Folk Psychology as a Theory

First published Mon Sep 22, 1997; substantive revision Tue Aug 16, 2016

The concept of folk psychology has played a significant role in philosophy of mind and cognitive science over the last half century. However, even a cursory examination of the literature reveals that there are at least three distinct senses in which the term “folk psychology” is used. (1) Sometimes “folk psychology” is used to refer to a particular set of cognitive capacities which include—but are not exhausted by—the capacities to predict and explain behavior. (2) The term “folk psychology” is also used to refer to a theory of behavior represented in the brain. According to many philosophers and cognitive scientists, the set of cognitive capacities identified above are underpinned by folk psychology in this second sense. (3) The final sense of “folk psychology” is closely associated with the work of David Lewis. On this view, folk psychology is a psychological theory constituted by the platitudes about the mind ordinary people are inclined to endorse.

To reduce terminological ambiguity, throughout this entry the term “mindreading” will be used to refer to that set of cognitive capacities which include (but is not exhausted by) the capacities to predict and explain behavior. “Folk psychology” will be used only in the second and third senses identified above. When separate names are required to avoid confusion, the second sense of “folk psychology” will be called the mindreading approach to folk psychology and the third sense the platitude approach to folk psychology. This terminology is due to Stich & Nichols 2003.

It’s not clear who introduced the term “folk psychology” into the philosophy of mind. It gained wide usage during the 1980s and is rarely used outside philosophy. The phrase “commonsense psychology” is sometimes used by philosophers synonymously with “folk psychology”, although the former term seems to be dying out. Psychologists rarely use “folk psychology”, preferring the phrase “theory of mind” (or sometimes “naïve psychology”). Just as there is ambiguity in the use of “folk psychology”, “theory of mind” is used to refer both to mindreading and to the theory hypothesized to underpin mindreading.

1. Mindreading

There’s an important set of human cognitive capacities first noticed by social psychologists and philosophers in the middle of last century (see for example Heider 1958 and Sellars 1956.) The members of this set of cognitive capacities are almost always assumed to be closely related, perhaps in virtue of their being produced by a single underlying cognitive mechanism. To a first approximation the set consists of—

  1. The capacity to predict human behavior in a wide range of circumstances.
  2. The capacity to attribute mental states to humans.
  3. The capacity to explain the behavior of humans in terms of their possessing mental states.

(See for example Stich & Nichols 1992.) The second and third capacities are clearly related: explaining the behavior of humans in terms of their mental states involves attributing mental states to them. But we should not assume without further investigation that all mental state attributions take the form of explanations of behavior.

The characterization of mindreading given above is too restrictive. In addition to attributing mental states and predicting and explaining behavior, there is a wide range of closely related activities. To begin with, we not only seek to predict and explain people’s behavior, we also seek to predict and explain their mental states. In addition, we speculate about, discuss, recall and evaluate both people’s mental states and their behavior. We also speculate about, discuss, recall and evaluate people’s dispositions to behave in certain ways and to have certain mental states; that is, we consider their character traits. It may be that these additional activities are grounded in the three capacities mentioned above, but we cannot simply assume that they are. Throughout this entry the term “mindreading” is used in a wide sense to include all of these activities.

As characterized above, mindreading is a human capacity directed at humans. But in two ways this is overly exclusive. First, we attribute mental states to non-human animals and to non-animal systems such as machines and the weather. It’s not uncommon to hear people say that their dog wants a bone, or that the chess program is thinking about its next move. We do not have to accept every such attribution at face value; plausibly, some of this talk is metaphorical. Nevertheless, there seem to exist plenty of examples of non-metaphorical attributions of mental states to non-humans. (Notice that insisting that mental state attributions to animals are not metaphorical is compatible with such attributions being systematically false.) Consequently, we must be careful not to characterize mindreading in a way which makes it definitional that only humans can be the objects of mindreading. The second way in which the characterization of mindreading offered above is overly focused on humans is that it remains an open question whether some non-human primates can predict the behavior of their conspecifics. (See for example Call & Tomasello 2008.) Consequently, we should avoid characterizing the mindreading capacities in a way that makes it analytic that non-human animals lack those capacities.

One way to avoid the risk of over-emphasizing human capacities when characterizing mindreading is to begin with the human capacities and then let the empirical chips fall where they may. For example, it may turn out that some non-human primates can predict the behavior of their conspecifics, and that there are significant similarities (including neurological similarities) between the human capacity to predict the behavior of others and that of the non-human primate. In that case we should widen the characterization of mindreading given above so that it is not exclusively focused on human capacities. Similarly, it may turn out that precisely the same cognitive mechanisms are engaged when humans attribute mental states to their conspecifics and when they attribute mental states to animals and machines. In that case we should widen the characterization of mindreading to allow that animals and machines can be the objects of mindreading. Defining the precise extension of “mindreading” by stipulation from the armchair is not likely to be fruitful.

