Notes to Implicature

1. Grice 1961: §3; 1975: 24; Harnish 1976: 328–9; Levinson 1983: 97; Leech 1983: 9; Neale 1992: 519, 528; Horn 2003: 382; 2004: 4; W. Davis 2007a; Huang 2014: 31. Bach and Relevance theorists define “implicature” more narrowly (see §13 below). Saul and Green adopt a normative definition (§9). Braun (2011) uses “implicature” more generally, to include indirect speech acts generated not by saying that something is the case, but by asking a question or giving an order, as when A asks “How do you feel?” and B answers “How do I look?”, thereby meaning that he feels terrible by asking how he looks. He also uses the “implicature” for cases in which speakers raise questions by making statements (cf. Arseneault 2018: 180).

2. An implicature is sometimes defined briefly as something meant but not said, omitting the connection between the saying and the meaning (e.g., Allott 2018: 3). This would literally cover malapropisms, however, as when Yogi Berra uttered “Texas has a lot of electrical votes”. What he meant was not what he said. But Yogi would not be described as having implicated that Texas has a lot of electoral votes. He meant that by uttering the sentence, but not by saying that Texas has a lot of electrical votes. He said that by accident.

3. See Grice 1975: 87ff; Harnish 1976: 332ff; Bach 1994; Levinson 2000: 170ff; Petrus 2010: §7; Horn 2010: §4.

4. See Alston 2000: 116–120; Hindriks 2007: 400; Jary 2010: 15–16; Pagin 2011: 123; 2007 [2016]; Stokke 2013: 49. Grice (1968: 120; 1969: 87) idiosyncratically took saying that p to entail meaning that p, conflating saying with stating. Grice (1975: 34) nonetheless reverted to the ordinary sense of “say” when he discusses irony and other figures of speech (§9).

5. See Meibauer 2005: 1381; Fallis 2009: 33; 2012: 569; Horn 2010: §4; 2017; Saul 2012.; Stokke 2013; Mueller 2019: 191.

6. See, e.g., Grice 1975: 31; Sperber & Wilson 1981; Levinson 2000, Recanati 2002; Wilson & Sperber 2012: 5; and §§14–15 below.

7. Grice 1975: 25; Karttunen & Peters 1979; Levinson 1983: 127; Leech 1983: 11; Neale 1992: 523–9; Horn 2003: 383; 2004: 4; 2008: §6; Potts 2005; 2007; Huang 2014: §2.5.

8. Bach (1999; 2006: §10) maintains that alleged conventional implicatures are things said, not implicated. Applied to (3), Bach’s argument starts from the observation that saying that the queen is English and therefore brave is “more than” saying that the queen is English and brave. He infers that the former includes saying that being brave follows from being English. W. Davis (2016a: 57) replies that while saying [3a] (unlike saying [3b]) entails meaning [3c], it does not entail saying [3c]. Speakers implicate [3c] because they mean [3c] by saying [3a]. Hence Grice (1961: §3) never should have claimed that the implicature of (3a) is “detachable” from what is said. See also Karttunen & Peters 1979: 11–16; Levinson 1983: 128; Horn 1989: 145; 1996: 310; Potts 2005: 6–10, 30, 39, 142, 214; 2007: 673; Abbott 2006: 5, 12.

9. Beginning with Strawson (1952), a number of inequivalent technical definitions of “presupposition” have been offered, making it difficult to compare what different authors are saying. See Beaver & Geurts 2011 [2014] for a survey. Whether the conversational implicatures triggered by therefore and appositives satisfy any of these definitions should be regarded as an open question.

