefore provides opportunity to clarify and assess two of the modern era’s most influential approaches to the central problems of moral philosophy. Comparing their views also illuminates the landscape of eighteenth-century ethical thought. Although there are many points at which Kant’s and Hume’s ethics stand in opposition to each other, there are also important connections between the two. Kant shared with Hume some important assumptions about morality, virtue, and motivation. Indeed, early in his career he had been attracted to the sentimentalism of Hume and other British moralists, especially Francis Hutcheson (1694–1746), and the influence lingered long after he changed his mind about the value of their approach.

For the sake of brevity, this article assumes familiarity with Hume’s and Kant’s main contributions to moral philosophy. The aim here is not to summarize their views or compare them on all matters ethical. Instead, the task is to examine several key areas where we can reasonably see Kant as responding to or influenced by Hume, or where comparisons between their views are particularly fruitful.

1. Moral Philosophy and its Subject Matter

Hume and Kant operate with two somewhat different conceptions of morality itself, which helps explain some of the differences between their respective approaches to moral philosophy. The most important difference is that Kant sees law, duty, and obligation as the very heart of morality, while Hume does not. In this respect, Kant’s conception of morality resembles what Bernard Williams calls “the moral system”, which defines the domain of morality primarily in terms of an unconditionally binding and inescapable form of obligation (Williams 1985: 193–94). Kant believes that our moral concerns are dominated by the question of what duties are imposed on us by a law that commands with a uniquely moral necessity. Like most eighteenth-century philosophers, he also believes that our moral lives are preoccupied with the question of how to be virtuous over the course of a life, but he defines virtue in terms of the more fundamental concepts of law, obligation, and duty. By contrast, these concepts certainly figure into morality as Hume understands it, but they are far less central. For Hume, the broader and somewhat looser notion of “personal merit” lies at the heart of morality (EPM 9.1.1). Our moral concerns are dominated by the question of which motives are virtuous, and we answer this question by looking to the responses of our fellow human beings, who—when viewing things properly—approve of those motives and character traits that are useful or immediately agreeable (EPM 9.1.13). These are the terms that characterize duty and obligation for Hume, rather than the other way around.

Two other differences are worth noting for the purposes of this article. First, Kant draws a bright line between moral and non-moral phenomena, such as prudence, politics, or art. Morality’s normative standards and the nature of its demands distinguish it sharply from the non-moral. For Hume, the line between the moral and non-moral is far blurrier. He frequently assimilates moral judgment to “taste” or judgments about beauty and deformity (Gill 2007), and he explicitly argues against the strict separation of moral virtues from other personal qualities such as a quick wit or even good looks (T 3.3.4–5). According to Hume, the strict separation of moral and non-moral virtues marks one way in which modern moral thought is inferior to ancient ethics; he also seems to suspect that it reflects an unhealthy fixation on responsibility and guilt inherited from Christianity (Darwall 2013: 8–9). A second important difference is closely related to the first. For Kant the moral is distinguished from the non-moral not only by a special form of obligation but also by its elevation above the rest of life. Morality itself has a unique status or “dignity”, as does the rational being from whose autonomous will the law springs (G 4:435). The proper response to both is a correspondingly unique form of reverence or “respect”, which morality demands equally from each of us. Kant believes that in the moral domain we take ourselves—often only implicitly—to be “persons”, elevated above mere “things” such as machines or other animals. One of our chief moral concerns is to protect this status, which requires respecting the rational autonomy at its source and avoiding behavior or patterns of thought and desire that dishonor or degrade persons by treating ourselves or others as mere things. This concern looms large in Kant’s conception of morality, and it has a profound influence on his approach to moral philosophy (Anderson 2008). We see it, for example, in his discussions of respect for persons and his characterization of ethical virtue as “love of honor” (cf. Denis 2014). We see it also in the priority given to duties to self (cf. Denis 2010a), as well as Kant’s claim that a person throws herself away and makes herself an object of “contempt” when she lies to herself or grovels before others, for example (MM 6:420). Hume does not see things this way. For Hume, the domain of morality is not particularly pure, special, or elevated. It sometimes shows us at our most benevolent or most magnanimous, but morality is continuous with the rest of life, including politics and the pursuit of wealth and status in modern commercial society. Moral virtue is undoubtedly pleasing to us, sometimes powerfully so, but it does not command a unique form of respect or reverence. Neither do the rules and ideals of morality, which spring from the same propensities, ideas, and passions that drive the rest of human behavior. Notions of honor and dignity may figure into Hume’s view of morality but they are far from central. Morality has us far more concerned with promoting pleasure and utility.

Hume and Kant both believe that philosophy should dig beneath the surface of morality and present a theory of its foundation. When it comes to morality’s foundation, they seem to agree on two things. First, morality’s foundation cannot be located in religion. Second, it cannot be found in mind-independent facts about the world. Yet they disagree about the rest of the story. Hume locates the foundation of morality in human nature, primarily in our emotional responses to the behavior of our fellow human beings. By contrast, Kant locates the foundation of morality in the rational nature that we share with all possible finite rational beings. He argues that morality’s foundation lies in the “autonomy” of the rational will. Kant’s notion of autonomy is one of the more central, distinctive, and influential aspects of his ethics. He defines autonomy as “the property of the will by which it is a law to itself (independently of any property of the objects of volition)” (G 4:440). According to Kant, the will of a moral agent is autonomous in that it both gives itself the moral law (is self-legislating) and can constrain or motivate itself to follow the law (is self-constraining or self-motivating). The source of the moral law is not in the agent’s feelings, natural impulses or inclinations, but in her “pure” rational will, which Kant identifies as the “proper self” (G 4:461). A heteronomous will, on the other hand, is governed by something other than itself, such as an external force or authority.

These rival conceptions of morality and its foundation correspond to two very different approaches to moral philosophy. Hume’s approach could be called naturalistic, empirical, or experimental. His moral philosophy is part of his larger endeavor to provide a naturalistic explanation of human nature as a whole. Hume’s approach relies on and reflects his philosophy of mind, which is empirical in its approach. He treats ethics, together with psychology, history, aesthetics, and politics, as the subject of his “moral science”. Hume often seems more interested in explaining morality as a natural phenomenon than in setting out a normative ethical theory, treating moral action as part of the same physical world in which we explain things in terms of cause and effect (EHU 8.1.20–22). On this view, everything we do is open to empirical investigation and explanation. In fact, Hume often compares humans with other animals, tracing the bases of human morality to features of the mind that human beings and other animals have in common (T 2.1.12).

In sharp contrast with Hume, Kant insists on the need for an a priori investigation of morality’s foundation. His detailed treatment of virtue and moral judgment draws heavily on observations and ideas about human nature. But Kant makes explicit that morality must be based on a supreme moral principle, which can only be discovered a priori, through a method of pure moral philosophy (G 4:387–92). By “pure” or a priori moral philosophy, Kant has in mind a philosophy grounded exclusively on principles that are inherent in and revealed through the operations of reason. According to Kant, morality’s commands are unconditional. We could never discover a principle that commands all rational beings with such absolute authority through a method of empirical moral philosophy. An empirical approach, he argues, can tell us how people do act, but it cannot tell us how we ought to act. Moreover, we must keep the pure and empirical parts of moral philosophy clearly distinguished, since if we do not we could find ourselves confusing conditional truths, such as what is prudentially good for certain individuals or species, with unconditional truths about fundamental moral requirements (G 4:389–90). Once one has in hand the supreme principle of morality, however, one requires an understanding of human beings in order to apply it to them (MM 6:217). One can say little about what the supreme moral principle requires as duties human agents have to themselves and to one another without knowing such things as the sorts of ends people may be inclined to adopt and the conditions under which human agency will characteristically thrive or wither.

2. Kant’s Relationship to Hume and British Moral Philosophy

Hume’s treatment of causality exerted a profound influence on Kant. He tells us that his “labor” in the Critique of Pure Reason was fundamentally a response to “that Humean skeptical teaching” (CPrR 5:32). The direct impact of Hume’s moral philosophy is less clear. Early in his career Kant endorsed an idiosyncratic form of sentimentalism. But he often indicated that he saw Hutcheson as more significant to ethics than Hume. He seems to have associated Hutcheson more with the positive insights about the role of sensibility in ethics, whereas he seems to have associated Hume more with skepticism about practical reason (Kuehn 2001: 182). Sentimentalism’s positive influence on Kant was strongest during the early part of his career. As his views developed, he noted its inadequacies with increasing frequency, eventually rejecting any version of sentimentalism as a theory of morality’s foundation. Yet elements of the tradition continued to influence Kant’s mature thinking about the nature and importance of emotion in morality.

