William Heytesbury

First published Fri Jan 19, 2018

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Miroslav Hanke and Elzbieta Jung replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

William Heytesbury (c. 1313–1372/3), a member of Oxford’s Merton College and the School of “Oxford Calculators”, was most likely a student of Richard Kilvington, who was a younger contemporary of John Dumbleton. Heytesbury developed the works of Thomas Bradwardine and Richard Kilvington, and he was also influenced by Walter Burley, William Ockham, and Roger Swyneshed (or Swineshead). He authored a popular textbook Regulae solvendi sophismata and several other collections of sophisms. He linked interests in logic, mathematics, and physics. He formulated the Mean Speed Theorem offering a proper rule for uniformly accelerated motion, later developed by Galileo. His works anticipated nineteenth-century mathematical analyses of the continuum. He influenced logic in Britain and Italy (where several late fourteenth and early fifteenth-century editions of his texts were printed) and his influence lasted until the sixteenth century when the debates he participated in declined.

1. Life and Works

William Heytesbury was most likely born before 1313 in Wiltshire (Salisbury Diocese). He is first mentioned as a fellow at Merton College in Oxford in 1330; he is thus among the second generation of Oxford Calculators (a follower of Thomas Bradwardine and Richard Kilvington, a contemporary of John Dumbleton and Roger Swyneshed, and a predecessor of Richard Swineshead). He held the administrative position of a bursar of Merton in 1338–1339, responsible for determining dues, auditing accounts, and collecting revenues.[1] He was named a fellow of the new Queen’s College in 1340, but was soon mentioned among the fellows of Merton College again. He is recorded to have become a Doctor of Theology in 1348, yet none of his theological works are known. He was chancellor of the University in 1371–72 (and perhaps also in 1353–54) and died shortly thereafter, between December 1372 and January 1373.[2]

Heytesbury’s extant writings, which are tentatively dated to the period 1331–1339 by Weisheipl, are (with one exception) concerned with the analysis of fallacies and sophisms. Regulae solvendi sophismata [RSS] or Logica (a collection of six treatises: on paradoxes, on knowing and doubting, on relative terms, on beginning and ceasing, on maxima and minima, and on the velocity of movements) is concerned with instructions for solving different types of sophisms in the first year of logical studies. Sophismata [Soph] is a collection of sophisms for advanced students working on natural philosophy. Sophismata asinina [SophAs] is a collection of sophistical proofs that the reader is a donkey. Iuxta hunc textum [IHT], also known as Consequentiae Heytesbury, is a collection of sophisms designed for testing formal inference rules. Casus obligationis [CO] is a collection of epistemic sophisms. De sensu composito et diviso [SCD] is a manual on the logical analysis of the de re/de dicto ambiguity. Termini naturales is a vocabulary of basic physical concepts.[3] Most of these have not been critically edited, but early prints, recent editions, and several modern translations are available.[4]

2. Logic

2.1 Obligationes

Since most of Heytesbury’s logical views are spelled out either in the context or in terms of obligationes,[5] a brief note on these must be the starting point of their presentation. The most important passages are in [SCD] and [Soph] and to a certain degree in [RSS]. Three problems will be introduced: 1) the basic concepts, and in particular, relevance; 2) the distinction between metaphysical and epistemic possibility; and 3) the distinction between conceding a sentence and conceding that a sentence is true.

Heytesbury’s obligationes are zero-sum and dynamic consistency games participated by two players, an “opponent” and a “respondent”. The opponent posits a “casus” (ponitur casus), i.e., the initial linguistic and extra-linguistic assumptions, and proposes particular sentences. The respondent admits or denies the casus (admittitur, negatur casus) depending on its consistency and concedes (concedo), negates (nego), or doubts (dubito) the proposed sentences, the criteria being logical relations to either casus or to the totality of preceding moves (including the casus). Heytesbury chooses the latter option, thus subscribing to so-called “antiqua responsio” (Read 2013: 20–23). The respondent wins if he maintains consistency.

Sentences proposed to the respondent split into “relevant” or “irrelevant” depending on their logical relation to preceding moves. If the sentence proposed to the respondent or its negation follows from preceding moves, it is relevant (pertinens) and should be either conceded (if implied by these moves) or negated (if it is incompatible with them); otherwise, it is irrelevant (impertinens). An irrelevant sentence is either conceded, negated, or doubted depending on the respondent’s knowledge about the “external” world; it is conceded if known to be actually true, negated if known to be actually false and doubted otherwise. Such a game is dynamic in the sense that the status of irrelevant sentences can change in the game course ([SCD] 1494: fol. 4ra–rb [1988a: 432–433]). This can happen for two reasons. First, if the external world changes during the game, the respondent’s move would change along with his new information state since the respondent’s moves regarding irrelevant sentences depend on his knowledge of the external world ([SCD] 1494: fol. 4rb [1988a: 433]). The second (and more interesting) case is brought about by a particular game course. Heytesbury’s example is the following game:

Game 1.

opponent’s moves

respondent’s moves


[O1] POSITIO: The king is seated or you are in Rome.

[R1] I admit the casus.

The casus is possible.

[O2] PROPONITUR: The king is seated.

[R2] I doubt that.

Irrelevant and not known to be true or false in the external world.

[O3] PROPONITUR: You are in Rome.

[R3] I negate that.

Irrelevant and known to be false.

[O4] PROPONITUR: The king is seated.

[R4] I concede that.

Relevant and implied by [R1] and [R3].

[R2] and [R4] are correct moves because [R1] and [R3] are. When “the king is seated” is proposed in [O2], it can only be relevant with respect to [R1], which is not the case as disjunctions do not entail their sub-formulas. If the respondent is unaware of the king’s whereabouts, the sentence must be doubted. “You are in Rome” proposed in [O3] is also irrelevant, but can be negated as known to be false in the external world. At that point, “the king is seated” becomes relevant and must be conceded as implied by “the king is seated or you are in Rome” and the negation of “you are in Rome” via disjunctive syllogism ([SCD] 1494: fol. 4rb [1988a: 433–434]).

Heytesbury considers three types of casus: a) possible; b) impossible but imaginable; and c) impossible and unimaginable ([Soph] soph. 18 and 31 [1494: fols. 131va–vb and 162va–vb]). The criteria of possibility, which probably pertain to metaphysics, are not spelled out clearly. The criteria of imaginability are logical and epistemological:

Briefly, every casus which is not explicitly inconsistent or impossible in a way not easily imaginable (such as a man being a donkey etc.) can be admitted for the sake of disputation. But first, the respondent has to make the impossibility of such casus explicit and emphasize that he has not admitted the casus as possible but merely as imaginable, to defend its implications (as imaginable, not as possible) and to negate what is incompatible with it in accord with his obligation. ([Soph] soph. 31 [1494: fol. 162va–vb])

The realm of the imaginable includes whatever is epistemically admissible for either logical or epistemic reasons. Neither is purely objective: what can and cannot be imagined seems player-relative, as is being “explicitly” inconsistent (for seeing or overlooking a contradiction is a matter of individual skill). Examples of the imaginable include the existence of a vacuum, infinite velocities, expansions of physical objects, and men being immortal, but not men being donkeys.[6] The criteria may be practical: certain hypotheses are not productive. Since the respondent’s goal is to maintain consistency, accepting overtly inconsistent assumptions is a nonstarter,[7] and certain impossibilities are such that nobody would agree to defend them even for the sake of argument.[8] Defining admissibility in terms of imaginability makes obligationes into a framework for discussing “impossibilities” with applications in physics[9] as a science based on conceptual analysis and thought-experiments,[10] where the “secundum imaginationem” assumptions play the same role as the modern day idealizations such as mass points or frictionless movement.[11]

A principle utilized in Heytesbury’s solution to various paradoxes states that a proposed sentence is evaluated according to its standard meaning, even if it is assumed to signify something else in the casus. For instance, the following moves of the respondent would be correct:

Game 2.

opponent’s moves

respondent’s moves


[O1] POSITIO: “All mice are grey” signifies that all cats are blue. All cats are white.