10. Focusing on Grice’s particular examples, many use “conventional implicature” more narrowly, so that it coincides with “presupposition” in the everyday sense. See, e.g., Huang 2014: §2.5. In this usage, the implicature of factives is neither conventional nor conversational. The same authors tend to say that conventional implicatures are “non-truthconditional” content, inspired perhaps by Grice’s (1975: 25) comment “I do not want to say that my utterance of this sentence [(3)] would be, strictly speaking, false should the consequence in question fail to hold”. (Cf. Karttunen & Peters 1979: 11–2; Abbott 2006: 3–5.) But a statement like Tom cheated again is clearly true only if Tom cheated before. So the conversational implicature is a truth condition (Abbott 2006: fn. 4). What is subject to debate is whether the statement is false as well as improper if its presupposition is false.

11. See also earlier editions of this entry. A related claim is that a conventional implicature is part of the sentence meaning.

12. See Stalnaker 1973, 1974; Grice 1981, Kripke 1977, Bezuidenhout 2010, Simons 2001, and Sennett 2018: §1

13. See also Searle 1975: 274: G. M. Green 1975; 1987: 107; Morgan 1978; Horn 1989: 29, 344, 347–349; Wierzbicka 1987; Bach 1995; Levinson 2000: 23–4; van Rooy 2004; Stainton & Viger 2018: 19–20. For analyses of the applicable sense of convention and further references, see Lewis 1969, W. Davis 2003: Ch. 9, van Rooy 2004: §5.2, Lepore & Stone 2015: §5.3, §6.1, Ch. 16; Rescorla 2007 [2019]. While Lewis’s work was seminal in understanding how conventions could be something other than agreements, his highly idealized game-theoretic definition is too strong even for lexical conventions (see, e.g., Glanzberg 2018).

14. See also Chierchia 2004: 51. Contrast Wilson & Sperber 2004: 625, Carston 2004a: 72; 2004b: 648, and other Relevance theorists, who maintain that all implicatures are inferred by the same context-driven process. See Breheny et. al. 2006 for attempts to decide between these theses experimentally.

15. See, e.g., Grice 1975: 39; Neale 1992: 528–9; Huang 2014: 75.

16. See W. Davis 1998: 6; 2007b: 411; Carston 2002: 139; Bach 2006: 24. Contrast Grice 1975: 39.

17. See McKay 1981; Berg 1988, 1998; Geurts 1998: §6.

18. See, e.g., Grice 1978: 43–4; 1981: 270–2; Levinson 2000: 137–42 and passim; Huang 2014: 38–54. Some authors restrict the term “implicature” to speaker implicature (e.g., Horn 2004: 3–4; Bach 2006; Braun 2011).

19. On W. Davis’s (2016a: 69) attempt to define sentence implicature in terms of speaker implicature, a sentence s implicates I iff there is a distinctive declarative form F and function f such that s is an instance of F, I is f(s), and speakers conventionally use a sentence “p” with form F to mean or imply f(“p”) by saying that p. Forms may be defined by semantic as well as syntactic features. What an utterance implicates is generally equated with what the speaker implicates rather than what the sentence implicates.

20. Studies have shown comprehension and production as early as age three for metaphor and relevance implicatures, and four for quantity implicature. See Gardner et. al. 1978; Winner 1988; Pearson 1990; Pouscoulous et. al. 2007; Schulze, Grassmann, & Tomasello 2013; Kennison 2014: 170. Comprehension of indirect requests has been found in two year olds (Bates 1976: Ch. VIII).

21. See Grice 1978: 44; Sperber & Wilson 1986b; Bezuidenhout 2001: 167–9; W. Davis 2007b; Wilson & Sperber 2012: 19, 54. Note that even though Mike did not mean that dinner will be served at 6:00, he did mean “6:00” by “six o’clock”, which is why he said that dinner will be served at 6:00. On this kind of speaker meaning, see Ziff 1967: 446, Schiffer 1972: 2–3, and W. Davis 2003: §2.2.