A final comment on mindreading is in order. The characterization of mindreading given here is compatible with the existence of first person mindreading. But it may turn out that we deploy quite distinct mechanisms when we predict or explain our own behavior, or attribute mental states to ourselves, than when we predict or explain other’s behavior, or attribute mental states to them. However, this is not an issue which can be settled here. (See the entry on self-knowledge.)

2. The Mindreading Approach to Folk Psychology

2.1 The theory-theory

How is mindreading achieved? One popular theory, often called the “theory-theory”, holds that when we mindread we access and utilize a theory of human behavior represented in our brains. The posited theory of human behavior is commonly called “folk psychology”. On this view, mindreading is essentially an exercise in theoretical reasoning. When we predict behavior, for example, we utilize folk psychology to reason from representations of the target’s past and present circumstances and behavior (including verbal behavior), to representations of the target’s future behavior. Chomsky’s claim that understanding and producing grammatical sentences involves a representation of the grammar of the relevant language is frequently offered as analogy. (See for example Carruthers 1996a: 29.)

The claim that folk psychology is represented “in the head” raises a range of important empirical questions. These questions are extensively interrelated, with research in one area very often having significant consequences for research in other areas.

  1. We can ask about the way in which folk psychology is represented in the brain. Is it represented in a language-like medium (Fodor 1975) or is it represented in a connectionist network (Churchland 1995, especially Ch.6)?
  2. We can ask about the implementation of folk psychology in the brain. A wide range of brain areas have been correlated with mindreading. (For a summary see Goldman 2006: 140–2.)
  3. We can ask about the content of folk psychology. What states and properties does it quantify over, and what regularities does in postulate (Von Eckardt 1994)?
  4. We can ask questions about the structure of folk psychology. Is it a “proto-scientific” theory with a structure akin to that of scientific theories, or does it take some other form? (See for example Gopnik & Meltzoff 1997; Hutto 2008.) Is folk psychology a deductive normative theory or a model (Maibom 2003; Godfrey-Smith 2005)?
  5. We can ask about the status of folk psychology. Might it be, as Paul Churchland (1981) famously proposed, radically false?
  6. We can ask about the development of folk psychology in young children. Does it exhibit a characteristic developmental pattern? (See for example Wellman 1990.)
  7. We can ask about the natural history of folk psychology, and about its existence in our evolutionary relatives. (See especially Sterelny 2003: Ch. 11.)
  8. Closely related to questions F and G is the issue of universality. We can ask about the extent to which the development of folk psychology, and the mature competence, vary from culture to culture. (See for example the papers by Lillard and Vinden in the reference list See also Nisbett 2003.)
  9. We can ask if the mechanism which deploys folk psychology is modular in something close to Fodor’s (1983) sense of the term. (See especially Sterelny 2003: Ch. 10.)
  10. And we can ask about pathologies of folk psychology. What happens when folk psychology fails to mature normally? (See for example the papers in Carruthers & Smith (eds.) 1996, Part III.)

In addition to the issues just outlined, there is a further empirical question with which theory-theorists have been engaged. Is it the case that mindreading is in fact underpinned by a theory of human psychology? Is mindreading really a theoretical activity? A variety of philosophers and psychologists have argued that it is not, or have at least argued that there is more to mindreading than theorizing. According to simulation theory, mindreading involves a kind of mental projection in which we temporarily adopt the target’s perspective (Gordon 1986; Goldman 1989; Goldman 2006). (See the entry on folk psychology: as mental simulation.) According to the Narrative Practice Hypothesis, mindreading involves not theoretical reasoning but the construction of a certain kind of narrative (Hutto 2008). And according to intentional systems theory, mindreading is achieved by adopting a particular stance towards a system such as another human being (Dennett 1971; 1987). Important though these alternatives are, they will not be assessed in this entry.

The remainder of this section is in three parts. Part 2.2 briefly surveys some of the important issues surrounding the development of mindreading in children and its evolution in our lineage. Part 2.3 provides a quick overview of work in social psychology aimed at exploring mindreading. And Part 3 introduces the idea that folk psychology is more like a scientific model than a deductive-normative theory.

2.2 The development and evolution of mindreading

There exists a very substantial body of research on the development of mindreading in young children. In an early paper, Heinz Wimmer and Joseph Perner (1983) describe what is now usually called the “false belief test”. In the original version of the test, the participants are introduced to a puppet, Maxi. Maxi shows the participants that he has a piece of chocolate, and then hides his chocolate in the “cupboard”—a cardboard box. He then announces that he is going out to play and leaves the scene. A second puppet now enters and is introduced as Maxi’s Mom. Mom finds the chocolate in the cupboard and moves it to a second box, the “refrigerator”. Mom leaves and Maxi returns, saying that he is going to retrieve his chocolate. The action stops and the subjects are asked some control questions to check that they understand what has happened. They are then asked in which box Maxi will look for his chocolate, the cupboard or the refrigerator? Strikingly, children up to about four years of age typically reply that Maxi will look in the refrigerator, while children older than five typically say that Maxi will look in the cupboard. The standard interpretation of this experiment is that children younger than four typically lack the concept of belief, or at best have only a poor grasp of the concept of belief. In particular, they don’t appreciate that beliefs can misrepresent reality. (Not everyone accepts that the false belief task reveals a conceptual deficit: various authors have argued that the task reveals a deficit of performance rather competence. For a judicious review of some of this literature see Goldman 2006, Section 4.3.) The Maxi experiment set off an avalanche of research aimed at discovering exactly how and when mindreading develops in young children. (Useful references for this literature are Astington, Harris & Olson 1988; Wellman 1990; and Baron-Cohen, Tager-Flusberg & Cohen 2000.) A debate between empiricists and nativists quickly emerged, strongly reminiscent of the empiricism versus nativism debate about the development of grammar.