[R1] I concede the casus.

The casus is possible.

[O2] PROPONITUR: All mice are grey.

[R2] I concede that.

Irrelevant and known to be true in the external world.

[O3] PROPONITUR: The sentence “all mice are grey” is true.

[R3] I negate that.

Relevant and inconsistent with the casus.

By [R2], the respondent agrees that all mice are grey, while by [R3] he denies that all cats are blue. To concede a sentence is to agree that what the sentence signifies according to its standard meaning is the case, but to concede that a certain sentence is true is to agree that what the sentence signifies in the casus is the case. These may or may not be the same depending on the casus. ([SophAs] 412)[12]

2.2 Proprietates terminorum

The genre of “proprietates terminorum” developed in the twelfth century alongside the reception of Aristotle’s Sophistical refutations, and a logico-semantical analysis of fallacies seems to have been one of its primary applications.[13] It is an umbrella genre for, among others, theories of meaning and reference, the use-mention distinction, quantification, and tense. These are utilized in several of Heytesbury’s works with terminological variations. Three of these issues will be presented here: the theories of “suppositio”, “mobilitatio”, and “ampliatio”.

Supposition is a semantic relation between terms and the object(s) they stand for in a sentential context. The modes of supposition are connected to the way sentences can be analyzed (expositio), in particular, to the way general terms can be replaced by a structured collection of subordinate terms, the so-called “descensus”. The following classifications of suppositions can be reconstructed from Heytesbury’s writings:

  • (1) material supposition (s. materialis)
  • (2) personal supposition (s. personalis)
    • (2.1) discrete supposition (s. discreta)
    • (2.2) common supposition (s. communis)
      • (2.21) determinate supposition (s. determinata)
      • (2.22) confused supposition (s. confusa)
        • (2.221) merely confused or non-distributive supposition (s. confusa tantum, confusa non distributiva)
        • (2.222) confused and distributive supposition (s. confusa distributiva)

Material supposition (“only you are a donkey” in “only you are a donkey is false”) consists in mentioning an expression ([SophAs] 403), whereas personal (or significative) supposition consists in using it ([SophAs] 404). Discrete supposition is a personal supposition of a singular term ([SophAs] 390);[14] its complement is usually called “common” supposition and is further divided into determinate and confused suppositions. Determinate supposition is exemplified by the supposition of “human” in “some human is an animal” ([SCD] 1494: fol. 3va [1988a: 427]), connected to the descensus, whereby it can be paraphrased as “this human is an animal or that human is an animal etc.” ([SophAs] 387). Merely confused or non-distributive supposition is exemplified by the supposition of “animal” in “every human is an animal” and connected to “disjunctive” descensus ([SCD] 1494, fol. 2va–vb [1988a: 420–421]; [Soph] soph. 7 [1494: fol. 106rb] and soph. 16 (1494: fol. 127vb)), whereby it can be paraphrased as “every man is this animal or that animal etc.” Confused and distributive suppositions are most typically exemplified by the supposition of “human” in “every human is an animal”, connecting the descensus to every instance of the common term, whereby it can be paraphrased as “this human is an animal and that human is an animal etc.” ([SCD] 1494: fol. 2va–vb [1988a: 420–421]; [Soph] soph. 7 [1494: fol. 106rb] and soph. 16 [1494: fol. 127vb]).

The theory of suppositio is extended by the theory of “mobility” and “immobility”. If a particular mode of descensus is admissible, that type of supposition is called “mobile” (mobilis); otherwise it is called “immobile” (immobilis).[15] Heytesbury’s example of immobile supposition is the function of “penny” in “I promise you a penny” or “human” in “by necessity, every man is an animal” ([PC] 1494: fol. 188vb; [IHT] arg. 19; [SophAs] 398).

Note that: First, the so-called “simple” (“human” in “human is a species”) supposition is omitted.[16] Second, Heytesbury’s analysis of predicates in terms of the merely confused supposition is nominalist, as opposed to the realist analysis of these examples in terms of standing for an abstract object.[17] Third, Heytesbury endorses the Aristotelian sensus compositus-sensus divisus distinction, rather than the terminist framework in cases where that would be appropriate.[18]

Lastly, Heytesbury introduces the so-called “ampliatio”, which consist in extending the range of a term to non-actual entities, such as entities in the past, future, or mere possibilia. Thus, for instance, the proper paraphrase of the sentence “a white thing can be black” is “something that now is white or can be white can be black” ([SCD] 1494: fol. 2va [1988a: 418]).[19] The complementary property is called “restrictio” ([Soph] soph. 4 [1494: fol. 89vb]).

2.3 Deductive Validity

The basic textual evidence for Heytesbury’s theory of deductive validity includes [IHT], [Soph] and [RSS].

[IHT] is a collection of arguments for both the validity and invalidity of spurious inferences. Typically, the pro-arguments construe them as instances of formal inference rules (bona et formalis), the contra-arguments argue that they are not valid (non valet), and the resolutions show that the inference under scrutiny is not a genuine instance of such a rule. This method presupposes that deductive validity is ultimately truth-preservation (an inference is valid if its consequent cannot be false while its antecedent is true or if its antecedent is incompatible with the negation of the consequent) ([IHT] arg. 6). The criterion is that it is not possible to present a counterexample, i.e., a possible (obligational) situation (casu possibili posito) verifying the antecedent and falsifying the consequent ([IHT] arg. 2). The method also presupposes that the underlying inference rules are assumed to be legitimate but misapplied in such sophisms as to require elucidation, and not revision. The treatise is mostly concerned with the analysis of logical form (expositio) of sentences containing operators (officialia) such as “only”, “nothing but”, “begins”, “ceases”, etc., with a few applications of modal and epistemic logic.

[IHT] introduces the distinction between the “universal” (bona et formalis generaliter) and “restricted” (bona et formalis specialiter) formal validity:

An inference is formally valid in the universal sense if the opposite of its consequent is formally incompatible with its antecedent and a similar form [of argument] holds in all applications (consimilis forma valet in omni materia) (…) An inference is [formally] valid in the restricted sense if the opposite of its consequent is formally incompatible with its antecedent, but not every such application is valid. ([IHT] arg. 11)

The concept of formal compatibility is not explicitly introduced in this context.