22. See Ichikawa 2017 for a comprehensive survey of contextualist theories of knowledge claims.

23. Emphasize some and all and give them different pitches.

24. Cf. Sadock 1974: 97–98 Grice 1975: 39, 43, 58; Cole 1975: §viii; Morgan 1978: 250; Brown & Levinson 1978: 221, 265–267; Cowie, Mackin, & McCaig 1983: xii; Cruse 1986: 44; Anttila 1989: 38, 137–146; Traugott & König 1991; Hopper & Traugott 1993: 75–93; W. Davis 2016a: §6.6.

25. I believe ground zero is still at this stage, but it may already have become an idiom. Metaphors are not the only implicatures that transform into meanings. For example, go to the bathroom was originally a euphemism (Sadock 1978: 369). Brand names like aspirin often acquire generic meanings after loose use (Wilson & Sperber 2012: 19).

26. See Grice 1975: 30–31; 1978: 41; 1981: 271; Harnish 1976: 333, R. Lakoff 1977: 99; Brown & Levinson 1978: 63; Bach & Harnish 1979: xvii, 6; Atlas 1979: 272; Levinson 1983: 113; 2000: 15; G. M. Green 1989: 93–97; Hirschberg 1991: 16–24; Blakemore 1992: 126, 137; Neale 1992: 527; M. S. Green 1995: 98; 2002: 244; Saul 2010: 170. For antecedents to Grice, see Hungerland 1960.

27. Grice 1975: 31. See also Boër & Lycan 1973: 498–505; Searle 1975: 267; Harnish 1976: 333–6; Morgan 1978: 246, 250, 252; R. Lakoff 1977: 99; Sadock 1978: 368; 1981: 258, 261–262; Gazdar 1979: 41–42; Bach & Harnish 1979: 169, 171; Atlas 1979: 273, 276; 1989: 139–140; Grice 1975: 31; 1981: 187; Nunberg 1981: 201, 207–208; Leech 1983: 11, 17, 24–25, 30–31, 44, 153, 172; Horn 1984: 13; 1989: 383; 1992: 260–262; Levinson 1983: 100, 113–114, 117; 2000: 15; Neale 1992: 527; M. S. Green 1995: esp. §3; Meibauer 2006: 569; Huang 2014: 41.

28. Some authors do use “calculability” to mean “inferability from linguistic meaning” (e.g., Simons 2017: 469; see also the Relevance theorists in §12 and §13).

29. It is not clear why Grice’s formulation of the steps of the working out schema corresponding to the Cooperative Presumption and Mutual Knowledge differ somewhat from the wording of the Theoretical Definition.

30. See Grice 1975: 28, 38; 1989: 370; Stalnaker 1974: 476; Searle 1975: 266; Harnish 1976: 330, 332; Sadock 1978: 366; McCawley 1978: 245; Bach & Harnish 1979: 167, 169, 171; Gazdar 1979: 51; Levinson 1983: 99–100; Leech 1983: 9, 91–2; Lycan 1984: 75–76; Martinich 1984: 510; Thomason 1990: 330, 350, 352, 355–7; Horn 2004: 8.

31. Grice 1978: 47–8. See also Ziff 1960: 44; Stalnaker 1974: 475; Kempson 1975: 142; Searle 1975: 269; McCawley 1978: 257–258; Sadock 1981: 258; Atlas & Levinson 1981: 56; Sperber & Wilson 1981: 317; Wilson & Sperber 1981: 155; Levinson 1983: 97–100, 132; 2000: 15; Leech 1983: 48, 88; Bach 1987: 69, 77–79; Blakemore 1987: 21; Horn 1989: 213–214, 365, 383; 2004: 20; Neale 1992: 535–41; Hazlett 2007; Huang 2014: 9–10.

32. See Harnish 1976: 339–41; Bach & Harnish 1979: xvii, 6; Wilson & Sperber 1981: 160; Levinson 1983: 113; 2000: 15; Neale 1992: 527; M. S. Green 1995: 98; Meibauer 2005: 1378; Saul 2010: 170, 180; Braun 2011: 590; Lepore & Stone 2015: 2.