One of the most important defenders of empiricism about folk psychology is the developmental psychologist Alison Gopnik (Gopnik & Wellman 1994; Gopnik & Meltzoff 1997; Gopnik, Meltzoff & Kuhl 1999). Gopnik and her co-workers begin with a bold empirical conjecture—that the cognitive mechanisms which drive the child’s development of folk psychology are exactly those mechanisms which drive the adult scientist’s development of scientific theories. This view has been dubbed the “child as little scientist view”. In support of this conjecture, Gopnik appeals to the history of science. Drawing on the work of Thomas Kuhn (1962), she identifies a pattern in the way scientists respond to anomalous observations. Gopnik argues that when scientists are confronted by an anomaly they are initially inclined to dismiss it as noise or some other form of aberration. If the anomaly cannot easily be handled in this fashion, ad hoc conjectures are added to the original theory to deal with it. If counterevidence continues to accumulate, new theories are developed which are unencumbered by the growing excrescence of ad hoc conjectures. Very often, though, the new theory is applied only to the more recalcitrant anomalies. Finally, the new theory is applied across the domain and becomes very widely accepted. (See Gopnik & Meltzoff 1997: 39–41. See the entry on Thomas Kuhn.)

Gopnik argues that the pattern of scientific progress just sketched is recapitulated in the child’s acquisition of folk psychology, thus supporting her claim that the mechanisms used by the child to acquire folk psychology are the same as those used by the adult to make scientific discoveries. (See Gopnik & Meltzoff 1997: Ch.5.) Gopnik’s view is open to a number of objections. To begin with, it is not at all clear that the pattern of scientific progress Gopnik identifies is universal. For example, the history of geological science seems to provide an example where two competing research programs—vulcanism and neptunism—merged into a single, widely accepted paradigm. If Gopnik’s historical claims are mistaken then the pattern of conceptual development she observes in young children does not support the claim that the child deploys the same mechanisms as the adult scientist. Second, it has been argued that Gopnik’s view is at odds with the apparent universality of the development of folk psychology: the vast majority of children pass through similar developmental stages to arrive at the same theory of human psychology, and do so on a common developmental timetable. Surely individual child-scientists beavering away in isolation would pass through different developmental stages to arrive at divergent theories of human psychology, and do so on distinct developmental timetables (Carruthers 1996b: 23). The claim that there is a universal developmental time table for the acquisition of folk psychology has not gone unopposed. Some author’s have argued for the existence of considerable cross-cultural variation in the development of mindreading. See for example Lillard 1997; 1998; Nisbett 2003 and Vinden 1996; 1999; 2002.

Nativists take the (purported) existence of a near-universal competence arrived at via a near-universal developmental pathway as evidence that the development of folk psychology is very strongly influenced by the child’s genes: the species-wide developmental pattern is explained by our species-wide genetic inheritance (Carruthers 1996b: 23). They also offer a poverty of stimulus argument to the same conclusion. Children as young five are highly competent mindreaders and so must possess an extensive array of psychological concepts and a rich body of information about human psychology. They could not, though, have acquired those concepts and that information from their environment—their environment simply does not provide sufficient learning opportunities. Consequently, a considerable amount of folk psychology must be innate. (See for example Scholl & Leslie 1999.) A great deal of work is required, however, to sustain an argument of this nature. The proponent of any poverty of stimulus argument must demonstrate that the stimulus is impoverished relative to the mature competence. That in turn requires measuring the information content of the environment and comparing it with the information demands of the competence. In the case of folk psychology, we lack an accurate measure of the information demands of the competence because crucial questions about the nature of mature mindreading remain unresolved. For example, Daniel Hutto has suggested that many cases of successful behavior prediction rely not on a sophisticated theory of mind but on simple generalizations (Hutto 2008: 6). Consider a case where John predicts that Betty will stop at a red traffic signal. Perhaps John arrived at his prediction by reasoning as follows.

  1. Betty believes that it is safest to stop at red traffic signals.
  2. Betty desires to be safe.
  3. Ceteris paribus, people act so as to realize their desires in light of their beliefs.