[Soph] relates the relevance view of formality as a conceptual connection between premises and conclusions to the substitutional view of formality as validity under any substitution of extra-logical terms or in any domain of application (in omni materia). If an inference is valid only in a restricted domain of application, it is valid based on content or in a particular domain of application (de materia, gratia materiae) or “simply valid” (bona simpliciter) ([IHT] arg. 11; [Soph] soph. 3 [1494: fol. 86ra]). The concept of formal incompatibility is clarified as part of the explication of validity based upon the form (de forma):

It is commonly agreed that such inference is not valid based upon the form, because the opposite of its consequent and its antecedent do not formally imply a contradiction, where “to imply a contradiction formally” means that these two cannot be distinguished or consistently and distinctively imagined as holding simultaneously. ([Soph] soph. 2 [1494: fol. 83rb])

As opposed to testing simple validity against possible counter-models, formal validity is tested against impossible but imaginable counter-models to eliminate extra-linguistic influences. Imaginable casus introduced in obligationes are thereby utilized as part of general logic.

Finally, a “necessary” inference is one which can be reduced to a categorical or hypothetical syllogism via a necessary auxiliary assumption or “middle” (per medium necessarium) ([Soph] soph. 2 [1494: fol. 83rb]). Similarly, two sentences are assumed to be logically equivalent (convertantur) if they imply each other formally via a necessary middle ([RSS] 1494: fol. 15rb–va [1988b: 461–462]).[20] This represents the view of validity as reducibility to paradigmatically valid syllogisms.[21]

In general, Heytesbury introduces three levels of validity.[22] First, validity as relevance secured by logical form in every domain of application, explicated as truth-preservation of all inferences sharing the same logical form (forma or modus arguendi) with respect to every imaginable world. Second, validity as relevance secured by conceptual content with a restricted domain of application, explicated as truth-preservation with respect to all imaginable worlds, which is not substitution-invariant. Third, validity as simple truth-preservation with respect to all possible worlds. Heytesbury’s parallel use of different concepts of formality makes him a representative of British logic in the transition period, containing different stages of development: the substitutional view (validity preserved in all substitution-instances) typical for the “Continental tradition”, the relevance view (conceptual connection) typical for the “British tradition” and later Paul of Venice and Paul of Pergula, and formality as reducibility to a syllogism typical for the early fourteenth-century tradition.[23]

2.4 Logic of Epistemic Statements

Heytesbury’s analysis of epistemic statements encompasses the logical analysis of epistemic statements, inference rules for sentences containing epistemic operators, and rules for obligational games with epistemic statements, most of which are applied to solutions to sophisms[24] and instructions for obligational games. The underlying principles pertaining to the logical analysis of language and inference rules for epistemic statements will be addressed below.[25]

2.4.1 De re/de dicto Ambiguity and Epistemic Statements

Let us consider the following two sentences:

  • (dr) Socrates I know to be running in Beaumont.
  • (dd) I know that Socrates is running in Beaumont.

(dr), called “sensus divisus” by Heytesbury, denotes that there is a person (who happens to be Socrates) of whom I correctly know that he is running in Beaumont, but about whom I may or may not know that he is Socrates; his kinematics, but not his identity, is part of my belief. On the other hand, according to (dd), called “sensus compositus” by Heytesbury, I know that it is Socrates who is running in Beaumont. Hence if I believed that Socrates died years ago, (dr) could be true but (dd) would be false ([SCD] 1494: fol. 3va [1988a: 427] and [RSS] 1494, fol. 13rb and [1988b: 444]).[26] By strictly endorsing the Aristotelian framework and analyzing epistemic contexts in terms of the de re/de dicto ambiguity, Heytesbury does not participate in the fourteenth-century developments in the logical analysis of language.[27] Also, his criteria for distinguishing between the two readings are purely syntactic, whereby scholastic Latin is viewed as an artificial language with strict formation rules.[28]

2.4.2 Inference Rules

Heytesbury’s remarks on the “common interpretation of knowledge” emphasize that a firm and unhesitant belief does not constitute knowledge unless it is veridical, which results in the formulation “to know is nothing other than unhesitatingly to apprehend the truth—i.e., to believe unhesitatingly that it is so when it is so in reality” ([RSS] 1494: fol. 13vb [1988b: 447]).[29] This implies the veracity of knowledge, formally (where “\(K(\xi,X)\)” abbreviates “the agent \(\xi\) knows that X”):

  • (T) \(K(\xi ,X) \vdash X\)[30]

The introspection axioms govern iterated epistemic modalities (Boh 1984 and 1985). While denying the possibility of doubting one’s own knowledge, Heytesbury proposes positive introspection:

  • (4) \( K(\xi ,X)\vdash K[\xi ,K(\xi ,X) \)

This principle is spelled out in terms of the definienda of knowledge: if an agent perceives something unhesitatingly and pays attention to whether he does or does not perceive it, he also perceives that he perceives it, for both the first and second-order knowledge are based on the same evidence ([RSS] 1494: fol. 13vb [1988b: 447–448]). Heytesbury also holds the contraposition of (4) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 13vb [1988b: 448]):

  • (4*) \( \neg K[\xi ,K(\xi ,X)]\vdash ¬K(\xi ,X) \)

In the context of (T), Heytesbury discusses the casus where an agent sees a person who looks exactly like a king, but is not one. The agent can believe the man to be a king beyond any doubt and even believe himself to know that. But, by (T), he knows neither that the man is a king (because that is not true), nor that the man is not a king (because he does not believe that) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 13vb [1988b: 447]). Even though Heytesbury doesn’t explicitly say so, it seems natural to assume that this agent doesn’t know that he failed to know that man is a king. Hence he fails to know something, but also, presumably, fails to know that he fails to know it, which is a counter-example to negative introspection:

  • (5) \( \neg K(\xi ,X)\vdash K[\xi ,¬K(\xi ,X)] \)

Accepting (4) while denying (5) is based on Heytesbury’s interpretation of knowledge as an evidence-based act of considering something and apprehending its factuality: the absence of knowledge alone does not constitute conscious ignorance.

Heytesbury’s account of the closure properties of knowledge encompasses the closure of meaning under entailment, the distribution of knowledge over implication, and the distribution of knowledge over signification.