Kant’s early debt to sentimentalism is evident in two of his published works from the 1760s. In Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime (1764), which often reads like the work of a mid-eighteenth century British thinker, Kant notes and analyzes the various feelings of pleasure or displeasure, and attraction and aversion, people feel to different traits and temperaments in themselves and others (and to different types of literature, objects in nature, kinds of relationships, and other things). His statements about the foundation of morality and its principles convey a commitment to some form of sentimentalism, however idiosyncratic. He claims, for example, that the principles of morality are

not speculative rules, but the consciousness of a feeling that lives in every human breast and that extends much further than to the special grounds of sympathy and complaisance. (OFBS 2.217)

He describes this as “the feeling of the beauty and the dignity of human nature”, proclaiming that one can “bring about the noble attitude that is the beauty of virtue” only when a person “subordinates” her particular inclinations “to such an enlarged” feeling of the beauty and dignity of human nature (OFBS 2.217). Kant expresses a similar line of thought in another work from the period, Inquiry Concerning the Distinctness of the Principles of Natural Theology and Morality (1763), where he distinguishes between the faculty for representing truth and the faculty for experiencing the good, identifying the latter with feeling. “Just as there are unanalyzable concepts of the true”, Kant argues,

so too there is an unanalyzable feeling of the good… One of the tasks of the understanding is to analyze and render distinct the compound and confused concept of the good by showing how it arises from simpler feelings of the good. (I 2:299)

Other indications of sentimentalism’s influence can be found in Kant’s notes and lectures from that period. For example, in the announcement of his lectures for the winter semester of 1765–1766, he explains one difference between ethics and metaphysics by remarking that

the distinction between good and evil in actions, and the judgment of moral rightness, can be known, easily and accurately, by the human heart through what is called sentiment, and that without elaborate necessity of proofs. (WS 2:311)

In the same announcement, he states his intention to develop and clarify

the attempts of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson and Hume, which, though imperfect and defective, have nevertheless come farthest in the discovery of the first principles of all morality. (WS 2:311)

Similarly, in notes that appear to come from between 1764 and 1768, Kant writes, “[t]he rules of morality proceed from a special, eponymous feeling, upon which the understanding is guided…” (NF 19:93 #6581).

If Kant was genuinely trying out a version of sentimentalism in the 1760s, this phase did not last long, nor was it a simple adoption of the theories of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, or Hume. His description of their approach as “imperfect and defective” already indicates some dissatisfaction with sentimentalism. By the late 1760s it was a theme of Kant’s notes and lectures that it could not provide an adequate account of moral obligation. Morality imposes unconditional requirements, and he became increasingly convinced that sentimentalism could not explain or justify such requirements. Arguments for this conclusion appear in Kant’s later written works and lectures. In a number of works, Kant creates taxonomies of misguided, heteronomous ethical theories based on material determining grounds—in contrast to his theory of autonomy, in which the moral motive constitutes an objective, formal determining ground (see Wood 2005b [Other Internet Resources]; Irwin 2009: chapters 68 and 71; and Schneewind 2009). Kant distinguishes among these theories based on their accounts of the basis of moral obligation or the fundamental moral principle (G 4:441–44; CPrR 5:39–41; C 27: 252–54; M 29:621–25). Such theories may assume either subjective (empirical) or objective (rational) determining grounds for the moral principle; and within each of these categories, there are theories that assume these determining grounds are external, and others that assume they are internal. Objective, internal grounds include perfection (e.g., Wolff and the Stoics). Objective, external grounds include the will of God (e.g., Crusius). Subjective, external grounds include education (e.g., Montaigne) or civil constitution (e.g., Mandeville). Subjective, internal grounds can include physical feeling, such as self-love (e.g., Epicurus) or self-interest (e.g., Hobbes), or moral feeling (e.g., Hutcheson) (CPrR 5:40; C 27:253). Thus, Kant locates moral sense theories among those theories that assume a subjective, empirical, internal determining ground of moral feeling as the principle of morality (cf. M 29:621).

From the Groundwork on, Kant registers a number of complaints against sentimentalism, all of which cluster around what he takes to be the core insight into its inadequacy. No empirical principles can ground moral laws, because moral laws bind all rational beings universally, necessarily, and unconditionally; empirical principles are contingent in various ways, for example, on aspects of human nature (G 4:442–43). Variance in moral feelings makes them an inadequate standard of good and evil (G 4:442). Moral feelings cannot be the source of the supreme moral principle, because the supreme moral principle holds for all rational beings, whereas feelings differ from person to person (M 29:625). If duty were grounded in feeling, it would seem that morality would bind some people (e.g., the tender-hearted) more strongly than others, contrary to the universal, equal nature of moral obligation. Even if people were in complete agreement regarding their moral feelings, the universality of these feelings would be a contingent matter, and thus an inadequate ground for the unconditionally binding moral law. Indeed, if morality were grounded in feeling, it would be arbitrary: God could have constituted us so that we would get from vice the pleasurable, calm feelings of approval that we now (allegedly) get from virtue (M 29:625). So for Kant, the contingency of the ground of obligation offered by moral sense theories renders those theories inadequate; only a priori determining grounds will do.

As these criticisms indicate, Kant’s mature view is fundamentally opposed to sentimentalism in a variety of ways. Yet the influence of Shaftesbury, Hutcheson, and Hume lingered long after Kant came to believe that morality’s true foundation lies in the autonomy of the will, and he continued to find value in their approach. In his notes Kant remarks that moral sense theories are better understood as providing a hypothesis explaining why we in fact feel approval and disapproval of various actions than as supplying a principle that justifies approval or disapproval or that guides actions (NF 19:117 #6626). He also suggests that even if one rejects moral sense “as a principle for the judgment of moral action” one might still accept it as a theory “of the mind’s incentives to morality” (M 29:625). Quite strikingly, Kant also continues to believe some version of his earlier claim in Observations that some of our feelings indicate a “susceptibility of the soul which… makes it fit for virtuous impulses” (OFBS 2:208). We see this in the Metaphysics of Morals, for instance, where Kant claims that moral feeling, conscience, love of one’s neighbor, and self-respect all “lie at the basis of morality, as subjective conditions of receptiveness to the concept of duty” (MM 6:399; see Guyer 2010). The lingering influence of sentimentalism can also be seen in his emphasis on the obligation to “sympathize actively” with others, and in the claim that we have “an indirect duty to cultivate the compassionate natural (aesthetic) feelings in us, and to make use of them as so many means to sympathy based on moral principles and the feeling appropriate to them… . For this [compassion] is still one of the impulses that nature has implanted in us to do what the representation of duty alone might not accomplish (MM 6:457).

3. Reason and Emotion in Morality

Kant, as discussed above, underwent a decisive change of mind about the views of Shaftesbury and Hutcheson. Early in his career, he endorsed core aspects of their approach, but Kant’s mature work is organized around the idea that reason, rather than feeling or emotion, is the highest authority in the moral domain. In this respect, many features of his moral philosophy are fundamentally opposed to Hume’s. We can see this opposition at work in their respective accounts of moral judgment and moral motivation. A careful look at these topics, however, also highlights sentimentalism’s residual influence on Kant.

According to Hume, moral judgments typically concern the character traits and motives behind human actions. To make a moral judgment is to detect, by means of a sentiment, the operation of a virtuous or vicious quality of mind. The sentiment here is a “peculiar” kind of feeling—namely, a feeling of approval (love, pride) or disapproval (hatred, humility) (T We call the traits that elicit our approval “virtues”, and those that elicit our disapproval “vices”. Sentiments of approval and disapproval are passions, but they tend to be “soft and gentle” and therefore easily mistaken for thoughts or ideas (T The real story is that “morality… is more properly felt than judg’d of” (T Reason and experience are required for determining the likely effects of a given motive or character trait, so reason does play an important role in moral judgment. Yet reason’s role is subordinate. It is one thing to say that a given trait tends to be useful or conducive to pleasure and quite another to say that it is “good” or “virtuous”. The moral value of a trait is conferred by the sentiment of approval, which “gilding and staining all natural objects with the colours, borrowed from internal sentiment, raises, in a manner, a new creation” (EPM App. I.21). Hume argues, however, that only those sentiments experienced from a “general point of view” count as genuinely moral (T For example, a person might hate or envy the courage of her enemy but this is not necessarily a moral response. The moral sentiment is experienced when she considers her enemy’s courage from a “general point of view” (T When a person considers things from this point of view, she looks upon them as a “judicious spectator”, who is disinterested but not emotionally unaffected by the scene she beholds (Cohon 2008: 126–58). On the contrary, rather than eliminating her sentiments, the judicious spectator enlarges them by means of sympathy, which enables her to resent the misery of others or rejoice in their happiness. (Regarding the mechanism of sympathy, see Taylor 2015: 189–94.)

Kant offers a very different account of moral judgment. He focuses on the first-person judgments an agent (not a spectator) must make about how to behave. In his view, the primary question is whether a particular mode of conduct is permissible, required, or forbidden in light of the moral law, and sentiment or emotion has no authority in this matter. Answering the question requires an operation of reason by means of which the agent determines whether her principle or “maxim” of conduct conflicts with the moral law. Because she is an imperfect and finite rational being, the law presents itself to her as a “categorical imperative” (CI). It is an imperative because it commands and constrains us; it is categorical because it commands and constrains us with ultimate authority and without regard to our personal preferences or any empirically contingent ends (G 4:413–20). The two best known formulations of the CI are the formula of universal law (FUL), which commands, “act only in accordance with that maxim through which you can at the same time will that it become a universal law” (G 4:421), and the formula of the end in itself (FEI), which commands, “So act that you use humanity, whether in your own person or in the person of any other, always at the same time as an end, never merely as a means” (G 4:429). Scholars disagree about the relationship between these two formulations of the CI, as well as their relationship to the other formulations Kant provides. There is also disagreement about whether FUL or FEI has primacy in deliberation and moral judgment. Kant claims that FUL is the standard everyone actually does employ in moral judgment (G 4:402; CPrR 5:69), and some scholars defend its primacy (e.g., Engstrom 2009). Others argue in favor of FEI, emphasizing, in particular, its role in the Metaphysics of Morals, where FEI seems to play the fundamental role in guiding judgment about specific ethical duties (e.g., Wood 1999).