  1. Betty will stop at the red traffic signal.

However, John might arrive at his prediction in quite a different way. He might simply rely on the following generalization: most drivers stop at red traffic signals. Hutto suspects that the latter explanation is the right one (a similar observation is made in Goldman 1987). More generally, Hutto endorses a kind of deflationism about mindreading: he thinks that philosophers and psychologists have exaggerated the amount of folk psychologizing that occurs. If it could be demonstrated that a great deal of mindreading rests not on folk psychologizing but on the deployment of simple generalizations, then we would have to reduce our estimate of the information demands of mindreading. Such a reduction would in turn weaken the plausibility of the poverty of stimulus argument. (See Hutto 2008: 181–6; Sterelny 2003: 214–8.)

So far we have seen that we are not presently in a position to accurately measure the information demands of the human mindreading competence. In addition, we are only beginning to appreciate the informational richness of the child’s learning environment. Kim Sterelny (2003: Ch. 8) has placed great stress on what he calls “epistemic niche construction”. Animals can modify their environments to generate new information, make old information more salient, and reduce cognitive demands. Sometimes these environmental modifications endure long enough to enhance the fitness of the next generation. In particular, parents may modify their child’s environment in ways which facilitate their acquisition of folk psychological concepts and information (Sterelny 2003: 221–5). Hutto has suggested that one way in which this might occur is by story telling (Hutto 2008). As Hutto observes, many stories make apparent the links between the characters’ environment, mental states and behavior, and so may facilitate the child’s understanding of those links. If Sterelny and Hutto are right, the child’s learning environment is richer than we might have supposed, and the poverty of stimulus argument for folk psychology is correspondingly weakened.

2.3 Social psychology and mindreading

Since the 1950s, social psychologists have explored the ways in which humans think about and describe behavior and personality. Fritz Heider (1958) marked an important distinction between intentional and unintentional behavior, and argued that everyday explanations of intentional behavior are importantly different from those of unintentional behavior. In particular, explanations of an agent’s intentional behavior very often appeal to the agent’s reasons. Subsequent work in the field, however, tended to draw a fundamental distinction between “person” and “situation” causes of behavior. Person causes are located within the agent; situation causes are located in the agent’s environment. Bertram Malle has noted that the person/situation distinction is importantly different from the intentional/unintentional one (2004, especially Section 1.1). The proximate causes of intentional behavior—the agent’s reasons—are indeed internal to the agent; however, the proximate causes of some unintentional behaviors are also internal to the agent. For example, screaming in response to a terrifying stimulus is unintentional and yet its proximate cause—fear—is internal. So the distinction between behavior due to person causes and that due to situation causes cuts across the distinction between behavior caused by reasons and behavior caused by other factors.

We can see the person-situation distinction at work in Harold Kelley’s theory of attribution (Kelley 1967). A theory of attribution is a theory of how ordinary people assign causes to events such as behaviors and mental states (understood broadly to include character traits). For ease of expression, I shall focus on cases in which the aim is to explain a person’s behavior. Kelley elaborates the person-situation distinction by distinguishing between two kinds of potential situational causes: the object towards which the behavior is directed and the circumstances in which the behavior occurs. Consider a case in which person \(P\) performs an action \(A\) towards an object \(O\) in circumstance \(C\): John kissed Betty at the party. The causal attributions we make depend on our assessment of the following three questions.

  1. How often does John kiss Betty in other circumstances?
  2. How often does John kiss people other than Betty?
  3. How often do other people kiss Betty?

Kelley predicted that John’s behavior would be attribute to a property of John, a property of Betty, or a property of the party according to the following table:

Response to Q.1 Response to Q.2 Response to Q.3 Attribution
often rarely rarely John
often often often Betty
rarely often rarely party

Kelley’s prediction has been experimentally confirmed by a range of studies (see Von Eckardt 1997 for details).

Perhaps because the category of person causes fails to distinguish between reasons and other internal causes, social psychologists in the 1960s and 1970s paid little attention to reasons. Rather, much of the focus was on character traits. Research during this period explored important correlations between judgments of appearance and judgments of character trait, and between judgments of one character trait and another. For example, participants who judge that a person is attractive on the basis of a photo (appearance) are also likely to judge that he or she is kindly (trait) (Berscheid & Walster 1974). Again, if a person is judged to be talkative (trait), they are also likely to be judged to be adventurous (trait) (Norman 1963). As Barbara Von Eckardt has observed, these kinds of folk psychological inferences have been almost entirely ignored in the philosophy of mind (Von Eckardt 1994 and 1997).

Whilst the person-situation distinction has underpinned important research in the social psychology of mindreading, it has not been universally endorsed. Lee Ross (1977: 176) invites us to consider the following pair of explanations:

  1. Jack bought the house because it was secluded.
  2. Jill bought the house because she wanted privacy.

The cause cited in explanation (1) would standardly be coded as situational; that in explanation (2) as personal. However, most people are inclined to say that Jack and Jill’s respective house purchases were motivated by the same reason. This strongly suggests that the linguistic structure of explanations is a poor guide to the causal antecedents of behavior.