First, Heytesbury introduces the concept of implied meaning (significare ex consequenti) and believes that sentential meaning is closed under entailment. As he explains the different senses of “signifying precisely” (significare precise), he claims that a sentence cannot signify something precisely in the sense of not signifying anything else. Instead, “to signify precisely” means that a sentence has a “primary meaning” (“significat primo et principaliter” or “significatio primaria et adequata”) plus whatever its primary meaning entails (quod sequitur ipsam significantem quod ita sit), but nothing else ([RSS] 1494: fol. 15ra–rb [1988b: 459–460]).[31] To allow that, Heytesbury’s semantics must validate the following principle (where “\(\textrm{sig}(x,X)\)” abbreviates “x signifies that X”):

  • (SC) \( (X\Rightarrow Y)∧ \textrm{sig}(x,X)\vdash \textrm{sig}(x,Y)\)[32]

Second, Heytesbury denies outright logical omniscience, i.e., the closure of knowledge under implication:

  • (O) \( (X\Rightarrow Y)∧ K(\xi ,X)\vdash K(\xi ,Y) \)

but agrees with the distribution of knowledge over implication, i.e., that knowledge is closed under known inferences (the “axiom K”) ([CO] soph. 2):

  • (K) \(K[\xi ,X\Rightarrow Y)∧ K(\xi ,X)\vdash K(\xi ,Y)\)[33]

Third, if an agent knows that it is completely the case as a sentence signifies, does he know that everything it signifies is the case?[34] The problem of conceding a sentence whose meaning is deductively closed by an agent with a finite cognitive capacity is solved by introducing a distinction parallel to (K) and (O) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 15rb [1988b: 460]); Heytesbury denies:

  • (SO) \( K\{\xi ,\forall Y[\textrm{sig}(x,Y)⊃Y]\}∧ \textrm{sig}(x,X)\vdash K(\xi ,X) \)

but holds:

  • (SK) \( K\{\xi ,\forall Y[\textrm{sig}(x,Y)⊃ Y]\}∧ K[\xi ,\textrm{sig}(x,X)]\vdash K(\xi ,X) \)

Together with “strong” semantic closure, Heytesbury’s analysis of epistemic operators validates the “weaker” distribution principles and rejects the “stronger” closure principles, i.e., different forms of logical omniscience.[35]

2.5. Insolubilia

Heytesbury analyzes insolubilia or self-referential paradoxes most thoroughly in the first chapter of [RSS],[36] where he dismisses three alternative solutions to paradoxes to settle for the fourth. The first three positions agree that paradoxical sentences can have precisely their standard meaning. According to the first position held by Roger Swyneshed, paradoxical sentences are false because they imply their own falsity, and a sentence and its negation can be false at the same time if one of them is paradoxical ([RSS] 1494: fol. 4va and 6rb [1979: 18–19 and 45]). According to the second position, paradoxical sentences do not make genuine statements, hence are neither true nor false ([RSS] 1494: fols. 4va–vb [1979: 19]). That is reminiscent of the so-called “cassantes” who claim that paradoxical sentences fail to make a true or false statement (literally “say nothing”) (de Rijk 1966), available, for instance, through Burley or Bradwardine (Roure 1970; Bradwardine B-I. Heytesbury also could have viewed the second position as the interpretation of Bradwardine’s “mediantes”, who claims that paradoxical sentences are neither true nor false, but of a “middle value”.[37] According to the third position, paradoxical sentences are either-true-or-false but neither true nor false; they make genuine statements, but fail to have a standard truth-value ([RSS] 1494: fol. 4vb [1979: 19–20]).

According to the fourth position, paradoxical sentences have their standard meaning, but say more than what their overt meanings indicate. It is based on the definitions of a paradoxical casus and a paradoxical sentence. There are two versions of these definitions, differing in the last clause:

A paradoxical casus is one in which mention is made of some sentence such that if in the same casus that sentence signifies precisely as its words commonly pretend, from its being true follows that it is false, and vice versa. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6rb [1979: 47])


…it follows that it is true and also false. (Pozzi 1987: 236)


A paradoxical sentence is one of which mention is made in a paradoxical casus, such that if in the same casus it signifies precisely as its words commonly pretend, then from its being true follows that it is false, and vice versa ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6rb [1979: 47]).


…it follows that it is true and also false. (Pozzi 1987: 236)[38]

The solution to paradoxes is exemplified by the casus, where Socrates only pronounces the sentence “Socrates is saying something false”, henceforth labelled (s). Five elementary settings differ in assumptions concerning its meaning:

  • (1) the meaning of (s) is not posited
  • (2) the meaning of (s) is posited, such that:
    • (2.1) (s) has precisely its standard meaning
    • (2.2) (s) has its standard meaning, but not precisely its standard meaning, and the additional meaning is not certified
    • (2.3) (s) has its standard meaning and its additional meaning is certified, such that:
      • (2.31) (s) has a logical form of a conjunction
      • (2.32) (s) has a logical form of a disjunction

For Heytesbury, “to solve a paradox” is to instruct the respondent in the corresponding obligatio-game. His instructions are as follows:

  • (R1) If someone constructs a paradoxical casus, either he posits how that paradoxical sentence should signify or not. If not, then: when the paradoxical sentence is proposed, one should respond to it exactly as one would respond when the casus is not assumed. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6va [1979: 47])

The corresponding moves are:

Game 3.

opponent’s moves

respondent’s moves


[O1] POSITIO: Socrates only pronounces (s).

[R1] I admit the casus.

The casus is possible.

[O2] PROPONITUR: (s) is false.

[R2] ???

Irrelevant and ???

Heytesbury applies his view of obligationes: in the absence of any other assumptions, (s) is initially irrelevant. As such, if proposed as the first sentence in the game, the respondent’s move cannot be affected by either the casus or the previous moves, but must follow the respondent’s knowledge about the external world. Heytesbury’s emphasis on the stage of the game suggests that this can change due to the dynamic character of obligationes.

  • (R2.1) If a paradoxical casus is posited and together with that it is assumed that the paradoxical sentence precisely signifies as its terms commonly pretend, the casus may in no way be admitted. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6va [1979: 48])

The corresponding moves are:

Game 4.

opponent’s moves

respondent’s moves


[O1] POSITIO: Socrates only pronounces (s) and (s) signifies precisely that (s) is false

[R1] I do not admit the casus.

The casus is inconsistent.

Since obligationes are consistency-maintenance games, the only non-losing strategy for a respondent is not to start such a game, for otherwise he would be dragged into inconsistency via the well-known paradoxical reasoning.

  • (R2.2) If someone constructs a paradoxical casus and if it is also assumed that the paradoxical sentence signifies as its terms pretend (but not precisely so), then when this casus is admitted, the insoluble sentence has to be conceded as implied at whatever stage of the game it is proposed, but that it is true has to be denied as incompatible. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6va [1979: 49])

The corresponding moves are:

Game 5.

opponent’s moves

respondent’s moves


[O1] POSITIO: Socrates only pronounces (s) and (s) signifies that (s) is false

[R1] I admit the casus.

The casus is consistent.

[O2] PROPONITUR: (s) is false.

[R2] I concede that.

Implied by the casus.

[O3] PROPONITUR: “(s) is false” is true.

[R3] I deny that.

Incompatible with the casus.

The justification of [R2] is not clearly explained in [RSS]. A minimalist interpretation is that the proposed sentence is implied by [R1] via reductio: If (s) is false, then it is false (trivially); if (s) is not false, it is true, and then it is the case as it signifies, hence it is false. Either way, it is false, hence it is false.[39] An obligational explanation is that (s) is regarded as relevant in this casus, and as such can only be conceded or denied. Since its denial implies an inconsistency, such a move must be avoided in a consistency-maintenance game, therefore it should be conceded. Since the casus has been admitted as consistent, it cannot validate an inconsistent move, hence it must validate its opposite. By the same reasoning, it is possible to deny that (s) is true. Furthermore, Heytesbury refuses to certify the additional meaning of (s) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 6va [1979: 49–50]). Unsatisfactory as this may seem, it is legitimate from the point of view of obligationes: meaning certification is not a move available to the respondent, and since the instructions are respondent-oriented, the actual meaning of (s) is an external problem.

