Notes to Foundationalist Theories of Epistemic Justification

1. Foundational knowledge or justified belief has also been called by foundationalists direct knowledge (justification), immediate knowledge, intuitive knowledge (justification); and the truths known have been referred to as self-evident truths, directly evident truths, self-presenting truths, and the given. This last locution “the given” is, however, ambiguous as between truths that are said to be known directly and facts or features of the world that are said to be immediately “before” consciousness.

2. Various contemporary views hold that justification is the more fundamental concept—our understanding of knowledge depends upon our understanding of justification—and we will continue to suppose that this is the case. It should be noted, however, that some have argued that knowledge is the more fundamental concept, and that various other epistemic concepts are best understood in terms of knowledge. In a highly influential book, Timothy Williamson (2000) argues that knowledge is unanalyzable and that our evidence simply consists in everything we know. Justification may have foundations but only because we end a regress of justification with propositions that are known; the evidential foundation on which all justified belief rests is knowledge (2000: 186).

3. Something like this motivation for PIJ is one that many internalists about epistemic justification are likely to offer, and, as we mention in our discussion of the internalist-externalist debate, externalists tend to deny the PIJ. It is worth noting, however, that there is no logical inconsistency in combining externalism about epistemic justification with PIJ. Externalists who accept PIJ can coherently go on to disagree with the internalist about how to understand justification. They may disagree with the access internalist, for example, about whether justification for some proposition, including one that expresses a probability relation, requires access to further reasons in favor of that proposition.

4. For present purposes let us construe entailment broadly so that P may be said to entail Q if P formally, analytically or synthetically entails Q.

5. For a more detailed account and defense of an acquaintance theory of noninferential justification see Fumerton (1995). BonJour, once one of the leading coherence theorists of empirical justification, has recently moved to a version of the acquaintance theory of justification. See BonJour (2000).

6. Most of what we say here is based on the early seminal paper “What is Justified Belief”. Goldman’s view changed quite dramatically in his book Epistemology and Cognition, but shortly after publishing the book he returned to the earlier account for at least one conception of justification (strong justification). See Goldman (1988).

7. We shall not concern ourselves with the difficulties that reliabilists face defining the relevant notion of reliability—as these few remarks might indicate, reliabilists will inevitably move beyond actual frequencies and turn to propensities or counterfactuals in defining the concept of a reliable belief-producing process.

8. See, for example, Armstrong’s (1973) account of direct knowledge. Though more complicated that a causal theory of knowledge, Nozick’s (1981) “tracking” account of knowledge also allows a distinction between beliefs which noninferentially track facts and beliefs which inferentially track facts.

Copyright © 2016 by
Ali Hasan <>
Richard Fumerton

This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.
Please note that some links may no longer be functional.
[an error occurred while processing this directive]