Over the last decade, Malle has urged a return to Heider’s original insight, which marked an important distinction between intentional and unintentional behavior (see especially Malle 2004). Malle’s research strongly supports the claim that people distinguish between intentional and unintentional behavior. For example, Malle and Knobe (1997) gave subjects descriptions of 20 behaviors, and asked them to rate how intentional the behaviors were on an eight point scale \((0 =\) “not at all”; \(7 =\) “completely”). (Half the subjects were given a definition of intentionality; the other half had to rely on their untutored conception of intentionality.) There was considerable agreement amongst all the subjects as to which of the described behaviors were intentional and which were not.

Within the category of intentional behaviors, Malle has identified three different modes (his term) of explanations.

  1. Reason explanations locate the causes of an agent’s behavior in his or her reasons for acting. (Sally bought some vitamin C tablets because she believed taking vitamin C would prevent her getting a cold.)
  2. Causal history of reason explanations locate the causes of an agent’s behavior in the background conditions which caused the agent to have the reasons which in turn caused the behavior. (Sally bought the vitamin C tablets because she had been convinced of vitamin C’s efficacy by an article in a magazine.)
  3. Enabling factor explanations identify the conditions which enabled the agent to bring about her intentions. (Sally bought the vitamin C tablets because she had some money left over after doing the shopping.)

(See Malle 2004, Ch. 4.) Notice the centrality of reasons in all these modes of explanation. Reason explanations and causal history of reason explanations are obviously concerned with the agent’s reasons. Enabling factor explanations also involve the agent’s reasons since they concern the factors which render the agent’s reasons efficacious. In contrast, explanations of unintentional behaviors don’t appeal to the agent’s reasons. Unintentional behaviors include overt behaviors over which the agent has no control (slipping on an icy step) and emotional expressions such as blushing. In these cases the explanations people offer resemble the kinds of explanations they offer for the behavior of inanimate objects (Malle 2004: 111).

In addition to identifying a variety of explanatory modes people adopt towards intentional behavior, Malle also identifies the features of the explanatory situation which drive the selection of one explanatory mode rather than another. Two examples of Malle’s work in this area are as follows (Malle 2004, Section 5.2).

  1. The action is difficult to perform v. the action is easy to perform. Difficult actions (eg Jill’s riding a unicycle) are usually explained by appealing to enabling factors (eg She practiced a lot). In contrast, if the action is easy to produce (eg Jill went for a walk), we tend to produce either reason explanations (eg She wanted to keep fit) or causal history of reason explanations (eg Her trainer told her that walking is an ideal way to keep fit).

  2. The explanation is produced by the agent v. the explanation is produced by an observer. Actors tend to produce explanations of their own behavior which stress their beliefs. For example, consider Jack who wrote a letter to the mayor protesting against the city’s housing policy. Jack explains his action by saying that he thought the mayor would listen. In contrast, observers tend to produce explanations which stress the agent’s desires. Jill, who has observed Jack’s letter writing, explains Jack’s action by saying that he wanted to change the policy.

There is more to an explanation of intentional behavior than its mode. Jill did not explain Jack’s letter writing by merely saying that he had a desire; she said that he wanted to change the policy. Reasons are propositional attitudes, and normally reason explanations specify the propositions involved as well as the attitudes. How do folk psychologists identify the propositions of an agent’s attitudes when offering reason causes? Malle suggests a number of cognitive processes which perform this task. One of his central claims is that propositional contents are inferred from specific or generic information about the agent (Malle 2004: 140). Consider again Jill’s explanation of Jack’s writing to the mayor: He wrote to the mayor because he wanted to change the city’s housing policy. Jill might attribute this particular desire to Jack because she has often heard Jack talk disparagingly about the city’s current policy. However, there must be inferential processes which enable Jill to (a) locate information relevant to explaining Jack’s action and (b) pass from the belief that Jack objects to the current policy to the conclusion that Jack wrote the letter because he wanted to change the current policy. According to the theory-theory, these inferential processes involve a theory which maps the complex relations between stimuli, mental states and behavior; that is, the inferences involve folk psychology. So the account of propositional attitude attribution is incomplete until we have a detailed—and empirically validated—account of folk psychology. What is required here is a response to item C in the list of empirical issues given in Part 2.1: What is the content of folk psychology? What states and properties does it quantify over, and what regularities does in postulate? (See Von Eckardt 1994.) It’s fair to say that, at present, we lack detailed answers to these questions.

3. Folk Psychology as a Model

As noted above, many proponents of the theory-theory take folk psychology to be akin to a scientific theory. In addition, they typically embrace the deductive-normative approach to scientific explanation (Hempel and Oppenheim, 1948). On this view, explaining phenomenon \(P\) requires deriving \(P\) from a set of sentences \(S\), where \(S\) includes a law. For example, let \(P\) be “The ball accelerated at 5ms\(^{-2}\) second”. \(P\) can be derived from Newton’s second law (Force = mass \(\times\) acceleration) and the additional information that the ball’s mass is 2kg and the force is 10N. That is, Newton’s second law, together with the additional information, explain why the ball accelerated at 5m per second per second.