(2.31) and (2.32) are dealt with along the same lines.

For Heytesbury, paradoxes are obligational games with self-referential sentences.[40] However, his criticism of alternative solutions is part of the fourteenth-century developments relating paradoxes to general logico-semantical issues.[41] He views his approach as relatively defensible and probable, but admits that he cannot solve all objections and considers a completely satisfactory solution to paradoxes impossible (unfortunately without a justification). Without too much self-confidence, he closes his treatise by saying that young students should move past the topic and do something useful. ([RSS] 1494: fol. 4vb and 7rb [1979: 21 and 58])

3. Speculative Physics

Heytesbury’s treatise Regule solvendi sophismata may be taken as representative of Oxford Calculators’s speculative/mathematical physics. It links interests in logic, mathematics, and physics. As Curtis Wilson says: “Heytesbury employs the concept of “limit” and “infinite aggregate” with considerable precision and subtlety; and in treating of variable physics quantities, he approaches the ideal of a purely mathematical description” (Wilson 1960: 3). Not only does Heytesbury analyze physical and mathematical problems by means of the techniques of the logica moderna, but he also employs physical and mathematical rules in the analyses of logical or semantic problems of denomination. Heytesbury is mostly interested in the problem of determining under what conditions a subject can be denominated such-and-such, e.g., “white” or “running”. The issue of denomination arises because the attributes of subjects vary in degrees of intensity or completeness. He establishes sets of rules of everyday speech, determining how we denominate a subject under all imaginable circumstances of change. For example, in sophism Omnis homo qui est albus currit, he concludes that a man is called to be “white” if and only if the external surface of the upper half of him is white (in everyday speech, a man is white if the skin of his face is white) (Wilson 1960: 22–23).

Like one of the founders of the School of Oxford Calculators—Richard Kilvington– Heytesbury takes Ockham’s nominalist position and affirms that the real physical world consists only of res absolutae, i.e., substances and qualities. They both acknowledge that terms such as “point”, “line”, “latitude”, and “degree” do not have any representation in reality, but are useful for describing different types of change. They also hold that time is not real since time is not distinguished realiter from the motion of celestial sphere, and motion not distinguished realiter from the body which moves. Thus, they both contrast things that are really distinct with things distinguishable only in reason, i.e., in the imagination. Heytesbury follows Kilvington’s frequent use of the phrase secundum imaginationem. Imaginary cases are descriptions of hypothetical situations; the elements of the description, and not the situation itself, are of primary concern. The only requirement for an imaginable case is that it should not involve a formal logical contradiction; whether it is physically possible or not is a matter of indifference. As Wilson says,

a distinction is drawn between realiter or naturaliter or physice loquendo and logice or sophistice loquendo: physice we follow experience and the principles laid down in the natural philosophy of Aristotle; logice or sophistice we are free to introduce whatever distinctions and cases are convenient and imaginable. (Wilson 1960: 25)

Heytesbury, however, remains in the framework of Aristotelian philosophy of nature, and the problems he discusses are to be found in Aristotle’s Physica and De caelo. Nevertheless, Heytesbury is captivated by the mathematical approach like former Oxford Calculators were. Like Thomas Bradwardine and Richard Kilvington, he examines physical problems using mathematical apparatus. In Chapters 4–6 of the Regulae, Heytesbury develops the measurement by limit, i.e., by the first and last instants of the beginning and ending, and by the intrinsic and extrinsic limits of passive and active capacities. Although these type of “measuring” do not appear to be straightforwardly mathematical, it raises mathematical considerations and give outstanding results in analyses of the instantaneous in motion and time, as well as analyses of the continuum. As Wilson states:

“Heytesbury admits “according to the common mode of speech” that everything which is, whether time or motion or instant, is in an instant, in the sense that it is instantaneously measured by an instant […] the instant in time and the instantaneous position in movement are always to be regarded as “limits”. (Wilson 1960: 41)

The second type of measurement employs a new calculus of compounding ratios. The third type of measurement, by latitude of forms, describes motion, in which an accidental form, such as speed, is intensified or diminished. He focuses on establishing the rules for uniform and difform local motion, alteration, and augmentation. He is centered on the possible measure of the speed of such motions by the effect produced during equal length of time. Thus, he is interested in the kinematical aspect of motion (Ideo viso iam generaliter penes quid tamquam quo ad effectum attendatur velocitas in motu locali, quia secundum proportionem potentie motoris ad potentiam resistivam generaliter attenditur velocitas in quocumque motu tamquam quo ad eius causam) ([RSS] 1494: fol. 44rb).

3.1 Beginning and Ceasing

In chapter IV of the Regulae (De incipit et desinit) Heytesbury poses and analyzes in great detail cases in which any thing, process, or state may be said to begin or cease to be. He begins with possible expositions of the terms “beginning” (incipere) and “ceasing” (desinere) in a way that uncovers certain paradoxical properties of the temporal continuum. “Beginning” may be expounded by positio of the present (i.e., by the positing of existence in the present instant) and remotio of the past (i.e., by denial of existence in the past), meaning that in the present instant a thing or a process is, and immediately prior to the present instant it was not. “Beginning” may be also expounded by remotio of the present and positio of the future, meaning that in the present instant a thing or a process is not, and immediately after the present instant it will be. Likewise, “ceasing” may be expounded in two ways, either by remotio of the present and positio of the past, meaning that in the present instant a thing or a process is not, and immediately prior to the present instant it was, or by positio of the present and remotio of the future, meaning that in the present instant a thing or a process is, and immediately after the present instant it will not be. Heytesbury offers a number of sophisms involving the limit-decision. One of them is particularly interesting since it clearly exhibits Heytesbury’s remarkable skill in solving problems of instantaneous motion and time without symbolic techniques of the calculus. Heytesbury poses a case in which both Plato and Socrates begin to move from rest at the same instant, but Plato starts to move with a constant acceleration and Socrates with an acceleration which starts at zero degree and increases uniformly with time. He concludes that “both Socrates and Plato infinitely slowly begin to be moved, and yet Socrates infinitely more slowly begins to be moved than Plato” (Wilson 1960: 54, [RSS] 1494: fol. 26vb). As Wilson proves, the conclusion is an effect of comparison of two infinitesimals of different order.