Some passages from Kant’s work seem to suggest that moral judgment requires no experience, no knowledge of human nature and local custom, and no emotional sensitivity. A rational being equipped with a purely formal procedure for testing maxims has all she needs. Yet such passages are misleading when read in isolation. This is not Kant’s view of how human beings do, or even should, make moral judgments (Wood 2008: 56). First, application of the CI typically requires auxiliary or subordinate “principles of application”, which must be taken from our empirical knowledge of human nature (MM 6:217). Second, Kant frequently emphasizes that no formal procedure could specify all the principles for applying higher-order principles. Principles of application help us apply higher order principles to concrete circumstances, but there is no substitute for experience and “judgment”, which is a knack or uncodifiable talent (A138/B172). This is why the practice of casuistry is “woven into ethics” (MM 6:411). Third, experience and judgment are also required because the moral law “cannot specify precisely in what way one is to act and how much one is to do by the action for an end that is also a duty” (MM 6:390). The wider the duty, the more latitude for individual judgment and experience (MM 6:390). Finally, it is clear that, on Kant’s view, moral judgment requires emotional sensitivity and an understanding of social convention. For example, without these, one might unable to determine whether a particular act of beneficence is more condescending than kind (MM 6:453) or to prevent friendly banter from sliding into disrespectful mockery (MM 6:467). Proper moral judgment in such circumstances requires attunement to the feelings of others, but also facility with the social conventions that shape the dynamics of personal interaction.

Kant and Hume are clearly opposed on the question of whether reason or feeling has the final say in moral matters. Hume assigns reason to a subordinate role, while Kant takes reason to be the highest normative authority. However, it is important not to misunderstand the nature of their opposition. Hume offers an empirical explanation of the moral judgments made in “common life”, which he takes to be part of his broader science of human nature. This is his main focus. By contrast, Kant makes observations about the “common” use of reason in morality (e.g., G 4:399), but this is not his main focus. He says relatively little about what is going on in our heads or the surrounding social environment when we actually make moral judgments. As noted above, Kant at least entertained the possibility that sentimentalism provides the correct empirical explanation of why human beings tend to approve or disapprove of the actions and motives that they do (NF 19:117 #6626). What Kant insists on is that such responses can be justified only by pure reason, which is the only faculty capable of understanding the unconditional necessity of the moral law’s commands. Emotion or feeling plays an important role in guiding our application of this law to particular maxims in concrete circumstances, but feeling’s role is definitely subordinate to reason’s.

A similar contrast between Hume and Kant can be found in their respective accounts of moral motivation. Hume famously claims that “Reason is, and ought only to be the slave of the passions, and can never pretend to any other office than to serve and obey them” (T The claim is not that reason has no role in human action, but rather that its role is subordinate to passion. Hume offers three main arguments for this claim in A Treatise of Human Nature. (There is debate among interpreters about whether Hume changed his position on reason and motivation between the Treatise and the second Enquiry, as well as precisely what Hume’s understanding of the nature, extent, and significance of reason’s contribution to action is (see, e.g., Milgram 1995; Radcliffe 1997; Cohon 2008: chapters 2 and 3; and Irwin 2008: chapter 26).)

According to the first argument, “reason alone can never be a motive to any action of the will” (T Abstract (or demonstrative) reasoning, which involves a priori inferences and judgments pertaining to relations of ideas, cannot influence the will, but only assist us in our pursuit of an end we already have (e.g., if mathematical calculations would facilitate our achievement of our end). Probable (or causal) reasoning helps us discover cause and effect relations among objects of experience conducive to the realization of pre-selected ends, but such information about cause and effect can never motivate action on its own: “It can never in the least concern us to know, that such objects are causes, and such others effects, if both causes and effects be indifferent to us” (T In order to be motivated to act, we must first anticipate pleasure or pain from something. That anticipated pleasure or pain gives rise to feelings of desire or aversion for the object in question. Probable reasoning allows us to discern the causes of this object; our positive or negative feelings about the object then spread to the causes of it; and we are then motivated to pursue or to avoid them. Simply believing that one thing causes another will not motivate action (T

A second argument, which builds on the first, aims to show that reason “can never oppose passion in the direction of the will” (T The only thing that can oppose an impulse to action generated by one passion is a contrary impulse. Reason, then, could counteract an impulse to action generated by a passion if and only if reason could itself generate a contrary impulse. But from the first argument, we know that that reason cannot generate such an impulse. “Thus it appears, that the principle, which opposes any passion, cannot be the same with reason, and is only called so in an improper sense” (T Hume goes on to say that whatever we feel in us running contrary to an impulse to act that we mistake for reason must be something else, such as a calm passion (e.g., a general appetite for the good, benevolence, or aversion to evil; T

The third argument claims that a passion is an “original existence”, not an idea, or a mental copy of another object. Contradiction to truth and reason “consists in the disagreement of ideas, consider’d as copies, with those objects, which they represent” (T So a passion cannot be contrary to truth and reason. Passions cannot, strictly speaking, be evaluated as reasonable or unreasonable, despite our practice of calling passions unreasonable or irrational when they depend in some way on poor reasoning or false beliefs. Later in the Treatise, Hume extends this argument to volitions and actions as well (T; we might view Kant’s conflict in conception and contradiction in will tests of the formula of universal law to constitute refutations of the latter argument (G 4:421–24; see Guyer 2008: ch. 5).

These arguments convey the main components of Hume’s view of motivation: passion plays the dominant role in motivating action, reason a merely subsidiary role; reason cannot control or resist passion’s motivational influence; and one cannot use the standards of reason to praise or criticize passions. Hume draws some further important, anti-rationalist moral conclusions from this line of thought. One obvious implication is that reason cannot be the motive to moral action; if reason cannot motivate any sort of action, it cannot motivate moral action. A second further conclusion is that morality (fundamental moral principles) cannot be grounded in reason; this one follows both from his views about the “inertness” of reason generally, and from his assumption that morality is capable of motivating people:

Morals excite passions, and produce or prevent actions. Reason of itself is utterly impotent in this particular. The rules of morality, therefore, are not conclusions of reason. (T

Kant never directly addresses Hume’s arguments, but he clearly rejects the idea that reason is motivationally “impotent” or enslaved to the passions. It is a central feature of his moral philosophy that pure reason can be “practical”—that reason can “of itself, independently of anything empirical, determine the will” (CPrR 5: 42). He says of right actions that they “need no recommendation” from emotion or personal inclination. Such actions

present the will that practices them as the object of an immediate respect, and nothing but reason is required to impose them upon the will. (G 4:435)

Moreover, in the first section of the Groundwork, Kant repeatedly emphasizes the special form of “moral worth” that attaches to right actions that are performed simply because they are right—i.e., actions motivated from “from duty” or “from respect for the law” (G 4:396–401; see Timmermann 2009a).

Yet Kant also holds that emotion or feeling is involved somehow in pure reason’s motivational influence on finite rational beings (such as humans). In the Groundwork, he focuses on the feeling of “respect” or reverence for the moral law. Early in the Groundwork, Kant describes respect in a manner that makes it sound like a felt aspect of the law itself:

an action from duty is to put aside entirely the influence of inclination, and with it every object of the will; hence there is left for the will nothing that could determine it the except objectively the law and subjectively pure respect for this practical law. (G 4:400)

But his subsequent development of respect makes it sound more like a separate feeling, though one arising from reason:

But although respect is a feeling, it is not one received by means of influence; it is, instead, a feeling self-wrought by a rational concept and therefore specifically different from all feelings of the first kind, which can be referred to inclination or fear. What I cognize immediately as a law for me, I cognize with respect, which signifies merely consciousness of the subordination of my will to a law without the mediation of other influences on any sense. Immediate determination of the will by means of the law and the consciousness of this is called respect, so that this is regarded as the effect of the law on the subject, and not as the cause of the law. (G 4:401 n; also see 460)

Despite his emphasis on the motivational efficacy of pure reason, Kant’s discussion of respect makes clear that feeling must be somehow involved in human moral motivation (see Guyer 2008: ch. 5; and Guyer 2010). In the Groundwork, Kant states:

In order for a sensibly affected rational being to will that for which reason alone prescribes the ‘ought,’ it is admittedly required that his reason have the capacity to induce a feeling of pleasure or of delight in the fulfillment of duty, and thus there is required a causality of reason to determine sensibility in conformity with its principles. (G 4:460)

Even though we cannot know (or “make intelligible a priori”) how a thought or judgment about the morality of an action “can itself produce a sensation of pleasure or pain”, Kant thinks that this somehow does happen; it must, if moral considerations are to be motivating in beings like us. The phenomenology of respect is unusual, as it involves both pain and pleasure (or something like it). There is the humiliation an agent feels when the moral law strikes down her self-conceit; but respect also feels invigorating and ennobling, since the moral law comes from the agent’s own reason and represents her higher self and vocation (CPrR 5:73). However one interprets the phenomenology, respect seems to function as an intermediary between reason and the will. This raises questions about the consistency of Kant’s view, since he argues repeatedly that pure reason can, and should, determine the will “immediately”. For this and other reasons, scholars are divided on how to interpret Kant’s treatment of respect. According to an “intellectualist” line of interpretation, respect is the effect of pure reason’s motivational influence on the will. In other words, we grasp the law by means of reason, are moved to act accordingly, and feel respect as a result of being so moved. According to an “affectivist” approach, however, respect is the proximate cause of reason’s influence on the will. In other words, our rational grasp of the law’s demand produces a feeling of respect or reverence, which then moves the will (or higher faculty of desire). Vexingly, both interpretations have a strong textual basis and both have been defended with great skill and insight. (For an excellent discussion of the issues, see Frierson 2014: ch. 4.)