33. M. S. Green (2002: 244) observes that Grice’s own formulation of the Cooperative Presumption (“S is to be presumed …”) does not require that H does presume that S is observing the Cooperative Principle. While allowing failures of communication, even this version of the Cooperative Presumption fails when S’s utterance is not part of a conversation.

34. Kroch 1972; Kempson 1975: 152–156; Harnish 1976: 332, 334, 352; Gazdar 1979: 57ff; Wilson & Sperber 1981: 161; 2004: 619; Horn 1989: 15, 18–19, 332–335; Sadock 1978: 369; Levinson 1983: 122; 2000: 80; Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 37, 93, 2000–1; 1987: 699; Brown & Levinson 1987: 11; Thomason 1990: 353–356; W. Davis 1998: Ch. 2; Block 2008; Lepore & Stone 2015: §8.3.

35. See also Grice 1975: 32–3; Harnish 1976: 340; Leech 1983: 91; Sadock 1984: 140; Horn 1989: 210–16; 2010: §1; Rysiew 2001: 493; Breheny et. al. 2006: 437; Van Rooij and De Jager 2012; Simons 2017: 488–9. A precursor can be found in Mill 1867: 501.

36. If the derivation is repeated replacing “several” with “only some” or “some but not all”, we end up deriving an implicature that contradicts the “not all” implicature.

37. Stress plays a role in signaling or generating quantity implicatures that Gricean theorists have not addressed (cf. Grice 1978: 50–3; Van Kuppevelt 1996; Lepore & Stone 2015: 145). With no stress, “Some athletes smoke” would not ordinarily have a quantity implicature, unlike “Some athletes smoke”. “Some athletes smoke” and “Some athletes smoke” have different implicatures.

38. See also Levinson 1983: 136ff, whose attempt to derive a quantity implicature concluded that there was either a quantity implicature or an ignorance implicature.

39. See also Grice 1978: 53; Levinson 1983: 109; Huang 2014: 35.

40. See also Huang 2014: 35–6; Arseneault 2018: 174, 182.

41. Cf. Kempson 1975: 144, 159; Leech 1983: 23; Martinich 1984: 511; Sperber & Wilson 1987: 705–706; Wilson & Sperber 2012: 15–6.

42. See W. Davis 1998: §3.4 and Saul 2001: 234–5. Compare and contrast Lepore & Stone 2010, 2015: Chs. 10–12. In a widely quoted passage in which he laid down the Calculability thesis, Grice (1975: 31) claimed that non-calculable implicatures would have to be conventional. This conflicts with Grice’s (1975: 26, 28) claim that conversational implicatures are a subclass of nonconventional implicatures, and his claim (1975: 43) that conversational implicatures might become conventionalized. The implicatures illustrated by (1) and (2) differ from those illustrated by (3) in not being carried by the conventional meanings of the sentences used. That is evident whether the implicatures are calculable or not, given that they are cancelable.

43. See also R. Lakoff 1977; Brown & Levinson 1978, 1987; Horn 1989: 360; and Matsumoto 1995: §2.4. Grice 1975: 28 acknowledges the Principle of Politeness, and suggests that it generates implicatures that are both nonsemantic and nonconversational. Contrast Huang 2014: 44, fn. 11, who thinks the Principle of Politeness is derivative from the Cooperative Principle.

44. See also Horn 1984: 11; 1989: 194; Meibauer 2006: 573; Huang 2006; 2014: §2.2.1.

45. See also Levinson 1983: 146–7; Meibauer 2006: 570–73; Huang 2006; 2014: §2.2.2. Allott (2018: §3.5) formulates the neo-Gricean principles without the bracketed conditions.

46. A separate problem is that Horn’s R (Levinson’s I) does not seem to cover standard relevance implicatures like (1). Another is that (16)(a) is arguably a sense rather than an implicature (W. Davis 2016a: §7.2). One piece of evidence for the sense hypothesis is that speakers who use “He did not break a finger” would typically mean “He did not break a finger of his own”, which is neither an R nor a Q implicature.