In the case under consideration both the velocity of Plato (\(v_p\)) and the velocity of Socrates (\(v_s\)) are infinitesimal for time t approaching zero. Two infinitesimals are said to be of different order if the limit of their quotient is either zero or infinite. In the case under consideration the limit of the quotient \(v_p/v_s\) as \(t\rightarrow 0\) is infinite. (Wilson 1960: 55)

3.2 Maxima and Minima

In chapter V of the Regulae, Heytesbury considers the limits of capacities, and he applies the limit-concept to the bounding of the ranges of variables and aggregates. All capacities are sorted as active or passive. An active capacity (force) is measured against the passive capacity (resistance) which it can overcome. If an active capacity can overcome some resistance, it can overcome less. For example, if Socrates can lift one hundred pounds, he can lift fifty pounds. Conversely, if a passive capacity can be affected by less, it can be affected by greater. For example, if Socrates can see a grain of millet from the distance of a mile, he will be able to see the Church at the same distance. The boundaries of capacities are of two kinds: an intrinsic boundary (when an element is a member of the sequence of elements it bounds: maximum quod sic, minimum quod sic) and an extrinsic boundary (when an element which serves as a boundary stands outside the range of elements which it bounds: maximum quod non, minimum quod non). From the definitions of active and passive capacities, it follows that the boundary of an active capacity must be assigned either by the affirmation of the maximum (maximum quod sic) or by the negation of the minimum (minimum quod non); the boundary of a passive capacity is assigned either by the affirmation of the minimum (minimum quod sic) or by the negation of the maximum (maximum quod non).

Heytesbury sets the following conditions which must be obtained for limits to exist: (1) There must be a range in which the capacity can act or be acted upon, and another range in which it cannot act or be acted upon, and not both; (2) Each capacity should only be able to take a value in the range on which it is measured from zero and the value which serves as its boundary. Thus, if an active capacity is capable of acting upon a given passive capacity in the range, it must be capable of acting upon any less, and if it is not capable of acting upon a given passive capacity, it is not capable of acting upon any greater. Conversely, if a passive capacity is capable of being acted upon by a certain agent, it must be capable of being acted upon by any agent of greater strength, and if it is not capable of being acted upon by a certain agent, it is not capable of being acted upon by a weaker agent; and (3) Infinite capacities like the infinite power of God are excluded from the discussion, since no termination can be assigned for them ([RSS] 1494: fol. 29va–vb).

Heytesbury, like Kilvington, classifies all capacities as mutable or immutable. A mutable capacity is capable of more and less, and both affirmative and negative parts of the division might be assigned. For example, with respect to Socrates, a mutable power of lifting (an active capacity) a minimum quod non is assigned. For a passive capacity the maximum quod non is assigned, e.g., a maximum visible body which cannot be seen at a given distance. An immutable capacity acts in a determinate way, so it produces the only one effect it actually produces. Therefore, the affirmative part of the division is always assigned as a boundary for immutable capacity. Thus, e.g., there is a maximum distance which, ceteris paribus, Socrates can traverse in an hour by a speed which increases uniformly from A to B degree ([RSS] 1494: fol. 29vb; Wilson 1960: 73).

3.3 Three Categories of Change

Chapter VI (De tribus praedicamentis) of the Regulae deals with motion in three categories: place, quantity, and quality. The first part (de motu locali) deals with the quickness or slowness in uniformly or difformly accelerated and decelerated motion considered in its kinematical aspect. The second part (de velocitate motus augmentationis) deals with augmentation understood as pure increase in size, and more specifically with the speed of rarefaction as measured by the effect produced, i.e., by space traversed in time. The third part (de velocitate motus alterationis) is concentrated on mathematical description of variation of intensity in space and time. The prime purpose to be achieved in this chapter is to establish definitions of speed in the three categories of motion. All debated cases are posed secundum imaginationem.

3.3.1 Local Motion

Local motions are grouped into two classes: uniform and difform. A uniform motion is motion in which equal spaces are traversed continually in equal parts of time. Difform motions can vary in infinite ways, both with respect to the magnitude or the subject moved, and with respect to time. Difform motion with respect to the subject moved is motion in which different points of the body move with unequal speeds; for instance, a rolling wheel moves with difform motion since different points on the wheel vary in regard to distance from the axis of rotation. Difform motion with respect to time is motion in which unequal spaces are traversed in equal times. Motion can also be difform with respect to both time and the subject moved. Difform motions are subdivided into two classes: the uniformly difform motion and the difformly difform motion. Uniformly difform motion is motion in which the speed either increases or decreases uniformly, that is, a motion in which in any equal parts of time, equal latitudes of speed are either acquired or lost. A difformly difform motion is motion in which a greater latitude of velocity is gained or lost in one part of time than in another equal to it.

The most gripping example of uniformly difform motion is accelerated motion, like a motion of a body moving towards the earth. Heytesbury gives a general rule, called Mean Speed Theorem, by which we may calculate the distance traversed from the latitude of speed uniformly acquired. He makes use of this theorem to both accelerate and decelerate motions. According to this rule, the distance traversed by a uniformly accelerated body in a given time is equal to the distance which would be traversed in the same time in a uniform motion with its mean speed (half of the sum of the initial and final speed). A number of conclusions follow from this theorem:

  1. A body which moves with a uniformly difform motion beginning from 0 speed and terminating at some finite degree of speed traverses just half the distance traversed by a body which moves uniformly during the same time with a speed equal to the final speed in the uniformly difform motion.
  2. The medium degree of uniformly difform latitude of speed which begins at some degree and ends at another being greater than half the degree terminating the latitude its more intense extreme, it follows that a body which moves with uniformly difform motion beginning at some degree of speed and terminating at another traverses more than half the distance which would be traversed by a body moving uniformly during the same time with a speed equal to the most intense speed in the uniformly difform motion.
  3. In a uniformly difform motion beginning with 0 speed and terminating at some finite degree of speed, the distance traversed in the first half of the time is one third of that traversed in the second half. And conversely, in a motion in which the speed decreases uniformly from some degree to 0, the distance traversed in the first half of the time is three times that traversed in the second half (see Wilson 1960: 123–24).

In concluding the chapter, Heytesbury states that an infinite number of sophisms can be made concerning speed in local motion, as well as intension and remission of such speed (Infinita possunt fieri sophismata de velocitate motus localis et de comparatione unius motus ad alium, et de comparatione intensionis ad remissionem motus et coniungendo latitudinem motus intensionis et remissionis cum latitudine velocitatis ([RSS] 1494: fols. 44rb–44va)).

3.3.2 Alteration

Heytesbury presents the same concern with quantitative description of hypothetical cases in the subchapter dealing with qualitative change. He takes part in the debate over one of the most widely discussed problems in the fourteenth-century philosophy of nature focused on the possible “measure” of the intension and remission of forms. Like most of the Oxford Calculators, Heytesbury accepts Scotus’s and Ockham’s addition theory and assumes that the intension of form is the result of adding qualitative parts. As an Ockhamist, Heytesbury emphasizes that the term “motion” in alteration connotes nothing else than the degrees or latitude of quality that are successively acquired. A basic assumption is that qualitative intensity is a certain kind of linearly ordered and additive quantity. Thus, as in the case of local motion, Heytesbury divides the latitudes of motion of alteration into the latitude of motion of intension and the latitude of motion of remission; and the latitude of the latitude of motion into the latitude of the acquisition of the latitude of motion and the latitude of the loss of latitude of motion. In modern terminology, these latitudes correspond to latitudes of speed and of acceleration and deceleration, respectively. Since there is no limit to speeds of alteration nor to rates of acceleration or deceleration of that speed, those latitudes are all infinite.