Understood on deductive-nomological approach, folk psychological explanations involve at least one folk psychological law plus information specific to the situation. For example, Sally’s avoiding the snake would be explained by attributing to Sally a fear of snakes and appealing to the law “People avoid things they are afraid of”. (See for example Churchland, 1970; 1981.)

There is, however, an alternative approach to scientific explanation according to which at least some scientific theorising involves models in a specific sense I will describe momentarily. If this is right, theory-theorists who endorse the idea that mindreading is akin to scientific explanation cannot assume that mindreading involves deploying psychological laws. Mindreading might involve building and utilising a model rather than theories as traditionally conceived (Maibom, 2003 and Godfrey-Smith, 2005). I regard this approach as a special case of the theory-theory.

A model in the relevant sense is a set of hypothetical structures that are broadly similar to each other and that are constructed from a common set of elements. For example, the one-locus model of natural selection consists of a number of hypothetical structures composed of elements such as fitness and genotype, all of which conform to a basic general pattern (Godfrey-Smith 2005). Often the structures take the form of equations, but this need not be the case.

Models serve various ends. At one extreme a scientist may construe the model as nothing more than a predictive device; at the other she may construe it as accurately describing the causal structure of the target system. That is, models admit both instrumentalist and realist construals.

Maibom (2003) and Godfrey-Smith (2005) propose that folk psychology is a model; that is, a set of hypothetical structures built from a common set of elements including beliefs, desires, actions, emotions and so forth. Godfrey-Smith’s fundamental insight is that the folk psychological model can be elaborated in various ways to serve different purposes in different circumstances. In some circumstances the model is treated as a prediction device: What will Fred do when he discovers the cafe is closed? In others it might be used to arrive at explanations of action: Why did Fred go to the cafe? In still others the model is elaborated to yield explanations that appeal to both proximate and distal causes of behavior.

As noted above, models can be construed both instrumentally and realistically, and folk psychology is no exception. The folk psychological model allows multiple construals, ranging from instrumentalism through to “industrial strength realism”. (The latter expression is Dennett’s (1991).) The model also admits other kinds of elaborations. For example, degrees of belief and desire can be allowed, and rationality constraints imposed. These recondite theories of human action are hypothetical structures that share the same basic structure, and involve the same set of elements, as more commonplace structures of the folk psychological model.

3. The Platitude Sense of Folk Psychology

In a series of influential papers, David Lewis (1966, 1970, 1972, 1994) defended a particular approach to the semantics of theoretical terms, applied that approach to the everyday psychological vocabulary (eg “belief” and “desire”), and thereby obtain a functionalist theory of mental states. Whilst Lewis does not give an explicit definition of the term “folk psychology”, an account of folk psychology naturally emerges from his approach.

On Lewis’s view, theoretical terms get their meaning from the role they play in the theory in which they are used; they are, says Lewis, “definable functionally, by reference to their causal roles” (Lewis 1972: 204). Lewis begins with a theory, \(T\), which includes both new terms introduced by \(T\) and old terms already understood before \(T\) emerged. The new terms are called “theoretical terms” or “\(T\)-terms” for short. The label “theoretical term” is merely intended to indicate that the terms were introduced by \(T\) rather than by, say, ostension or by some theory which pre-dates \(T\). The old terms are called “\(O\)-terms” for short. (Lewis stresses that the \(O\)-terms are not necessarily observational terms, “whatever those maybe” (1972: 205).) \(T\) can be expressed as a single sentence—perhaps as a long conjunction: \[ T[t_1 \ldots t_n], \] where “\(t_1 \ldots t_n\)” stands for all the \(T\)-terms in \(T\). (The \(O\)-terms have been suppressed to reduce clutter.) If we systematically replace the \(T\)-terms with free variables, \(x_1 \ldots x_n\), and prefix an existential quantifier binding the \(n\)-tuple \(x_1 \ldots x_n\), we obtain the Ramsey sentence for \(T\): \[ \exists(x_1 \ldots x_n)T(x_1 \ldots x_n). \]

The Ramsey sentence says that there exists an n-tuple of entities which realizes \(T\); that is, \(T\) has at least one realization. Lewis is concerned to rule out the possibility of multiple realizations of T. It is, he claims, implicit in the stating of a theory that it has a unique realization; if a theory is multiply realized then it is false and its \(T\)-terms fail to refer (Lewis 1972: 205). He therefore adopts the modified Ramsey sentence \[ \exists !(x_1 \ldots x_n)T(x_1 \ldots x_n), \] which says that there exists a unique \(n\)-tuple of entities that realizes \(T\).