47. See also Atlas & Levinson 1981; Meibauer 2006: 572; Huang 2006; 2014: 62–4.

48. Without the brackets, furthermore, speakers violate Q when they implicate something rather than say it, and R when they say something rather than implicate it.

49. Bidirectional Optimality Theory (BOT) is another way of replacing Grice’s Quantity, Relevance, and Manner (Blutner 2000, 2004). Dekker & van Rooy (2000) show how BOT can be modeled in game theory, with optimality being a Nash equilibrium. See also Zeevat 2000; Dekker & van Rooy 2000; Krifka 2002; van Rooij and de Jager 2012.

50. See Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 1986b; 1987; 1995; Kempson 1986; Carston 1987; 1988; 2002; 2004a; 2004b; Recanati 1987; Blakemore 1987; 1992; Wilson & Sperber 1981; 1986; 2004; 2012; Yus 2006; B. Clark 2013. For a precursor, see Kasher 1976.

51. See also Sperber & Wilson 1986a; 123–27; 1986b: 544; 1987: 703; Jary 1998: 4; Carston 2002: 44, 379; Wilson & Sperber 2004: 609–10; Huang 2014: 269; Lepore & Stone 2015: 63.

52. This is true because “29 is the square root of 843” is necessarily false. So [b] and [c] are necessarily equivalent.

53. See also Wilson & Sperber 2004: 610.

54. Relevance theorists often say that to maximize relevance is to produce the greatest amount of cognitive effects for the least amount of processing effort (Kempson 1986: 90; Blakemore 1992: 32, 34; Sperber & Wilson 1986b: 544; 1987: 703; Carston 2002: 45, 379; Meibauer 2006: 575; Wilson & Sperber 2012: 62; B. Clark 2013: 32; Lepore & Stone 2015: 67). Taken literally, however, this formulation says that maximizing relevance requires maximizing cognitive effects, even if the lowest cost way of doing that is too costly and the effect/cost ratio is not maximal.

55. Carson 1987: 714; 1988: 43; Blakemore 1992: 60, 77–83; B. Clark 2013: 67–9.

56. See Adler 1987: 710; Gerrig 1987. Griceans and Neo-Griceans offer a similar account of tautologies (Grice 1975: 33; Ward & Hirschberg 1991: 511; Levinson 1983: 110–11), which has been similarly criticized (Harnish 1976: 332; Wierzbicka 1985: 145; 1987: 110; 2003: Ch. 10; W. Davis 1998: §2.2). Note that the same difficulty blocks the prediction that the doctor will contribute (b) in (13).

57. For example, if the context contains “I have to dress for a party only if I am going to it”, the first proposition contextually implies “I do not have to dress for Peter’s party” and the second contextually implies “I do not have to dress for Paul’s party”.

58. H. H. Clark 1987: 714–5; McCawley 1987: 724; Morgan & Green 1987: 726; Levinson 1989: 467; Berg 1991: 417–21.

59. See Sperber & Wilson 1981; 1986a: 200–1, 240–3; Wilson & Sperber 2004: 621–2; 2012: 18, 123–45.

60. See Currie 2006; Popa-Wyatt 2014.

61. Sperber and Wilson also claim that irony is “echoic” in that the thought to which the speaker expresses an attitude is attributed to someone else (e.g., Wilson & Sperber 2012: 128–9). But as (2) illustrates, this is not always true (cf. Meibauer 2005: 1394). Of course, by dissociating themselves from what they said, speakers thereby dissociate themselves from anyone who would assert or accept it. Lepore and Stone (2015: §11.2) explore a literary form of irony in which the speaker echoically expresses a dissociative attitude without meaning the opposite of what is said.

62. Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 233–4; Wilson & Sperber 2012: 59, 89–91. It is not clear why false contextual implications are not counted as costs. If true contextual implications are improvements in knowledge, false contextual implications are the opposite. Sperber and Wilson seem to assume that false implications will be ignored. Sperber & Wilson (1995: 266) do mention a principle that considers the balance of positive to negative cognitive effects, but do not say why they reject it.

63. See also Sperber & Wilson 1986b: 544; 1995: 270; Wilson & Sperber 2004: 612; 2012: 7; B. Clark 2013: 32–3, 37. The reasoning behind (a) is problematic: the speaker’s wanting the hearer to assume that the utterance is relevant enough to be worth processing does not entail that it is relevant enough. That reasoning provides more support for another common formulation: “Every act of overt communication conveys a presumption of its own optimal relevance” (Sperber & Wilson 1995: 260ff; see also Sperber & Wilson 1987: 704; Wilson & Sperber 2004: 612; 2012: 6; B. Clark 2013: 78). Since presumptions may be false, this formulation does not entail (a) or (b), and cannot be used to explain or predict what speakers mean or implicate.

64. See Jary 1998 for an exposition and defense of a relevance theoretic account of politeness.

65. See Sperber & Wilson 1986a: 130; Wilson & Sperber 2004: 610; Bach & Harnish 1987: 711; Levinson 1987: 722; 1989: 459, 462; Hinkelman 1987; Seuren 1987; W. Davis 1998: 103–4; Huang 2014: 271.

66. For example, If “I have to work” contextually implies “I am not going to Paul’s party”, it contextually implies “I am not going to Paul’s party between 10:00 and 11:00 pm”, “… between 10:00 and 11:30 pm”, and so on for shorter and shorter intervals.

67. Cf. Blakemore 1992: 58–9; Carston 2004a: 67.

68. Cf. L. J. Cohen 1971; Levinson 2000: 213–4; Recanati 2003: 89–90; Chierchia 2004; Sauerland 2004; Horn 2010: §3. Contrast Simons 2010; 2017; Borg 2010: 271. Huang 2014: §2.4 reviews a wide range of views.

69. See also Blakemore 1992: 59; Bezuidenhout 2001: 170; Yus 2006: 514ff; Meibauer 2006: 576; Wilson & Sperber 2012: 12.

70. See also Carston 1988: 37; 2004a: 67, 72; 2004b: 648; Blakemore 1992: 57ff; Neale 1992: 530, 555; Bach 2006: 24–6.; Yus 2006; Wilson & Sperber 2012: 8–14.

71. Cf. Meibauer 2006: 575; Simons 2017: 486. Contrast Carston 2002: §2.3.4; 2004a: 68–9. Bach (2006: 25) claims that we need not determine what S said before inferring what S implicated (see also Carston 2004a: 72; Meibauer 2006: 577; Borg 2010: 181). He correctly observes that we can often determine what S meant before determining what S said. But by definition (§1), we cannot conclude that S implicated p before establishing that S did not say p. And we cannot conclude that S implicated p by saying q before establishing that S said q.

72. Grice (1957) initiated the discussion, formulating the leading theory. See W. Davis (2003: Chs. 1–3) and M. S. Green (2007; 2017: §5) for alternatives and critical reviews of the extensive literature, plus references.

73. Saul (2012) questions whether misleading really is ethically preferable to lying.

74. Hobbs et. al. (1993) model the role of inference to the best explanation in implicature recognition. See also Lepore & Stone 2015: Chs. 5, 15.

75. These examples all show that “conventional” should not be equated with “coded”. Cf. Stainton & Viger 2018: 24; Contrast Huang 2014: 41, 75–6.

76. Levinson 2000: §1.2; Kasper 2003; Cummings 2014; Lepore & Stone 2015: Part II.

77. See also Hirschberg 1991; Matsumoto 1995; Levinson 2000: 79–80; Sauerland 2004; Huang 2014: 45–48.

78. See also Horn 1972: Ch. 4; 2004: 11; Levinson 1983: 164; Hirschberg 1991: 47.

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