Heytesbury presents three different ways of “measuring” the speed of alteration in which intensity of a quality varies form one point to another, or from instant to instant of time, or from point to point of the moving body: (1) by the degree (gradus) induced (a subject is considered to be altered faster when a higher degree is induced); (2) by the latitude of form acquired in comparison to the size of the subject (the speed of alteration is proportionally greater in a larger body); and (3) by the latitude acquired in a given time, without regard to size of the subject undergoing alteration. Heytesbury holds the third position and claims that as in the case of local motion, the speed of alteration is to be measured at the point of the body where the rate of change is most rapid, that is, where the maximum latitude of form is acquired ([RSS] 1494: fol. 51ra).

3.3.3 Augmentation

Heytesbury deals with augmentation as with pure increase in size, which is the same process as rarefaction; more precisely, he deals with the speed of rarefaction as measured by the effect produced. There are three ways of “measuring” the speed of augmentation acquired in time: (1) by the maximum quantity acquired; (2) by the latitude of rarity or rareness; and (3) by the ratio of new size to previous size ([RSS] 1494: fol. 60rb). He holds the third position, according to which the ratios correspond to different degrees of augmentation. Augmentation, like the two other motions, can be uniform or difform. An augmentation is uniform if in equal intervals of time, the body undergoing augmentation increases in size by the same ratio. While discussing the above mentioned positions, Heytesbury makes broad use of the new calculus of ratios invented by Kilvington and Bradwardine.

4. Influence

As a logician, Heytesbury strongly influenced logic in fourteenth and fifteenth-century Britain, and there is a notable fifteenth and early sixteenth-century reception in Italy where multiple editions of his commentaries on [RSS] and [SCD] were printed (Ashworth & Spade 1992; de Rijk 1975, 1977). As of now, only the influence of his insolubilia-treatise is particularly well-documented. Despite his dismissive attitude toward this genre, Heytesbury’s treatise is one of the most influential late medieval texts. These influences include the British logical tradition (see Pironet 2008), the Italian logical tradition,[42] and John Mair’s circle,[43] and the treatise is referred to even as late as 1688 (De Benedictis 1688: 580–590; for other influence, see Spade 1989: 273). Heytesbury’s catalogue of solutions to the paradoxes, where the positions are (correctly or not) attributed to fourteenth-century British logicians, is further developed and sometimes defended against Heytesbury’s harsh and sarcastic dismissal. (R2.2) is developed by extending the proof and supplemented by saying that paradoxical sentences (or all sentences, for that matter) signify their own truth. As a philosopher, Heytesbury significantly influenced later Oxford Calculators: John Dumbleton, anonymous author of Tractatus de sex inconvenientibus, Richard Swineshead, author of one of the most famous treatise Liber Calculationum, and continental fourteenth and fifteenth-century philosophers, e.g., John Casali, John of Holland, Petrus of Mantua, Cajetan of Thiene, Giovanni Marliani, and Paul of Venice (see Wilson 1960: 25–28). The Mean Speed Theorem was widely discussed during the fourteenth and fifteenth centuries, and later played an important role in the formulation of the law of free fall (see Damerow et al. 1992: 161–200, esp. 232–236).


List of Abbreviations

  • [CO] Casus obligationis
  • [IHT] Iuxta hunc textum (Consequentie subtiles Hentisberi)
  • [PC] Probationes conclusionum
  • [RSS] Regulae solvendi sophismata (=Logica )
  • [SCD] De sensu composito et diviso
  • [Soph] Sophismata
  • [SophAs] Sophismata asinina

General Bibliographical Sources

  • Spade, Paul Vincent, 1989, “The Manuscripts of William Heytesbury’s ‘Regulae Solvendi Sophismata’: Conclusions, Notes and Descriptions”, Medioevo, 15: 271–314.
  • Weijers, Olga, 1998, Le travail intellectuel à la Faculté des arts de Paris: textes et maîtres (ca. 1200–1500). Répertoire des noms commençant par G, Turnhout: Brepols, pp. 212–217.
  • Weisheipl, James A., 1969, “Repertorium Mertonense”, Medieval Studies, 31: 174–224. doi:10.1484/J.MS.2.306064

Manuscripts of Heytesbury’s Texts

  • Casus obligationis [CO]:
    • Oxford: Bodleian Library Canon. Lat. 278, fol. 70.
    • Copenhagen: Kongelige Bibliotek Thott 581, fols. 34ra–va.
  • Logica or Regulae solvendi sophismata [RSS]:
    • Bruges: Openbare Bibliotheek 497, fols. 46–59va
    • Bruges: Openbare Bibliotheek 500, fols. 33–71va [c. 2–6]
    • Erfurt: MS Amplon. F. 135, fols. 1ra–17rb.
    • Praha: Národní knihovna III.A.11, fols. 1ra–30ra.
    • Leipzig: Universitätsbibliothek Leipzig, 1360, fols. 108ra–140vb.
    • Leipzig: Universitätsbibliothek Leipzig 1370, fols. 2r–42v.
    • Vatican: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana Vat. lat. 2136, fols. 1ra–32rb.
    • Vatican: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana Vat. lat. 2138, fols. 89ra–109va.
  • Sophismata [Soph]:
    • Paris: Bibliothèque nationale de France 16134, fols. 81ra–146ra.
    • Vatican: Biblioteca Apostolica Vaticana Vat. lat. 2138, fols. 1ra–86va.

Early Prints of Heytesbury’s Texts

  • William Heytesbury, 1491, Regule solvendi sophismata, Venice: Johannes and Gregorius de Forlivio.
  • –––, 1491, Sophismata, Venice: Johannes and Gregorius de Forlivio.
  • –––, 1491, Tractatus de sensu composito et diuiso, Venice: Johannes and Gregorius de Forlivio.
  • –––, 1494, Probationes conclusionum, Venice: Bonetus Locatellus.
  • –––, 1494, Regule solvendi sophismata, Venice: Bonetus Locatellus.
  • –––, 1494, Sophismata, Venice: Bonetus Locatellus.
  • –––, 1494, Tractatus de sensu composito et diuiso, Venice: Bonetus Locatellus.
  • –––, 1500, Tractatus de sensu composito et diuiso, Venice: Jacobus Pentius de Leuco.