In the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant also describes the motivational role played by additional feelings. He lists moral feeling, conscience, love of human beings, and respect (for oneself) as special kinds of feelings of which we are made aware only though consciousness of the moral law (MM 6:399). Kant describes these as “moral endowments” that “lie at the basis of morality” or the “subjective conditions of receptivity to the concept of duty” (MM 6:399). Since our compliance with duty presupposes our having these feelings, there is no duty for us to have them. However, because of their indispensibility to human morality, there is a duty to cultivate them. Additionally, Kant clearly sees moral value in some sensibly-grounded (“pathological”) feelings (MM 6:456–57, 458; also M 29:626; NF 19:77 #6560). Speaking of sympathy, which is perhaps the best example of this sort of feeling, Kant says,

it is… an indirect duty to cultivate the natural… feelings in us, and to make use of them as so many means to sympathy based on moral principles and the feeling appropriate to them. (MM 6:457)

Sympathy allows us better to understand others’ needs, helps us to communicate our concern for them, and can act as an additional incentive to facilitate our promotion of our happiness helping others. Such sensibly-grounded feelings can work with rationally-grounded feelings in order to motivate us to act morally. We may cultivate sympathetic feelings from respect for the law, and then find these feelings prompting us to act in certain ways. In this context, where the focus is on virtue, Kant sounds closer to Hume than he is often taken to be. Indeed, according to one prominent interpretation, careful consideration of this and other relevant material highlights at least a few “deep affinities” between Kant on Hume on motivation and practical reason (Guyer 2008: 164).

Despite the above similarities, Kant and Hume are clearly opposed on the basic question of whether pure reason, to use Kant’s expression, can be motivationally efficacious. Kant thinks it can, while Hume does not. However, one must interpret this opposition with care. First, Kant’s account of respect makes clear that feeling or emotion is involved even when pure reason motivates action. The “affectivist” interpretation of respect, in particular, suggests that Kant and Hume actually agree that reason cannot motivate action without the intervention of feeling. The crucial difference between them is that Kant believes pure reason capable of producing a motivationally efficacious feeling (respect), while Hume believes nothing of the sort. The opposition between them is even starker if the “intellectualist” interpretation is correct. Second, Kant’s account of virtue makes it clear that feelings such as love and sympathy often play an important moral role in the motivation of human action. Indeed, feelings appear to be indispensible for human beings and should therefore be cultivated and strengthened through deliberate practice. Third, one must keep track of the level at which these two philosophers disagree. Consider, for example, the reason why Hume would adamantly reject Kant’s attribution of a special form of “moral worth” to actions done “from duty”. According to Hume,

no action can be virtuous, or morally good, unless there be in human nature some motive to produce it, distinct from a sense of its morality. (T

To avoid circularity, there must be a motive to virtuous action that does not itself refer to the moral goodness of the act (T For Hume, the only time one would have to rely on one’s sense of the goodness of an act to motivate oneself to do it is when one is deficient in the natural feelings that ordinarily prompt people to act morally (e.g., natural affection, generosity, gratitude). The two philosophers do not necessarily disagree here on the empirical question of what actually motivates people. Hume seems to countenance the possibility of being motivated directly by the sense of an action’s moral goodness. Kant, in fact, seems comparatively skeptical; he expresses doubt that there have ever been human actions motivated from duty alone (e.g., G 4:406–407). They disagree sharply, however, on the normative question at issue. Kant believes that the most morally admirable actions are performed “from duty” alone. These are the only actions that have true “moral worth”. By contrast, Hume believes that such actions indicate a character flaw. Indeed, if a person finds she is moved to act only by the sense that the action is good, she may very well reproach herself for a lack of generosity or gratitude, for example, and consequently form a desire to change her character.

4. Virtues and Vices

Hume and Kant both treat the concepts of virtue and vice as central to human morality. But they differ on the basic nature of virtue, and they present different catalogues of particular virtues and vices. Kant’s discussions reflect his consistent emphasis on freedom, dignity, rationality, and purity of motive. Hume’s reflect his emphasis on utility, pleasure, and the inherently social nature of the human mind. Correspondingly, the notion of internal struggle is central to Kant’s account, while Hume portrays the pursuit of virtue in comparatively relaxed and genial terms. For this reason, Hume seems far more comfortable with the bourgeois virtues integral to successful participation in modern commercial and political society (cf. EPM 9.1.2). By contrast, Kant seems warier of society’s influence on the individual, more insistent on the need to resist the power of what Rousseau calls amour-propre.

For Hume, the concepts of virtue and vice apply primarily to character traits or “mental qualities”, and secondarily to occurrent motives and actions. According to Hume, a character trait is a virtue if, and only if, it “gives to a spectator the pleasing sentiment of approbation” (EPM App. I.10). Vices, by contrast, are those traits that generate a displeasing sentiment of disapproval. Hume’s definition builds on his account of moral judgment, and it makes virtue dependent on the responses of a “judicious” spectator who contemplates things from a general point of view. The trait of prudence, for example, is a virtue because it tends to be pleasing to such a spectator. As Hume puts it, the defining mark of a virtue is that it has the “power of producing love or pride” when surveyed from the general point of view (T In other words, a trait is a virtue only insofar as it tends to provoke the moral sentiment of approval in a properly situated spectator. If it did not tend to provoke this response, it would not be a virtue. This marks a significant departure from Aristotelian conceptions of virtue (Cohon 2008: 161). According to the latter, a character trait’s goodness is a function of the role it plays in the agent’s own flourishing, which has nothing to do with the responses of a spectator. Prudence, for example, is a virtue whether or not it tends to provoke the pleasing sentiment of approbation in an outside observer, however “judicious” she may be.

Hume discusses a capacious catalogue of particular virtues and vices. His account in the Treatise is organized around the distinction between “natural” and “artificial” virtues, which is easily misunderstood. The question is not whether some virtues are fake or phony and others are authentic. The question is whether some depend on social rules and conventions and others do not. Organizing his catalogue by means of this distinction allows Hume to steer a middle path between those who see morality as entirely conventional (e.g., Bernard Mandeville) and those who believe it springs directly from features of human nature that exist independently of social convention (e.g., Francis Hutcheson). According to Hume, some virtues do depend on social convention but others do not (Cohon 2008: 162–163). In both cases, he seeks to explain why people tend to develop such traits and why they tend to be pleasing to judicious spectators. Hume drops the artificial-natural distinction from the second Enquiry, but his investigations there are motivated by the same questions and the resulting view also steers a middle course between Mandeville and Hutcheson.

According to the Treatise, artificial virtues include justice, fidelity to promises, allegiance to government, and chastity. Hume devotes much discussion to justice, which he treats as a paramount and paradigmatic artificial virtue. Hume understands justice primarily as honesty with respect to property or conformity to conventions of property (T Establishing a system of property allows us to avoid conflict and enjoy the possession and use of various goods, so the social value of conventions involving property seems obvious. Yet one reason that justice receives such attention from Hume is that it poses a problem about moral motivation and moral approval. Hume claims that there needs to be a natural (non-moral) motive for morally good actions, for otherwise they could only be done because they are morally good; and that would be circular, since our judgment of acts as morally good reflects our approval of the motives and traits that give rise to the acts in question (T, But this position makes it hard to see how justice can be a virtue; for it is hard to find the requisite natural, nonmoral motive for it. Self-interest is the natural motive that justifies our establishing rules regarding property (T; but self-interest is neither always satisfied by just acts, nor approved in the way that traits we call virtues generally are (T–10). Neither public nor private benevolence would do, since neither could motivate all just actions (T Hume himself says that “a sympathy with public interest is the source of the moral approbation, which attends that virtue” (T But since sympathy with the public interest itself seems neither nonmoral nor inherent in human nature, this claim redescribes the problem rather than solves it. Hume must ground sympathy for the public interest in more obviously natural sentiments, and explain its development from them (e.g., as self-interest, corrected or redirected through education or the contrivances of politicians). Otherwise, Hume must abandon his claim that all morally good actions—even those associated with artificial virtues—have non-moral, natural motives. (See Gauthier 1979; Mackie 1980: ch. 5; and Darwall 1995: 302–316.)

Among the natural virtues, Hume includes beneficence, prudence, temperance, frugality, industry, assiduity, enterprise, dexterity, generosity, and humanity (T In the second Enquiry, he distinguishes among virtues useful to others, virtues useful to oneself, virtues immediately agreeable to oneself, and virtues immediately agreeable to others. Among qualities useful to others are justice, fidelity, honor, allegiance, chastity, along with the other “social virtues” of humanity, generosity, charity, affability, lenity, mercy, and moderation (EPM 5.2.44). Among qualities useful to ourselves are discretion, caution, enterprise, industry, assiduity, frugality, economy, good sense, prudence, discernment (EPM 6.1.21). Among qualities contrary to our own well-being are indolence, negligence, “want of order and method”, obstinacy, fickleness, rashness, and credulity (EPM 6.1.1). Qualities immediately agreeable to oneself include cheerfulness, tranquility, benevolence, and delicacy of taste. Qualities immediately agreeable to others include good manners, politeness, wit, ingenuity, decency, cleanliness, and a graceful or genteel manner. What holds all these varied traits together as virtues is their evoking the sentiment of approval in spectators, itself grounded in sympathy.