The Carnap sentence is a conditional with the Ramsey sentence as antecedent and \(T\) as its consequent: \[ \exists(x_1 \ldots x_n)T(x_1 \ldots x_n) \rightarrow T[t_1 \ldots t_n]. \]

The Carnap sentence says that if \(T\) is realized, the \(t\)-terms name the corresponding entities of some realization of \(T\). Given Lewis’s aversion to multiple realization, he prefers the modified Carnap sentence which is a conditional with the modified Ramsey sentence as antecedent and \(T\) as the consequent:

\[ \exists !(x_1 \ldots x_n)T(x_1 \ldots x_n) \rightarrow T[t_1 \ldots t_n]. \]

The modified Carnap sentence says that if \(T\) is uniquely realized, the \(t\)-terms name the corresponding entities of the unique realization of \(T\). To cover those cases in which \(T\) is not uniquely realized, either because it is multiply realized or not realized at all, Lewis adds an additional conditional:

\[ {\sim}\exists !(x_1 \ldots x_n)T(x_1 \ldots x_n) \rightarrow(t_1 = * \& \ldots \& t_n = *). \]

This conditional says that, if \(T\) is not uniquely realized, then \(t_1 \ldots t_n\) name nothing. Taken together, the last two conditionals are equivalent to a series of sentences which define each \(T\)-term strictly in \(O\)-terms:

\[ \begin{align*} T_1 &= \exists !x_1 T[x_1]\\ & \vdots\\ T_n & = \exists !x_n T[x_n]\\ \end{align*} \]

We have now obtained an explicit definition for each \(T\)-term. Moreover, says Lewis, the definitions are functional definitions: “The \(t\)-terms have been defined as the occupants of the causal roles specified by the theory \(T\); as the entities, whatever those maybe, that bear certain causal relations to one another and to the referents of the \(O\)-terms” (Lewis 1972: 207). These definitions were implicit in the original theory \(T\) in the sense that no additional content has been added to \(T\) in their derivation. (Lewis observes that the definitions do in fact contain additional content, for their derivation assumes that \(T\) is uniquely realized. He claims, though, that the assumption of uniqueness was made implicitly when \(T\) was stated. See the remarks about uniqueness scattered through out Section I of Lewis 1972.) Let’s now turn to the way Lewis applies his theory of theoretical terms to the everyday psychological vocabulary.

Lewis begins by imagining the set of all the everyday, commonsense platitudes about mental states. He treats this set of platitudes as a term-introducing psychological theory, with the \(T\)-terms being the names of the commonsense psychological states—beliefs, desires, pains, hungers, etc—and the \(O\)-terms being terms drawn from the non-psychological part of the everyday English vocabulary. The formal method sketched above yields explicit definitions of the \(T\)-terms. These definitions are functionalist in that they describe the causal roles in which the named entities participate: “pain” names the state which occupies so-and-so causal role. (Lewis 1966 (fn 6) distinguishes between pain and the attribute of having pain. Pain is the state which plays the pain-role, and which state plays the pain-role may differ from world to world. The attribute of having pain is the having of a state—whatever state that might be—which plays the pain-role.)

Clearly, we need an account of the platitudes. Which everyday claims about mental states count as part of the term-introducing theory? Here’s Lewis (1972: 207–8. See also Lewis 1966: 100):

Collect all the platitudes you can think of regarding the causal relations of mental states, sensory stimuli, and motor responses. Perhaps we can think of them as having the form:

When someone is in so-and-so combination of mental states and receives sensory stimuli of so-and-so kind, he tends with so-and-so probability to be caused thereby to go into so-and-so mental states and produce so-and-so motor responses.

Also add all the platitudes to the effect that one mental state falls under another—“toothache is a kind of pain” and the like. Perhaps there are platitudes of other forms as well. Include only platitudes which are common knowledge among us—everyone knows them, everyone knows that everyone knows them, and so on.

Lewis uses the explicit functional definitions of the commonsense psychological terms he has obtained as premises in an argument for physicalism about mental states (Lewis 1972: 204):

  1. Mental state \(M =\) the occupant of causal role \(R\).
  2. The occupant of causal role \(R =\) neural state \(N\).

From (1) and (2) by transitivity we obtain:

  1. Mental state \(M =\) neural state \(N\).

Premise (1) is a functional definition of \(M\) obtained by the Ramsey-Carnap-Lewis method sketched above. Premise (2) is overwhelmingly supported by physiology. (In Lewis 1966, the second premise is more general: the occupant of the causal role is identified with a physical state. Lewis then defends the second premise by endorsing the explanatory adequacy of physics.) So Lewis argues straightforwardly from functionalism to physicalism.

With this picture in place, it is worth asking what precisely folk psychology is on Lewis’s approach. To my knowledge, Lewis never explicitly defines the term. However, when giving the semantics of the everyday psychological vocabulary, he treats the conjunction of commonsense platitudes about mental states as a term-introducing theory, so it is natural to identify folk psychology with that conjunction. Alternatively, we could think of folk psychology as a systematization of the set of platitudes.

It is important to stress that Lewis’s position has not been without its detractors. In particular, many philosophers of language have objected to Lewis’s semantic theory. In the 1960s and 1970s an alternative approach to semantics was introduced by David Kaplan (1968), Keith Donellan (1970), Hilary Putnam (1975) and Saul Kripke (1980). This approach separates the meaning of a theoretical term from the role it plays in the theories in which it is found; that is, it separates meaning from use. These alternative conceptions of meaning are broadly compatible with of Lewis’s metaphysical conclusions; for example, they are compatible with Lewis’s physicalism. However, they are incompatible with the way Lewis obtains his conclusions.