Modern Editions and Translations of Heytesbury’s Texts

  • William Heytesbury, 1979, William of Heytesbury on “Insoluble” Sentences, Paul V. Spade (ed. and transl.), Toronto: Pontifical Institute of Medieval Studies.
  • –––, 1987, “De insolubilibus Guilelmi Hentisbery”, in Lorenzo Pozzi (ed. and transl.), Il Mentitore e il Medioevo: il dibattito sui paradossi dell'autoriferimento: scelta di testi, commento, traduzione, Parma: Edizioni Zara, pp. 212–251 [based on the 1494 printed edition and mss Vat. lat. 2136 and 2138].
  • –––, 1988a, “The Compounded and Divided Senses”, in Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump (ed. and transl.), The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Vol. 1: Logic and Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 413–434 [based on the 1494 printed edition and several manuscripts].
  • –––, 1988b, “The Verbs ‘Know’ and ‘Doubt’”, in Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump (ed. and transl.), The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Vol. 1: Logic and Philosophy of Language, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, pp. 435–479 [based on the 1494 printed edition and several manuscripts].
  • –––, 1994, Sophismata asinina: une introduction aux disputes médiévales, Fabienne Pironet (ed.), Paris: Libraire Philosophique J. Vrin.
  • –––, Sophismata, edited by Fabienne Pironet [transcription of the 1494 edition]. available online (Part 1) and URL = available online (Part 2).
  • –––, 2003, Les traites “Juxta hunc textum” de Guillaume Heytesbury et Robert Alyngton. Edition critique précédée d’une introduction historique et paléographique, Universite de Geneve, Projet Sophismata. available online
  • –––, 2008, De insolubilibus, in Fabienne Pironet, “William Heytesbury and the treatment of Insolubilia in 14th-century England”, in Shahid Rahman, Tero Tulenheimo, and Emmanuel Genot (eds.), Unity, Truth and the Liar: The Modern Relevance of Medieval Solutions to the Liar Paradox, Berlin: Springer-Verlag, pp. 283–289 [partial transcription of the 1494 edition].

Other Scholastic Sources

  • Anonymous, 1984, Tractatus de Maximo et Minimo, John Longeway (ed.) in William Heytesbury On Maxima and Minima. Chapter 5 of “Rules for Solving Sophismata”, with an anonymous fourteenth-century discussion, Dordrecht: D. Reidel Publishing Company, 101–131.
  • Bradwardine, Thomas (1290?–1349), 1955 [B-TP], Tractatus proportionum seu de proportionibus velocitatum in motibus, H. Lamar Crosby, Jr. (ed. and trans.) in Thomas of Bradwardine His Tractatus de Proportionibus. Its Significance for the Developement of Mathematical Physics, Madison, WI: University of Wisconsin Press.
  • –––, 2010 [B-I], Insolubilia, Stephen Read (ed. and trans.), Leuven: Peeters.
  • Burley, Walter (c. 1275–1344/45), 1963 [Bu-DO], De obligationibus, in Romuald Green, An Introduction to the Logical Treatise “De obligationibus” with critical texts of William of Sherwood (?) and Walter Burley, Vol. II, PhD. thesis Louvain, pp. 34–96.
  • –––, 1980 [Bu-DC], “Walter Burley's De consequentiis: An Edition”, Niels Jørgen Green-Pedersen (ed.), Franciscan Studies, 40: 102–166. doi:10.1353/frc.1980.0008
  • Cajetan of Thiene, 1494, In regulas Gulielmi Hesburi recollectae. In Tractatus Gulielmi Hentisberi de sensu composito et diviso. Regulae eiusdem cum sophismatibus. Declaratio Gaetani supra easdem. Expositio litteralis supra tractatum de tribus. Questio Messini de motu locali cum expletione Gaetani. Scriptum supra eodem Angeli de Fosambruno. Bernardi Torni annotata supra eodem. Simon de Lendenaria supra sex sophismata. Tractatus Hentisberi de veritate et falsitate propositionis. Conclusiones eiusdem, Venezia: Bonetus Locatellus, fols. 7rb–12rb.
  • De Benedictis, Giovanni Battista, 1688, Philosophia peripatetica, (vol. I), Napoli: Jacobus Raillard.
  • De Medici, Manfredus, 1542, Annotationes eximii artium et medicinae doctoris Divi magistri Manfredi de Medicis supra logicam parvam Pauli Veneti ubi multa adducuntur ex Tisbero, Strodo et Petri Mantuani valde utilia, quae omnia fuerunt diligenter recognita, in Subtilissimae expositiones quaestionesque super Summulis magistri Pauli Veneti una cum argutissimis additionibus Jacobi Ritii Aretini et Manfredi de Medicis, Venezia: Antonius Junte Florentini, fols. 104ra–106vb.
  • Kilvington, Richard (approx. 1305–1361), 1990, The Sophismata of Richard Kilvington, critical edition of the Latin text Barbara Ensign Kretzmann, Norman Kretzmann, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Mair, John, 1505, In Petri Hyspani summulas Commentaria, Lyon: Stephan Gueynard.
  • Paul of Pergula (–1455), 1961 [PP-LT], Logica and Tractatus de Sensu Composito et Diviso, Mary Anthony Brown (ed.), St. Bonaventure, NY: The Franciscan Institute.
  • Paul of Venice (c.1369–1429), 1990 [PV-LM], Logica magna: Part II, Fascicule 4: Capitula de conditionali et de rationali, George E. Hughes (ed. and trans.), Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2002 [PV-LP], Logica Parva: First Critical Edition from the Manuscripts with Introduction and Commentary, Alan R. Perreiah (ed.), Leiden: Brill.
  • William of Sherwood (c.1200–c.1270), 1963 [WS], De obligationibus, in Romuald Green, An Introduction to the Logical Treatise “De obligationibus” with critical texts of William of Sherwood (?) and Walter Burley, Vol. II, PhD. thesis Louvain, pp. 1–33.
  • Thomas of Udine O.P., [?] (15th century) Commentary on Regule solvendi sophismata, ms Vatican, Vat. lat. 3058, fols. 122ra–128va.

Secondary Sources

  • Ashworth, E.J. and Paul Vincent Spade, 1992, “Logic in Late Medieval Oxford”, in J.I. Catto and Ralph Evans (eds.), The History of the University of Oxford. Volume II, Late Medieval Oxford, Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 35–64. doi:10.1093/acprof:oso/9780199510122.003.0002
  • Biard, Joël, 1985, “La signification d’objets imaginaires dans quelques texts anglais du XIVe siècle (Guillaume Heytesbury, Henry Hopton)”, in Lewry 1985: 265–283.
  • –––, 1989, “Les sophismes du savoir: Albert de Saxe entre Jean Buridan et Guillaume Heytesbury”, Vivarium, 27(1): 36–50. doi:10.1163/156853489X00029
  • Boh, Ivan, 1984, “Epistemic and alethic iteration in later medieval logic”, Philosophia Naturalis, 21: 492–506.
  • –––, 1985, “Belief, justification and knowledge. Some late-medieval epistemic concerns”, Journal of the Rocky Mountain Medieval and Renaissance Association, 6: 87–103. [Boh 1985 available online (pdf)]
  • –––, 1986, “Elements of Epistemic Logic in the Later Middle Ages”, in Christian Wenin (ed.), L'homme et son univers au moyen âge: actes du septième congrès international de philosophie médiévale (30 août–4 septembre 1982) vol. 2, Louvain-la-Neuve: Éditions de l’Institut supérieur de philosophie, pp. 530–543.
  • –––, 1993, Epistemic Logic in the Later Middle Ages, London: Routledge.
  • –––, 2000, “Four phases of epistemic logic”, Theoria, 6(2): 129–144. doi: 10.1111/j.1755-2567.2000.tb01159.x
  • Bottin, Francesco, 1976, Le Antinomie Semantiche Nella Logica Medievale, Padova: Editrice Antenore.
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