Like Hume, Kant takes virtue to be central to human morality. But his basic conception of virtue differs from Hume’s, as does his catalogue of particular virtues and vices. According to Kant, virtue is the form in which a being with an imperfect or non-holy will expresses her supreme commitment to morality. Virtue is such a being’s continually cultivated capacity to master her inclinations so as to fulfill her duties; a capacity whose cultivation and exercise is motivated by respect for the moral law (Denis 2006; Baxley 2010). Several related claims are integral to Kant’s view. First, virtue is a general disposition to do one’s duty out of respect for the moral law (CPrR 5:128, 160; C 27:300). Second, virtue is a kind of strength. More specifically, virtue is “a moral strength of the will” (MM 6:405) or “moral strength in adherence to one’s duty” (Ant 7:147). Third, virtue presupposes opposition and entails internal struggle. Kant often seems to identify our inclinations as the primary opponents of morality (G: 4:405; V 27:450, 492; C 27:450). His considered view, however, is that inclinations are not the source of the problem. Virtue’s primary opponent is “radical evil in human nature”—a propensity to adopt maxims that prioritize self-love (and inclinations generally) over the moral law (Rel 6:29, 35–37, 57 n., 58). It is because of radical evil that virtue implies struggle and demands strength. The fundamental task of the virtuous person is to achieve the proper ordering of her incentives, giving the moral law undisputed priority over self-love. Finally, virtue is moral self-constraint “based on inner freedom” (MM 6:408), which is the capacity to act on the autonomously chosen principles of morality, even in the face of temptation (MM 6:394, 405). Virtue both expresses and promotes inner freedom. The greater one’s moral self-constraint, the more one acts based on reason, and the less one acts based on inclination or impulse (MM 6:382 n).

Kant’s catalogue of virtues and vices is organized by his system of duties. These duties are grounded in the moral law, the supreme principle of morality, which impresses itself on imperfect, finite rational beings like us as a categorical imperative. Whatever duties we have must ultimately derive from this supreme moral principle. But in the Metaphysics of Morals, Kant’s discussion of particular duties of virtue is based more directly on what he calls the “supreme principle of the doctrine of virtue”. This principle enjoins us to “act in accordance with a maxim of ends that it can be a universal law for everyone to have” (MM 6:395). As Kant explains,

In accordance with this principle a human being is an end for himself as well as for others, and it is not enough that he is not authorized to use either himself or others merely as a means (since he could then still be indifferent to them); it is in itself his duty to make the human being as such his end. (MM 6:395)

Duties of virtue have fundamentally to do with the ends, principles, and attitudes of agents; they aim to protect each agent’s inner freedom; they can be compelled only by the agent herself. It is because duties of virtue alone are subject only to internal compulsion that Kant calls them “directly ethical duties”. Among these duties are the perfect duties to oneself to avoid vices of suicide, self-mutilation, gluttony, drunkenness, sexual self-degradation (duties to oneself as an animal and moral being), lying, avarice, and servility (duties to oneself as a moral being only); the imperfect duties to oneself concerning the promotion of the obligatory end of one’s own natural and moral perfection, along with duties to foster self-knowledge, compassion for animals, and appreciation of the beautiful in nature; the perfect duties to others to avoid the vices of arrogance, defamation, and ridicule (duties of respect), and the imperfect duties to promote the end of others happiness by means of beneficence, sympathy, and gratitude, as well as by avoiding malice, envy, and ingratitude (duties of love and vices opposed to them). Kant does not claim to derive these duties from the categorical imperative or the supreme principle of virtue alone. Rather, in moving from general principles of morality to moral duties, he draws on a variety of considerations regarding human nature and other aspects of the natural world.

Hume and Kant share a number of influences, so we should not be surprised to see areas of overlap. First, like most eighteenth century philosophers, both regard the pursuit of virtue as central to human morality. Second, Kant shares Hume’s rejection of both Hobbes’s psychological egoism and Hutcheson’s reduction of all virtues to the sentiment of benevolence. Third, Hume and Kant both accept of versions of Grotius’s distinction between perfect and imperfect duties, though they do not incorporate this distinction into their theories in the same way (see Schneewind 1990). Fourth, their respective conceptions of virtue are secular by historical standards. Neither recognizes duties to God, for example, and neither counts piety or hope among the virtues. Kant also seems to agree with, and perhaps to have been influenced by, much of what Hume says about the “monkish virtues”. He follows Hume in rejecting fasting, self-flagellation, mortification of the flesh and other forms of physical self-chastisement and self-abasement as false virtues. Kant condemns such attempts at

weakening and removing all the body’s sensuality, to renounce everything that its sensuous enjoyment promotes, so that thereby the animal nature of the body would be suppressed

as contrary to proper care for the body; such care requires discipline, but also

involves trying to promote its vigor, activity, strength, and courage. (C 27:379–80)

Yet there are striking and important differences between their views. Hume defines virtue in terms of the moral sentiments of a properly situated judicious spectator, and his definition makes virtue and vice dependent on such responses. Kant, by contrast, defines virtue in terms of duty, obligation, and law. Virtue is thought of as moral strength, which is measured by an agent’s ability to defeat those inclinations that oppose the demands of the moral law (MM 6:405–407). Hume’s theory of virtue has a place for duty and law, but these are not the fundamental concepts in terms of which everything else must be explained or justified. Moreover, Hume certainly recognizes individual virtues such as strength of mind, fortitude, and courage; but they are not central to his view of virtue as such, and their status as virtues depends on the moral sentiments of a judicious spectator, as well as the exigencies and social conventions of a particular age (EPM “A Dialogue”.40)—both of which Kant takes to be irrelevant. Virtue for Kant is defined in terms of the law, and neither the law’s normative status nor its psychological weight rests on moral sentiments or social convention.

A few additional differences are worth noting. First, both philosophers recognize and discuss a plurality of virtues and vices. But, unlike Hume, Kant insists on the unitary nature of virtue: “in its Idea (objectively) there is only one virtue (as moral strength of one’s maxims)” (MM 6:447; cf. MM 6:395 and 406). Second, Hume casts a much wider net with regard to the qualities that count as virtues. The concepts of virtue and vice can apply to things outside our control, such as traits and motives that spring involuntarily from our basic temperament. Kant, by contrast, restricts the application of these concepts to traits, behaviors, and attitudes that are voluntarily adopted and cultivated as a matter of principle. For Kant each virtue and each vice has its own maxim (MM 6:404). This would be true even of wit or good memory, for example. Wit and good memory are certainly things that an agent might cultivate for the sake of her natural perfection. But for these traits to be considered Kantian virtues would require at least an agent’s morally grounded interest in and cultivation of them. But for Hume the agent’s reasons and her degree of voluntary control are irrelevant. Wit, good memory, and other “natural abilities” are virtues because of their power to please a properly situated spectator, even if they spring directly from a natural temperament over which the agent has no control (T–5). A third important contrast concerns justice. Justice is an immensely significant virtue for Hume, but is not treated by Kant as a virtue at all. For Kant, justice has primarily to do with one’s external treatment of others. As long as one does not hinder their freedom in a way that violates universal law or legitimate positive law, one complies with the demands of justice. One’s motive or attitude is irrelevant from the standpoint of justice. It is a matter not of justice itself, but of ethics, if one respects the rights of others not from fear of punishment but from respect for persons or law. The moral worth adhering to acting rightly out of respect for right is not part of justice, but of ethics; it is a matter of self-constraint or virtue. Hume’s treatment of justice reflects his distinction between artificial and natural virtues, but Kant would reject this distinction altogether. None of the virtues is either “artificial” or “natural” in Hume’s sense since none of them depends on social convention and none of them springs directly from human nature. Finally, their conceptions of moral vice are quite different. For Hume a vice is a mental quality that provokes disapproval from a judicious spectator. A person’s vices do not necessarily say anything about the quality of her will as a whole or her fundamental attitude toward the demands of morality. But Kant holds that vice is a propensity to act contrary to the moral law (Rel 6:37), and it implies a principled “contempt for moral laws” (C 27:463). As he puts it, “it is when an intentional transgression has become a principle that it is properly called a vice” (MM 6:390).

5. Freedom and Necessity

Hume and Kant both believe that freedom is essential to morality. Moreover, both believe that a philosophical theory and vindication of human morality requires reconciling freedom with universal causal necessity (determinism). However, they offer different conceptions of freedom, different ways of reconciling it with necessity, and different ways of understanding why this reconciliation matters for morality. Scholars agree that Hume is a “compatibilist”, but there is no consensus on the correct label for Kant’s position.

Hume defends compatibilism in section eight of Enquiry concerning Human Understanding and Book Two of the Treatise (2.3.1–2). In the Treatise, Hume distinguishes between two conceptions of freedom or liberty: “liberty of indifference” and “liberty of spontaneity”. According to the idea of indifference, liberty implies “a negation of necessity and causes” (T For illustration, consider the Anglican bishop John Bramhall’s claim that genuine liberty is “a liberty from necessity, or rather from necessitation, that is, a universal immunity from all inevitability and determination” (1645 [1999: 1]). On this view, a person is free when, and only when, her action is not necessitated by any antecedent causes. Hume rejects this idea as unintelligible (T and destructive to morality and religion (T By contrast, he characterizes spontaneity as that idea of liberty “which is oppos’d to violence” (T So the liberty of spontaneity is freedom from violence, but not freedom from necessity per se. “Violence” here refers to various forms of unwanted interference with the execution of one’s will, as when a person is forced to sign a document or locked in a cell from which she wants to escape. These are cases where we lack the liberty of spontaneity. But a person has such liberty whenever she is able to do what she wants to do. In such cases, her actions are causally necessitated, just like any other event in nature; but they are caused by motives that spring from her own character. According to Hume, this is the form of liberty at issue in religion, morality, law, and common life. Hence, spontaneity is the only form of liberty “which it concerns us to preserve” (T

The liberty of spontaneity, as just described, is perfectly compatible with causal necessity. There are two main reasons people often believe otherwise. First, we tend to conflate the two ideas of liberty. In cases where we enjoy the liberty of spontaneity, our experience suggests that we also enjoy something more. We recognize, of course, that “we were influenc’d by particular views and motives”, yet we find it difficult to “perswade ourselves we govern’d by necessity, and that ’twas utterly impossible for us to have acted otherwise” (T This is because “[w]e feel that our actions are subject to our will on most occasions, and imagine we feel that the will itself is subject to nothing” (T Yet this is a mistake explained by the blind spots of introspection. An outside observer, whether a friend or a scientist,

can commonly infer our actions from our motives and character; and even where he cannot, he concludes in general, that he might, were he perfectly acquainted with every circumstance of our situation and temper. (T

The second source of resistance to compatibilism stems from confusion about necessity. People are prone to think that necessity rules out liberty because they conflate necessity with compulsion or force. They believe that when A causes B, A compels or forces B. Hume holds that this is a mistake, however. Causal necessity is nothing more than the “constant conjunction” of similar objects and a customary inference of the mind from the one to the other (EHU 8.1.5). For example, experience shows that the vibration of a particular string is constantly conjoined with a particular sound. As a result, the mind develops the habit of immediately inferring the sound from the vibration (EHU 7.2.29). We believe that the sound is causally necessitated by the vibration, but the necessity is a product of the imagination, which associates the idea of the sound with the perception of the vibration. This feeling that there is a necessary connection between them is the whole of the matter (EHU 7.2.28). So defined, causal necessity no longer poses an obvious threat to liberty. It makes sense to follow Bramhall’s definition of liberty as “liberty from necessity” if one thinks that necessitation involves force or compulsion. But causes do not force or compel their effects. If one can accept this point, then a definition like Bramhall’s seems less tempting, and necessity per se no longer poses a threat to liberty. The only real threat is necessitation by external forces, as when a person is forced to do something she does not want to do.