Setting aside questions of semantics, note that Lewis is hostage to empirical fortune in ways he does not acknowledge. Lewis’s claims about the platitudes are empirical claims—they are claims about what is commonly believed about mental states and as such can only properly be investigated by careful scientific research. There is no evidence that Lewis undertook the appropriate studies. Moreover, it is very likely that Lewis’s own intuitions about mental states were influenced by his theoretical stance, and consequently there is little reason to think that Lewis’s own intuitions are a good guide to what people typically believe about the mind.

Notice that Lewis only recognizes two kinds of platitudes: those that express causal relations between mental states, stimuli and behavior, and those that indicate when one type of mental state is contained by another. He admits that there maybe “platitudes of other forms as well” (Lewis 1972: 207–8), but this is disingenuous because his overall functionalist conclusion requires that all platitudes take one of the two forms he identifies. Thus the functionalist conclusion could not be obtained if there were platitudes expressing the view that mental states are substances which have their causal powers non-essentially, or which lack causal powers altogether. It may turn out, for example, that the folk conceive of pain as an essentially experiential state with non-essential causal connections to stimuli and behavior. Lewis is simply assuming that commonsense is resolutely committed to the idea that mental states are characterized by causal role; that is, the functionalist conclusion drives the characterization of the platitudes. No doubt Lewis has philosophical arguments for denying that mental states are substances which have their causal powers non-essentially, or substances that lack causal powers altogether. But that is beside the present point. Lewis’s intention was to capture what the folk think about mental states, not what the philosophical literati think about mental states. Lewis also assumes that the platitudes form a largely coherent set. He can handle minor inconsistencies because he proposes to form not a grand conjunction of all the platitudes, but a grand disjunction of conjunctions of most of the platitudes. However, he is still assuming that consistent sets containing most of the platitudes can be obtained. This may or may not be the case, and we will only find out by doing the relevant empirical research.

There is some evidence that Lewis recognized these difficulties himself. In his “Reduction of Mind” he remarks that “Pace Lewis, 1972, p. 256, eliciting the general principles of folk psychology is no mere matter of gathering platitudes” (1994: 416). He also remarks that folk psychology “is common knowledge among us; but it is tacit, as our grammatical knowledge is” (1994: 416). These remakes are consistent with his adopting some version of the mindreading sense of folk psychology (see section 2 above); however, they are too cryptic for us to establish exactly what Lewis’s final position was.

4. Consequences for Eliminativism

Eliminativists have argued that there are no beliefs and no desires (see for example Churchland 1981; Stich 1983). One prominent argument for eliminativism begins with folk psychology:

  1. Beliefs and desires are the posits of folk psychology.
  2. Folk psychology is false.
  3. The posits of false theories do not exist.


  1. Beliefs and desires do not exist.

It is not immediately obvious that this argument is valid, for we may have a range of reasons for accepting the existence of beliefs and desires—reasons unaffected by the truth or falsity of folk psychology (see Kitcher 1984; Von Eckardt 1994). Moreover, in light of the proceeding discussion it is clear that the first two premises are ambiguous. As we have seen, the term “folk psychology” is used in at least two different ways in the philosophical and psychological literatures. Consequently, the argument just sketched has at least two interpretations, and may be sound on one but not on the other (Stich & Ravenscroft 1992). Similar remarks apply to an anti-eliminativist argument advanced by early simulation theorists such as Robert Gordon (1986) and Alvin Goldman (1989). On their view, mindreading does not involve a representation of folk psychology in the mindreader’s brain, and consequently we have no reason to think that folk psychology exists. They then argue that, since there is no such thing as folk psychology, the question of the existence or otherwise of its posits simply does not arise. However, the first premise of this argument needs to be stated more carefully. If simulation theory (as conceived by its early proponents) is true, then there is no such thing as folk psychology on the mindreading sense of that term. But that is entirely compatible with the existence of folk psychology on the platitude sense of the term. (For useful discussions of eliminativism see Kitcher 1984; Horgan & Woodward 1985; Von Eckardt 1994; and the entry on eliminative materialism.)

Further reading. Recent and valuable monographs which discuss folk psychology include Nichols & Stich 2003; Sterelny 2003; Goldman 2006; and Hutto 2008.


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Other Internet Resources

  • Nichols, S., 2002, Folk Psychology, article in the Encyclopedia of Cognitive Science, London: Nature Publishing Group.
  • Baker, Lynne, 1999, Folk Psychology (in PDF), in Rob Wilson and Frank Keil (eds.), MIT Encyclopedia of Cognitive Science, Cambridge, MA: MIT Press, 317–318.


The author would like to thank Daniel Hutto, Frank Jackson and (especially) Barbara Von Eckardt for helpful comments on a draft of this entry, and thank his home institution Flinders University.

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Ian Ravenscroft <>

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