Broadly speaking, the scholarship offers two ways of interpreting Hume’s compatibilism. According to the most common approach, Hume’s arguments concern the logic of the concepts at issue. On this reading, Hume analyzes the concepts of liberty and necessity in order to show that, properly understood, they do not conflict. We can be rationally justified in holding a person responsible for her action even though all human actions are caused. The only question is whether she, rather than some other person or external force, is the cause of her action. According to Paul Russell’s naturalist approach, however, Hume’s view is not primarily a piece of a priori reasoning about the logic of our concepts or the rational justification of attributions of moral responsibility. Above all it is an empirical explanation for why we sometimes feel that people are responsible for their conduct. Hume’s concern is with the cognitive processes that cause such attributions (Russell 1995: ch. 4). He starts with the occasions in common life when we hold people responsible for their behavior, and then asks, what happens in the mind on such occasions? On the standard reading, Hume’s treatment of liberty is a fairly self-contained set of compatibilist arguments, easily detached from his larger project. On the naturalist reading, it is deeply connected to his theory of the passions and moral judgment, which makes it an integral part of his “science of man”.

Hume claims that liberty, understood properly, is “essential to morality” (EHU 8.31). The above interpretations provide two different explanations for why this is the case. The standard approach says that Hume’s compatibilism is about the logic of our concepts and the justification of our judgments. Our judgments about responsibility entail judgments about the causal antecedents of action, and such judgments are consistent with determinism. On this view, the liberty of spontaneity is essential to morality because attributions of responsibility, which permeate morality (as well as law and religion), are unjust and unreasonable without it. According to the naturalist approach, liberty is essential for a different reason. The naturalist reading emphasizes that, on Hume’s view, attributions of responsibility are made via feelings of approval and disapproval, not judgments (T; Russell 1995: 60–4). They are, in his terminology, impressions or sentiments rather than ideas. These sentiments are partially caused by beliefs about the source of the behavior to which we are responding. We would not feel approval or disapproval unless we had been led to think of the person as the cause of the action. If we believed that her action was either compelled or uncaused, we would neither approve nor disapprove of her. Our responses or thoughts would be about something else. Hume’s claim, on the naturalist reading, is that in approving or disapproving of the agent—in feeling gratitude or resentment, for example—we hold her responsible, and in holding her responsible we believe that her conduct is free. Hume does not argue that the latter justifies attributions of responsibility. His claim is that it causally contributes to such attributions. They are made by means of feelings of approval and disapproval, which are are a core feature of human morality as we know it. Therefore, the idea of liberty, properly reconciled with necessity, is essential to morality.

Like Hume, Kant seeks to reconcile freedom with a commitment to causal determinism. Yet the two philosophers operate with different conceptions of causal necessity and very different ideas about the nature of freedom. For present purposes, it is important to focus on the main difference between their conceptions of freedom. Hume concentrates on the liberty of spontaneity, the only idea of freedom “which it concerns us to preserve”. His treatment looks downstream from the will to its execution in action. A person has liberty when her action is caused by her will, which Hume equates with an occurrent motive or desire (T The question of what ultimately moves the will is irrelevant. Such causes are found in the person’s character and circumstances, and they determine her will with the same necessity that determines everything else in nature. Kant, by contrast, looks upstream to what determines the will: “It is here a question only of the determination of the will and of the determining ground of its maxims as a free will, not of its result” in bodily action (CPrR 5:45). One way of putting it is to say that Hume’s account concerns the freedom of action, while Kant’s concerns freedom of the will. Both are concerned with the freedom of the person or agent, but Kant thinks the person is not truly free unless her will is free. This is the first point about the main difference between Kant and Hume.

The second point is that Kant, unlike Hume, believes that the will is not free unless it can be determined by pure reason. This is why he repeatedly insists that the main question concerning freedom is whether pure reason “can be an immediate determining ground of the will, that is, of the causality of a rational being with respect to the reality of objects” (CPrR 5:44–45). Furthermore, Kant holds that this is a question of whether the will can be determined “independently of anything empirical” (CPrR 5:42). For when pure reason determines the will, the latter’s “ground” must be found in “the intelligible order of things” rather than in empirical order (CPrR 5:49). This is why Kant thinks that “the concept of a being that has free will” involves the concept of a “noumenal” cause (CPrR 5:55). Note that this is not obviously equivalent to what Hume calls the liberty of indifference, which implies a complete absence of causes or necessitation. Free will, on Kant’s view, is not quite what Bramhall calls “liberty from necessitation”. On the contrary, Kant seems to think that the will is free if, and only if, it is necessitated. But it must be necessitated by the right sort of thing and in the right way: namely, by pure reason rather than by an antecedent event whose causal impact on the will could be described by an empirical law. That is, the will is free if and only if can be determined by pure reason, which lies outside the realm governed by empirical laws.

This conception of freedom has profound implications for the task of reconciling freedom with causal determinism. Kant maintains that all events, including human actions, are causally determined by antecedent events in accordance with empirical laws. But he also seeks to show that this does not rule out free will (A536–537/B564-565). On the contrary, one and the same event can be both “a mere effect of nature” but also an “effect of freedom” (A543/B571). Kant demonstrates this possibility by distinguishing between two different “worlds” and arguing that we belong to both. On the one hand, we belong to the “phenomenal” world, where all our actions can be explained in terms of antecedent events (whether physical or psychological). On the other hand, considered as a “thing in itself”, each of us belongs to the “noumenal” world, which is not subject to “the temporal order in accord with empirical laws” (A534/B562). We cannot know whether we actually belong to the noumenal world, but Kant’s theoretical philosophy secures room for this possibility, and his moral philosophy tries to show that when we become aware of morality’s categorical demands, we think of ourselves as members of this noumenal or “intelligible world” (G 4:457-58). With this line of thought, Kant seeks to reconcile freedom and natural necessity by means of his transcendental idealism. Indeed, the question of whether natural necessity rules out freedom is a “transcendental problem” and only transcendental philosophy can solve it (A535/B563, A557/B585). The appeal to transcendental idealism is controversial, of course. Some scholars of Kant’s ethics understand him to be making a metaphysical (or ontological) claim when he distinguishes between noumenal and phenomenal worlds (e.g. McCarty 2009). Others understand Kant to be distinguishing between only different standpoints we take, identifying the noumenal world with the practical standpoint that we take when we think of ourselves as autonomous, responsible beings, and the phenomenal world with the theoretical standpoint we take when we think of ourselves as part of the natural, deterministic, empirical world (see Beck 1960: 191–94; Korsgaard 1996a, esp. chs. 6–7). There are concerns about both. Many find the notion of two worlds metaphysically cumbersome; but others question whether the two standpoints approach is adequate for transcendental and practical freedom. (See Irwin 1984, esp. 37–38; Allison 1990; Guyer 1992: 103–107; and Wood 2005a: 99–100.)

Kant has a number of reasons for thinking that freedom is essential to morality. First, freedom is necessary for moral responsibility. When we hold a person responsible for blameworthy conduct, for example, we “impute” the ability to have refrained from such conduct and blame the person for her failure to exercise this ability properly. The judgment of “blame is grounded on the law of reason, which regards reason as a cause that… could have and ought to have determined the conduct of the person to be other than it is” (A555/B583). Second, Kant holds that “what is essential to any moral worth of actions is that the moral law determine the will immediately” (CPrR 5:71). If a person’s will were necessitated by her circumstances and empirical character, as Hume maintains, it would be impossible to respond properly to the moral law, which demands a kind of purity of thought and motive that Hume would not countenance. Third, freedom is essential to morality in that freedom is the ground of a special status or “dignity” that morality commands us to respect in ourselves and others. One important but unorthodox line of interpretation suggests a fourth reason for thinking that freedom is essential to morality. According to this view, Kant holds (in at least some places) that freedom is our most fundamental value, the source from which all other moral value derives. This is “the real bedrock of Kant’s moral thought” (Guyer 2000: 203). On this view, in fact, we are commanded to obey the moral law because it “is the necessary means for the realization of human freedom” (Guyer 2016: 38).

When comparing Hume and Kant, it is a mistake to ask simply which philosopher has the best account of freedom or does the best job of reconciling freedom and necessity. They disagree about both causal necessity and the question of which idea of freedom “it concerns us to preserve”. As a result, they focus on somewhat different topics. Hume concentrates on what happens downstream from the will, that is, on how motives determine action. But Kant’s attention is focused on what happens upstream—on the question of what determines the will. It seems fair to say that from Kant’s perspective, Hume’s notion of liberty is thin gruel, no better than “the freedom of a turnspit” (CPrR 5:97) or the freedom exhibited by a self-moving clock (CPrR 5:96). It also seems fair to say that from Hume’s perspective, Kant’s notion of free will looks, at best, like a misguided fiction. One important question is whether morality requires the sort of freedom Kant has in mind. Hume would deny that it does, but this is partly because his view of morality itself is so different from Kant’s. The issue here is not just about free will. It is about which conception of morality is most plausible. If Kant has convincing grounds for insisting on the unique nature of moral obligation or judgments of “moral worth”, this puts some pressure on Hume to take Kant’s notion of free will more seriously. Another important question is how to interpret Kant’s actual position, which is the subject of controversy. Standard textbooks classify Kant as a libertarian (incompatibilist) about free will, but those who study Kant most intensively often disagree about the nature of his view. Some argue that Kant offers a form of incompatibilism (e.g., Pereboom 2006; Allison 1990; Watkins 2005), while others maintain that he is some sort of compatibilist, however unorthodox (e.g., Bennett 1984; Hudson 1994). According to one very influential interpretation, Kant endorses “not only the compatibility of freedom and determinism, but also the compatibility of compatibilism and incompatibilism” (Wood 1984: 74). These scholarly debates bear on the question of how Kant’s view compares to Hume’s, as does the question of whether the naturalist or traditional interpretation best captures Hume’s own position. Finally, when comparing Kant and Hume on the question of freedom, one must recognize that there is a modest and skeptical side to Kant’s view that Hume would applaud. For Kant, free will is an “inscrutable faculty” (CPrR 5:47), whose operations lie beyond the reach of human cognition. It is impossible to know whether we actually have free will (CPrR 5:72; G 4:459). Indeed, Kant’s significant debt to Hume is evident in his claim that “all human insight is at an end as soon as we have arrived at basic powers or basic faculties” (CPrR 5:46).

6. Religion and Morality

Reflections on religion and concern with religious themes can be found in the majority of Hume’s and Kant’s major works. Their treatments of the subject differ significantly, but they have a few important things in common, especially on the question of how religion relates to morality. Above all, both philosophers advocate a secularized approach to moral philosophy. That is, both argue for the independence of morality from religion and the importance of keeping the two distinct. They both express deep concern about the corrupting influence of false religion, including “enthusiasm” and “superstition”. And they both seek to undermine a good deal of Christian theology, including traditional arguments for the existence of God. There are also important areas of disagreement, however. Generally speaking, Hume is far more alert to religion’s potential costs, such as intolerance, violence, and distraction from whatever happiness is available in this life. Kant, by contrast, seems far more attuned to the benefits of religion, especially its attempts to address the perhaps unavoidable need for ultimate answers or consolation in the face of death and suffering.

On Hume’s view, the foundation of morality has nothing to do with God. This is evident from his distinctive version of sentimentalism. He argues that morality, much like our aesthetic responses to beauty, is “founded entirely on the peculiar fabric and constitution of the human species” (EPM 1.3). This claim is made in the context of arguing against a form of moral rationalism that locates the foundation of morality in immutable truths discoverable by reason (Schneewind 2010). Against rationalists like Samuel Clarke, Hume claims that morality is a distinctly and entirely human phenomenon; there are no grounds for believing that human beings exist in any kind of moral community with God or that God is answerable to the moral norms that bind us (Schneewind 2010). For present purposes, there are two additional points to appreciate. First, Hume’s claim entails a rejection of the idea that moral distinctions between good and evil are instituted by divine command, as argued by voluntarists such as Pufendorf, Luther, or Calvin. Second, Hume’s version of the above claim differs from the version found in Hutcheson. On Hutcheson’s view, human nature is essentially good and its goodness reflects the wisdom and benevolence of God. When we behave virtuously, we further the purposes for which we were created. Hume, by contrast, rejects Hutcheson’s equation of the natural with the good (T, and he rejects his predecessor’s underlying teleology (Gill 2006: 194–208).

Hume frequently draws attention to the moral and political costs of religion. He never argues that religion is inherently destructive, but he consistently claims that it tends to distort and corrupt morality. Were it not for religion’s influence, Hume claims, we would never approve of qualities such as “celibacy, fasting, penance, mortification, self-denial, humility, silence, solitude, and the whole train of monkish virtues” (EPM 9.1.3). The “delusive glosses of superstition and false religion” can cause us to approve of such qualities despite the fact that they are neither useful nor agreeable (EPM 9.1.3). Similarly, Hume emphasizes the difference between moral and religious sources of motivation. When a person pays a debt or restores a loan, for example,

his divinity is nowise beholden to him; because these acts of justice are what he was bound to perform, and what many would have performed, were there no god in the universe. But if he fast a day, or give himself a sound whipping; this has a direct reference, in his opinion, to the service of God. No other motive could engage him to such austerities. (NHR 14.6)

Hume often blames these distortions of morality on particular forms of Christianity, such as Catholicism and sectarian offshoots of Calvinism and Lutheranism. But in some places Hume comes close to faulting any religion that represents God as “infinitely superior to mankind” (NHR 10.2), arguing that, “[t]he more tremendous the divinity is represented, the more tame and submissive do men become to his ministers” (NHR 14.8). He clearly believes that monotheistic religions tend to focus human attention on the one God rather than on the enjoyment of life on earth. Monotheism also tends to promote intolerance, factionalism, and even violence.

Like Hume, Kant holds that the foundation of morality is independent of religion. The main difference between them is that Hume locates that foundation in human nature, while Kant —depending on the interpretation—locates it in the structure of practical reason, the nature of rational beings, or the supreme value of freedom. On Kant’s view, morality is not only independent of religion; it is also more fundamental. One way that he gives priority to morality is by arguing that belief in God follows from a moral commitment, and denying that recognition of the moral law follows from or must be grounded in recognition of God’s authority. A second way in which Kant treats morality as fundamental is by denying that we have any duties to God. All that God commands us to do is what morality requires: our duties to ourselves and others. A third point is that Kant insists that children not be taught about religion until they are familiar with basic moral concepts and principles; otherwise, they may think, for example, that the reason one should act rightly is to hope for God’s favor and to avoid God’s punishment. He argues that Christianity is superior to other ecclesiastical faiths because of the centrality of ethics within it from its inception (Rel 6:167). But all ecclesiastical faiths are liable to corruption, and none is the ideal form for religion to take. Ideally, we will dispense with distinct ecclesiastical faiths, along with their revealed texts and doctrinal statutes and observances, in favor of a universal, pure religion of reason, dedicated to morality.

While Kant holds that morality’s foundation is independent of religion, the two are more closely connected for him than they are for Hume. Compared with Hume, Kant is far less antagonistic to religion, and he consistently tries to preserve a place for religious belief within the strictures of his moral philosophy. Indeed, this is an important aspect of his approach to morality. Kant’s “moral theism” is one of his most significant contributions to the philosophy of religion and the question of religion’s relation to morality. Moral theism is belief in God founded on morality. By belief (or faith) [Glaube], Kant means something different from knowledge [Wissen] (A 822/B 850; WOT 8:140–41). Believing and knowing both involve holding something to be true. When one knows something, one holds it to be true on grounds that are “subjectively and objectively” sufficient, whereas when one believes something, one holds it to be true on grounds that are subjectively but not objectively sufficient (A 822/B 850). Here, Kant takes objective sufficiency to imply valid theoretical grounds, such as evidence or theoretical argument; he takes subjective sufficiency, by contrast, to imply valid practical grounds. Thus, belief entails having valid practical reasons for holding something to be true, while lacking valid theoretical reasons for doing so. Indeed, when it comes to belief in God, Kant does not think that knowledge is possible (CPJ 5:471–72).

Kant’s position contains a distinctly moral conception of God. In addition to the attributes of omniscience, omnipresence, and omnipotence, he ascribes to God the moral attributes of holiness, benevolence, and justice (LPDR 28:1073–74). God is not only author and executor of the moral law, but also as its “personification” (C 27:322; V 27:530, 723; LPDR 28:1076, 1091). Kant says that all moral requirements can be seen as divine commands (CPrR 5:129; Rel 6:153). God knows and cares about our virtue and well-being. In particular, he cares about the realization of the highest good, in which people attain maximal virtue and, consequently, maximal happiness. This is a God who has created the world, has incorporated morality into the world, and has a moral plan for the world (CPrR 5:125; CPJ 5:450). Belief in God allows us to retain our faith that some of our moral actions will produce the intended good consequences, and that if we strive our best to promote the highest good, God will complete the task (C 27:310, 321–22; CPJ 5:450–53; Rel 6:74–77, 192, 201–202).

The relation between God and the highest good is the basis of Kant’s main argument for belief in God. (See Wood 1970.) The argument, most clearly articulated in the Critique of Practical Reason, goes like this (CPrR 5:110–14, 124–46). The moral law issues categorical demands through each agent’s own reason. If the moral law sets forth an end for us to promote, we must promote it. For our promotion of this end to be rational, the end must be one that we can rationally view as possible for us to promote through our own agency. The moral law gives rise to the highest good (i.e., virtue and conditioned, proportionate happiness), as practical reason’s ultimate end. Thus, we must promote it. Yet it is not clear that we are capable of effecting the highest good, given the limitations of our agency and the conditions and workings of the natural world. If the realization of the highest good is not possible, however, then we cannot rationally promote it as an end; indeed, we cannot even make sense of it as an end. But if we do not promote the highest good, we flout the moral law. Now, suppose that there were a supreme, eternal, all powerful, all knowing ruler of the universe (i.e., God); he could bring to completion our imperfect strivings for the highest good. Thus, if we postulate the existence of God, we can view the highest good as possible, and can rationally follow morality’s command to promote it. There is no reason not to postulate God’s existence, since his non-existence cannot be proven, and since belief in him does not conflict with any necessary beliefs (CPrR 5:135–43). In addition, since belief in God is necessary for seeing the highest good as possible, we must believe in God (CPrR 5:125–26, 142–46). Thus, belief in God is grounded in the necessity of seeing the highest good as possible, and so for the rational compliance with morality. Thus, Kant says that belief in God is morally necessary, and that morality leads ineluctably to religion (CPrR 5:125). We do not, however, have a duty to believe in God. Postulating God’s existence is a theoretical exercise of reason, which cannot be morally commanded (CPrR 5:125, 144). Rather, our duty to promote the highest good gives rise to “a need of reason” to assume the possibility of the highest good. From this need emerges the necessity of postulating God’s existence.

Kant’s practical argument differs profoundly from the speculative arguments for God’s existence popular in Kant’s day–i.e., ontological, cosmological, and physiotheological proofs. His moral argument grounds the necessity of believing in God in each person’s practical reason, required to “orient ourselves in thinking” (WOT 8:136–37). According to Kant, belief in God is “a postulate of pure practical reason”: “a theoretical proposition which is not as such demonstrable, but which is an inseparable corollary of an a priori unconditionally valid practical law” (CPrR 5:122). Although practical arguments cannot provide knowledge of God’s existence, they can provide “moral certainty” of God’s existence (A 828–30/B 856–58; CPrR 5:134, 143; LPDR 28:1011–12). Such moral certainty is stronger than the sort of confidence one could obtain from any theoretical argument.

Hume’s influence on Kant regarding the intersection of religion and morality is evident, though difficult to measure. It is also hard to tell how much of the influence came directly from Hume’s writings. Hume is not often cited regarding religion in Kant’s major works. Kant’s Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion, however, suggest familiarity with Hume’s Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion, a work which Kant could have read in its entirety in 1781 (Wood 1978: 14–15), and perhaps in part when it first came out, since Hamann translated the first and last parts of it for him (Kuehn 2001: 121). Kant explicitly discusses Hume’s Dialogues in the section on the physiotheological proof, which is what Kant calls the argument from design (see LPDR 28:1063–4). Furthermore, in the Danzig manuscript of these lectures, Kant cites Hume within his argument against the cosmotheological proof (Ak 28:1266; Wood 1978: 83n31). Kant was clearly also familiar with Hume’s The Natural History of Religion. In “A History of Natural Theology, according to Meiners’ Historia doctrinae de uno vero Deo”, Kant refers briefly to Hume’s account of polytheists as tolerant in section 9 of The Natural History of Religion (LPDR 28:1125).

Finally, it is interesting to note that many philosophers and other intellectuals in Königsberg in the late 1750s and early 1760s seem to have attributed to Hume a view of religion that has something significant in common with Kant’s mature view. Hamann and others saw Hume’s skepticism as necessary for purging religion of its poor arguments and traditional associations, and clearing the way for true religion. One source for this view of Hume is the conclusion of book I of the Treatise, which Hamann translated into German (with some alterations and excisions to hide its origin) and published anonymously in 1771 under the title “Night Thoughts of a Sceptic” (Kuehn 2001: 198–201). Another source is the end of the Dialogues, where Philo says, “To be a philosophical skeptic is, in a man of letters, the first and most essential step towards being a sound, believing Christian” (DR 89). This statement is out of line with Philo’s previous assertions and arguments, and comes as a surprise at this point in the the text. Some take Hume to be arguing here that once a person has rid themselves of philosophically suspect rational justifications for belief in God, he is free to embrace religion based simply on faith. At least this seems to be how Hamann interprets Hume. Kant, of course is no fideist, for he does not take a leap of faith based on revealed religion to be the proper ground for belief in God. Still, Kant does endorse the notion that when one clears away the fallacious or at least inadequate metaphysical arguments for the existence of God found in philosophical theology, one is able to see that morality itself offers an argument for God’s existence which both allows for (moral) certainty and addresses people in a moving, concrete way.


Primary Sources

Hume, David

Hume’s main works of moral philosophy are the following.

  • [EPM] An Enquiry concerning the Principles of Morals, Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1998. [Originally published in 1751.] (Cited as according to section, part [if any], and paragraph number.)
  • [T]A Treatise of Human Nature: A Critical Edition, David Fate Norton and Mary J. Norton (eds.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007. [Originally published in 1739–1740.] (Cited according to book, part, section, and paragraph number.)

Many of Hume’s other works are also relevant to his moral philosophy. We cite or discuss the following.

  • [DR]Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion in Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion and the Posthumous Essays “Of the Immortality of the Soul” and “Of Suicide”, Richard H. Popkin (ed.), Indianapolis: The Hackett Publishing Company, 1980. [Originally published in 1779.] (Cited according to part [in Roman numerals] or page number [in Arabic numerals].)
  • [EHU]An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding, Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.), Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1999. [Originally published in 1748.] (Cited according to section, part [if any], and paragraph number.)
  • [EMPL]Essays Moral, Political, and Literary, Eugene Miller (ed.), Indianapolis: Liberty Fund, 1985. Two essays are cited according to page number: “Of Superstition and Enthusiasm”, pp. 73–79 [Originally published in 1741] and “Of the Immortality of the Soul”, pp. 590–98. [Originally published in 1777.]
  • [NHR]The Natural History of Religion in David Hume: A Dissertation on the Passions; The Natural History of Religion, Tom L. Beauchamp (ed.), Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2007. [Originally published in 1757.] (Cited according to page number.)

Kant, Immanuel

Unless noted otherwise, we cite the pagination (beginning with volume number) of the Akademie Ausgabe edition of Kants gesammelte Schriften, Berlin: Walter de Gruyter, 1900–. This pagination can be found in the margins of most scholarly English translations, including The Cambridge Edition of the Works of Immanuel Kant, Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992–.

Kant’s main works of moral philosophy are the following.

  • [CPrR]Critique of Practical Reason, in Practical Philosophy, Mary J. Gregor (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1788.]
  • [G]Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, in Practical Philosophy, Mary J. Gregor (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1785.]
  • [MM]The Metaphysics of Morals, in Practical Philosophy, Mary J. Gregor (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1797.]

Many other works are also relevant to Kant’s moral philosophy. We cite or discuss the following.

  • [I] Inquiry concerning the distinctness of the principles of natural theology and morality in Theoretical Philosophy: 1755-1770, David Walford and Ralf Meerbote (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. [Originally published in 1763.]
  • [WS] M. Immanuel Kant’s Announcement of the Programme of His Lectures for the Winter Semester 1765-1766, in in Theoretical Philosophy: 1755-1770, David Walford and Ralf Meerbote (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002.
  • [Ant]Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, Robert B. Louden (trans.), in Anthropology, History, and Education, Günter Zöller and Robert B. Louden (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. [Originally published in 1798.]
  • [CPJ]Critique of the Power of Judgment, Paul Guyer (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2000. [Originally published in 1790.]
  • [A], [B]Critique of Pure Reason, Paul Guyer and Allen W. Wood (trans., eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1988. ([A] citations refer to the pagination of the first edition of 1781 and [B] citations refer to the pagination of the second edition of 1787.)
  • [H], [C], [M], [V]Lectures on Ethics, Peter Heath (trans., ed.) and J.B. Schneewind (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997. [Translation based on material published in the Akademie Ausgabe from 1974–1980.] ([H] citations refer to lecture transcriptions attributed to Herder, circa 1762–1764; [C] to Collins, circa 1774–1777; [M] to Mrongovius in 1784–1785; and [V] to Vigilantius, in 1793–1794.
  • [LPDR]Lectures on the Philosophical Doctrine of Religion, Allen W. Wood (trans.), in Religion and Rational Theology, Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1817, second edition 1830, reflecting lectures most likely from 1783–1784.]
  • [NF]Notes and Fragments, Curtis Brown (trans.), Frederick Rauscher (trans.), and Paul Guyer (trans., ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005. [Translation based primarily on Kant’s handwritten remains from the 1750s through the 1790s, contained in Akademie Ausgabe volumes published 1913-1934.] (Citations include reflection number in addition to volume and page number.)
  • [OFBS]Observations on the Feeling of the Beautiful and Sublime, Paul Guyer (trans.), in Anthropology, History, and Education, Günter Zöller and Robert B. Louden (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007. [Originally published in 1764.]
  • [OPA]The Only Possible Argument in Support of a Demonstration of the Existence of God, David Walford (trans.), in Theoretical Philosophy: 1755-1770, David Walford and Ralf Meerbote (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. [Originally published in 1763.]
  • [OP]Opus Postumum, Ekart Förster (trans., ed.) and Michael Rosen (trans.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993. [Translation based on material written primarily circa 1796–1801 and published in the Akademie Ausgabe in 1936 and 1938.]
  • [Prol]Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics That Will Be Able to Come Forward as a Science, Gary Hatfield (trans.), in Theoretical Philosophy after 1781, Henry Allison and Peter Heath (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. [Originally published in 1783.]
  • [Rel]Religion within the Boundaries of Mere Reason, George di Giovani (trans.) in Religion and Rational Theology, Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1793.]
  • [WOT]“What does it mean to orient oneself in thinking?”, Allen W. Wood (trans.) in Religion and Rational Theology, Allen W. Wood and George di Giovanni (eds.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996. [Originally published in 1786.]

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